Creation and Conservation

First published Thu Nov 9, 2017

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by David Vander Laan replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

In the philosophy of religion, creation is the action by which God brings an object into existence, while conservation is the action by which God maintains the existence of an object over time. The major monotheisms unambiguously affirm that God both created the world and conserves it. It is less clear, however, whether creation and conservation are to be conceived as distinct kinds of actions. The question has its roots in medieval and early modern characterizations of divine action, and it has received renewed attention in recent decades.

On the predominant traditional view, conservation is continuous creation. Adherents of this view typically say with Francisco Suárez that God’s creation and conservation of things are “only conceptually distinct” (Suárez 1597, 120). Jonathan Edwards, for example, says, “God’s upholding created substance, or causing its existence in each successive moment, is altogether equivalent to an immediate production out of nothing, at each moment…. So that this effect differs not at all from the first creation, but only circumstantially…” (Edwards 1758, 402; emphasis in the original). In other words, there is no real difference between the act of creation and the act of conservation, though different words may be used for them. Descartes, Malebranche, Leibniz, and Berkeley all express similar views. More recently, Philip Quinn likewise treats both God’s creating and God’s conserving as species of bringing about a thing’s existence. We call the act ‘creation’ if it occurs at the first time at which the creature exists, and we call it ‘conservation’ if it occurs at a later time, but the action is the same (e.g., Quinn 1988, 54).

The alternative to this view is that the act of conserving beings that already exist differs from calling beings into existence from nothing. Some argue that each persisting creature plays a causal role in its ongoing existence, so that God is not the sole agent as in an ex nihilo creation. Some also argue that conservation must be an ongoing act, whereas creation occurs at an instant.

A large part of what is at stake in the debate is the relationship between divine action and creaturely action. Continuous creation theorists may reject a distinction between creation and conservation as an attempt to attribute a divine prerogative to created things. On the other hand, those who endorse a distinction may regard continuous creation theory as (to borrow a phrase) “one of those high-minded philosophical depreciations of God’s works that come disguised as compliments to God’s person” (van Inwagen 1988, 46 n4). The debate also raises a number of interesting questions about causation, time, and their relations.

1. Distinguishing Theses about Divine Conservation

It will be useful to distinguish between several theses.

  • The conservation thesis: The continued existence of created things depends on God’s activity.
  • The same-action thesis: God’s action of creating things is the same action as God’s conserving things.
  • The sole-source thesis: God alone brings about the continued existence of created things.
  • Occasionalism: God is the only genuine cause of any effect.

The conservation thesis is inconsistent with the Deistic understanding of God’s relationship to the world, on which the world’s existence and operation require no divine involvement after the world is brought into being. In a different way, the conservation thesis is inconsistent with any view that denies that created things truly persist through time. If no created thing exists for more than an instant, God may well be continuously creating, but God is not conserving what has been created. Within traditional Jewish, Christian, and Muslim theology the conservation thesis is relatively uncontroversial, in part because the thesis is apparently implied by the sacred texts. (One biblical example is Hebrews 1:3: “[The Son] is the reflection of God’s glory and the exact imprint of God’s very being, and he sustains all things by his powerful word.” One quranic example is Al-Baqarah 2:255: “His eternal power overspreads the heavens and the earth, and their upholding wearies Him not.” For a challenge to the conservation thesis, see Beaudoin 2007.)

One who affirms that conservation is a continuation of creation goes beyond the mere affirmation of conservation to a theory about the nature of conservation. Such a person might have either the same-action thesis or the sole-source thesis in mind. The same-action thesis implies that conservation is continued (or “continuous”) creation in the sense that the ongoing existence of created things through time is an effect of the very action that caused them to exist in the first place. The action itself may well be timeless, so it is the effect that is really continued.

The sole-source thesis implies that conservation is continued creation in the sense that God conserves in just the way that God creates, i.e., without the aid of created things, either as causal co-agents or as patients. Like creation, conservation is an ex nihilo act. The view Edwards expresses above is a representative example of this claim.

Both the same-action thesis and the sole-source thesis have a prominent role in the historical discussion of conservation, but they are distinct claims. Typically ‘continuous creation theory’ names the sole-source thesis, which has come to be the salient idea, but the language of continuous creation has also sometimes referred to the same-action thesis (e.g., see the ‘continuata creatio’ entry in Muller 1985).

Yet another thesis is occasionalism, which says that God is not only the sole cause of the ongoing existence of created things but also of every other event that they may be involved in, including those in which created things may appear to affect others. Some have objected to continuous creation theory on the grounds that it implies occasionalism. (See section 3.1.)

2. Arguments for Conservation as Continuous Creation

2.1 From Divine Atemporality

Because of the ambiguity noted above, both defenders and deniers of continuous creation can find some inspiration in the thought of Thomas Aquinas. In Summa Theologiae he says,

The preservation of things by God is a continuation of that action by which He gives existence, which action is without either motion or time; so also the light in the air is by the continual influence of the sun. (Ia.104.1, reply to obj. 4)

Here the doctrine of divine atemporality supports the same-action thesis. By one unchanging action God brings about the existence of creatures (i.e., created things) at whatever times they exist. (Malebranche echoes this view in, e.g., Dialogues on Metaphysics, VII.7.)

In the article that follows, however, Aquinas argues explicitly that this does not imply that God preserves created things immediately (i.e., without an intermediate cause). Some creatures depend on other creatures for their preservation, as well as on God as their principle cause (Ia.104.2). Aquinas’s claim implies that the preservation of created things differs from their creation, and that the sole-source thesis is false.

Contemporary philosophers Jonathan Kvanvig and Hugh McCann argue for continuous creation theory on the basis of divine immutability. They defend their case against replies of two sorts: (1) attempts to limit the object of divine creation so as to exclude the continuing existence of creatures (while granting divine immutability), and (2) objections to divine immutability. As Kvanvig and McCann acknowledge, the notion of divine immutability faces a non-trivial challenge from the argument that an omniscient being must know what time it is, and must therefore change (see Kretzmann 1966). For this reason they suggest bolstering the case for continuous creation theory with additional arguments.

2.2 From the Superfluity of a Distinction

Francisco Suárez endorses the same-action thesis, attributing the view to Aquinas and others. For Suárez, creation and conservation are the same act and do not differ “except merely conceptually or because of some connotation and relation” (Suárez 1597, 121). He concludes that conservation has no patient; God does not do something to an already existing creature to preserve it. Rather, its preservation is an instance of creation ex nihilo. So Suárez’s position includes the sole-source thesis as well.

Suárez supports his position by arguing that any distinction between creation and conservation would be superfluous. He argues, for example, that if creation and conservation were two distinct actions, then the second would have to last for the whole time the creature was conserved. But if so, the first action could last for that time equally well, and there would be no point in positing two actions.

Suárez also emphasizes that the effect of creation and conservation is the same: the existence of the creature.

… an action has its unity from its terminus and its principle—or from its patient as well, if it is an action on a patient. But the production and the conservation have exactly the same terminus; therefore, if the principle is the same, as we are presupposing, then the action we are discussing here will be the same, since creation has no subject [i.e., no patient] (ibid., 122).

The arguments of Aquinas, Suárez, and others were influential enough that Descartes could later describe the same-action thesis as “an opinion commonly accepted among theologians” (Discourse on the Method, Part Five, 133).

2.3 From the Inability of Created Things to Sustain Their Own Existence

A number of thinkers have argued for the sole-source thesis not (or not only) on the basis of the nature of divine action, but on the basis of creatures’ inability to preserve themselves. In Principles of Philosophy, Descartes argued for God’s existence from the persistence of objects through time. His reasoning makes it clear that he regarded conservation as a continual re-creation.

It will be impossible for anything to obscure the clarity of this proof, if we attend to the nature of time or of the duration of things. For the nature of time is such that its parts are not mutually dependent, and never coexist. Thus, from the fact that we now exist, it does not follow that we shall exist a moment from now, unless there is some cause—the same cause which originally produced us—which continually reproduces us, as it were, that is to say, which keeps us in existence. For we easily understand that there is no power in us enabling us to keep ourselves in existence. We also understand that he who has so great a power that he can keep us in existence, although we are distinct from him, must be all the more able to keep himself in existence; or rather, he requires no other being to keep him in existence, and hence, in short, is God (Principles of Philosophy, 200).

If created things were able to contribute causally to their ongoing existence, then God would cooperate with the creatures in conserving them. This would make creation and conservation distinct on the assumption that the creatures’ causal contributions are not redundant. But Descartes claims that, given the nature of time, creatures have no power to conserve themselves, and that God alone causes their continued existence.

Jonathan Edwards, a zealous defender of divine majesty and sovereignty, gives a similar argument for creatures’ dependence on God for their present existence.

[The cause of the present existence of a created substance] can’t be the antecedent existence of the same substance. For instance, the existence of the body of the moon at this present moment, can’t be the effect of its existence at the last foregoing moment. For not only was what existed the last moment, no active cause, but wholly a passive thing; but this also is to be considered, that no cause can produce effects in a time and place on which itself is not. ‘Tis plain, nothing can exert itself, or operate, when and where it is not existing. But the moon’s past existence was neither where nor when its present existence is. (1758, 400)

Later Edwards adds that the same reasoning shows that no part of the effect is due to the antecedent existence of the substance in question (ibid., 402). He concludes, “God’s preserving created things in being is perfectly equivalent to a continued creation, or to his creating those things out of nothing at each moment of their existence” (ibid., 401).

While Descartes’s argument, as stated, assumes that created things persist through time, Edwards comes close to claiming that created things do not persist at all. Given continuous creation theory, he says, “there is no such thing as any identity or oneness in created objects, existing at different times, but what depends on God’s sovereign constitution” (ibid., 404). However, he qualifies this with the claims that there are different kinds of identity and oneness, and that God’s constitution—that is, God’s decree or ordaining—is what makes truths of this sort.

Edwards’s view has two disadvantages with respect to the case for continuous creation theory. One is that the argument implies that created things are not genuine causes, a position explicitly rejected by most thinkers in the tradition (a matter to which we will return below). The other is that, because creatures arguably do not persist on this view, it is inaccurate to say that they are conserved. God does indeed continuously create, but the objects so created are new objects. So understood, the view implies that nothing is conserved, properly speaking.

Edwards regarded creatures’ inability to sustain themselves as “plain.” Kvanvig and McCann attempt to bolster this position by undermining several potential reasons for thinking the contrary. For example, one might think that the diachronic character of physical laws shows that physical objects have an innate ability to persist. If they did not, what would make the laws reliable predictors of objects’ behavior? Kvanvig and McCann find this thought lacking on the grounds that physical laws presuppose the continuing existence of the world. They are reliable because the presupposition is correct, but not because the objects they characterize are self-sustaining.

Is the idea of an innate self-sustaining quality tenable? Kvanvig and McCann consider a number of possible construals and argue that they are of dubious coherence. They also give an argument with an Edwardsian flavor. A power to perpetuate one’s own existence would be an ability to cause something to occur at a future time, a time at which the exercise of the power would no longer exist. No physical sequence of events could be the basis for such a time-jumping power, since such a sequence would itself depend on a power of this sort. So the power would need to bring about a future effect without the aid of any intervening events to connect them. But nothing that no longer exists can be causally operative, so there can be no such power (Kvanvig and McCann 1988, 42–3).

3. Arguments for a distinction between creation and conservation

3.1 From secondary causation

(See also Occasionalism.)

One persistent worry about the sole-source thesis has its roots in the medieval debate over whether there is secondary causation (i.e., genuine causation by created things). Suppose that created things are causes: fire really does cause water to boil, and ice really does cause it to cool. If creatures can affect future events in this way, why should they not at least help to bring about their own future existence? Why should their causal powers be limited to affecting the qualities of things without contributing to their own presence in the world? Contrapositively, if created things cannot bring about their own future existence, are they also unable to have any effect on the future?

Occasionalism is the theory that there is no genuine secondary causation, since God is not only the first cause but the only cause. We might be tempted to regard a fire beneath a pot of water as a created cause, but its presence is merely an occasion for God to cause the water to boil. The worry about the sole-source thesis, then, is that it implies occasionalism. William Lane Craig, for example, says that continuous creation theory “runs the risk of falling into the radical occasionalism of certain medieval Islamic theologians …” (Craig 1998, 183).[1] He refers to the Mutakallims, who resisted the Aristotelian claim that objects have causal powers by nature (Fahkry 1958, 30). Their concern was that natural (and therefore essential) causal powers in created things would be an inappropriate limitation of divine power. God would not be able to remove the power of fire to burn except by eliminating the fire (cf. Freddoso 1988, 95–6).

Nonetheless, occasionalism has been a minority view among theists. Aquinas and Suárez both hold that conservation is in some sense continued creation but reject occasionalism in very strong terms. This is a typical position among theists, for most of whom the proposition that continuous creation theory implies occasionalism would constitute an objection to the former.

It is easy to produce arguments for continuous creation theory that also support occasionalism. In particular, the arguments that are driven by the inability of created things to affect the future (such as those by Descartes and Edwards, above, and similar arguments by Malebranche) appear to have occasionalism as a corollary. If no cause can have an effect at a time at which it does not exist, then created things do not bring about their future states, nor those of other created things. The changes in the world can only be caused by God. Malebranche and Edwards would have happily accepted this result; Descartes’ case is less clear. In contrast, Kvanvig and McCann (1988, 43–44) deny that their similar argument implies occasionalism.

Apart from any particular argument for continuous creation theory, Philip Quinn argues that the view itself does not imply occasionalism (Quinn 1988). Whether causal relations are understood as Humean regularities, Lewisian counterfactual dependences, or necessary connections, the proposition that God is the sole cause of the existence of contingent beings does not entail that God is the only cause of events. It remains possible that contingent beings nonetheless have causal influence over the qualities and behavior of other such beings. The result is a cooperative picture of the evolving state of the world. “God and the lit match collaborate to produce the heated water: God provides the water, and the lit match provides the heat” (Quinn 1988, 70).

Andrew Pavelich poses what we may call the first-moment objection to such a view. If we consider the moment at which God creates a universe of objects in motion, it seems that the causal powers of the created objects could not account for the character of other objects, including their motion. At the first moment, only God’s creative power could affect their state. But if each later time is one at which God creates the world ex nihilo, then each time is relevantly similar to the first. At no time will a created thing be able to exercise its causal powers (Pavelich 2007, 12–13).

One possible reply (discussed by Pavelich) grants that a thing created at time t has no effect on other things at t, but nonetheless affects things at later times (whether the things affected are identical to things that existed at t or distinct from them). Later times differ from the first at least in that they are preceded by earlier times, and this opens up the possibility that things existing at later times are affected by causal powers exercised earlier. Such a reply is not available to one who, like Jonathan Edwards, assumes that no object can have an effect at a place or time at which it is not. However, for those who affirm causal relations across time, a position that includes continuous creation but rejects occasionalism is a theoretical option.

3.2 From the persistence of created things

One reason for thinking that the persistence of created objects must depend on some exercise of those objects’ causal powers, and not God’s creative power alone, is that an object that did not depend on its earlier existence could not really be the same object. To persist, an object’s later existence must be due (at least in part) to its own earlier existence. Persistence, in turn, is a necessary condition of conservation, since a world without persistent objects would not be conserved in being but rather succeeded in being.

We have already noted (in section 2.3) that Edwards’s case for continuous creation comes close to denying that created things do, strictly, persist through time. One might well wonder, then, whether the sole-source thesis precludes creatures’ identity over time. The intuition that persistence requires causal dependence (at the least) is widely shared. Peter van Inwagen, for example, accepts it as a constraint on acceptable answers to the question of how physical persons could persist between death and resurrection. In that context he writes:

In the end, there would seem to be no way round the following requirement: if I am a material thing, then, if a man who lives at some time in the future is to be I, there will have to be some sort of material and causal continuity between this matter that composes me now and the matter that will then compose that man. (van Inwagen 1995, 486)

Most physicalists who have since addressed this puzzle have shared van Inwagen’s assumption despite the fact that denying the causal requirement would make it much easier to provide a solution. This suggests that the causal requirement has considerable intuitive force.

The sole-source thesis may even threaten the persistence of creatures apart from the causal requirement. Craig articulates the question whether the lack of a patient in conservation has this result.

Is it even coherent to affirm that God creates a persistent entity anew at every instant? If at every t God created ex nihilo, is it really x which exists at successive instants rather than a series of simulacra? Since there is no patient subject on which the agent acts in creation, how is it that it is the identical subject which is re-created each instant out of nothing rather than a numerically distinct, but similar, subject? (Craig 1998, 184)

One way to defend continuous creation theory from the persistence objection is to argue that it is possible to create the same object more than once. Quinn distinguishes between creating something (bringing about its existence) and introducing something (bringing about its existence for the first time). It is clearly impossible to introduce something at more than one time, but, Quinn argues, it is not at all clear that it is impossible to create something at more than one time. Quinn thus calls the causal requirement into question (Quinn 1983).[2]

Temporal parts theory may suggest another line of defense. William Vallicella says briefly that an occasionalist can affirm the persistence of created things by holding that time is continuous and that persisting objects are composed of continuum-many temporal parts (Vallicella 1996, 353 n. 20). If this is correct, then a continuous creation theorist can presumably do the same. David Vander Laan considers a temporal-parts strategy and finds it problematic. Given a sufficiently inclusive theory of composition, he argues, a series of objects may indeed compose an object that exists at various times and thereby persists, but if there are no causal relations between these objects it does not seem that their sum could be, e.g., a human person. Arbitrary cross-temporal sums need not be united by internal causal relations, but persons must (Vander Laan 2006, 164).

Vander Laan explores the range of options for resolving the tension between continuous creation theory and the causal requirement. The continuous creation theorist should explain what, if not causal continuity, could distinguish a case of persistence from a case of replacement by qualitative duplicates. Of the options he considers, Vander Laan suggests that the most viable one locates the difference in a divine fiat that is present in the persistence case and absent in the replacement case (2006, 165–6). On the other hand, one who affirms the causal requirement should explain in what sense God sustains things in existence. Vander Laan identifies two possibilities: (1) a joint-sufficiency theory on which God’s causal contribution and the creature’s causal contribution are both needed for the creature’s persistence, and (2) a co-operative divine sufficiency theory on which God’s act must cause the creature to bring about its continued existence (2006, 172–4).

3.3 From the nature of time

One recent objection to continuous creation theory maintains that it implies that time is not real (Pavelich 2007, 16–19). Pavelich argues that for time to be real, it must have a kind of “temporal inertia,” a natural tendency to move from each moment to succeeding moments. This inertia would include a natural tendency of things existing at times to continue existing. But it is this very sort of inertia that continuous creation theory denies, since it says that the existence of times and objects in time depend solely on divine acts.

Pavelich suggests that the tension between time and continuous creation runs even deeper. Given continuous creation theory, times only stand in relations of before and after because of God’s creative activity. But then we cannot say that God creates one moment before or after another, as temporal relations hold only subsequent to those acts of creation.

One possible response to these claims is that time can be real without “temporal inertia.” Some will reject the intuition that time must move or pass due to its own natural disposition. Some reject the passage of time entirely. Others will say that temporal passage is real and that it occurs precisely because of God’s creative activity. (Recall the argument of Descartes quoted in section 2.3.)

Another possible response is that there is a creation-independent time in which God operates that could confer reality on the time of the created world. Pavelich contends that even if such a time were real, it would not succeed in conferring reality on the time of the created world. The moments of the created world would still not be directly related to each other so as to make time real. God could even create them out of sequence or change the past, Pavelich argues, without causing anything odd that a created being could notice.

3.4 From differences in the causal patient and the time of occurrence

According to Craig, it is intuitively clear that creation and conservation are distinct actions since conservation has a patient (or object) and creation does not. To conserve a thing in being is to act on that thing. In contrast, to create a thing is not to act on it or on any other thing, but to bring it into existence from nothing. Thus the “circumstantial” distinction between creation and conservation (i.e., causing the existence of something that did not exist earlier vs. causing the existence of something that did exist earlier) requires a deeper distinction between the natures of the actions themselves (Craig 1998, 183). We may call this an agent-patient theory of conservation (Miller 2009). Craig finds this intuitive distinction expressed in Scotus, though Timothy Miller disputes this interpretation (2009, 475).

This difference between creation and conservation also makes it clear, Craig argues, that the two occur at different times. Creation is instantaneous; it occurs at the moment that the created thing first exists. Though the creation of a thing is generally preceded by the thing’s nonexistence, the act itself is not an extended process of moving something from nonexistence to existence. Until it exists the thing is not there to be acted upon. But conservation is the act of preserving a thing in existence from one time to another, so it must occur over an interval of time (Craig 1998, 186–7). In other words, creation is synchronic, but conservation is diachronic. In several ways, then, reflection on the very notions of creation and conservation lead us to see that the two are to be distinguished.

The agent-patient theory has elicited two objections related to the time at which conservation occurs. Vallicella argues that on this view God cannot begin conserving an object (Vallicella 2002) and Miller argues that on this view God cannot conserve things continuously (2009, 478–483).

Vallicella observes first that if conservation has a patient, God’s conservation of it must be diachronic. If the act of conservation were simultaneous with the effect of the object’s existence, then God’s act at a time would both cause and presuppose the existence of that object at that time. So the act must occur at an earlier time or over an earlier interval. Next Vallicella argues that if God creates an object ex nihilo at t, God cannot conserve it at t since it does not yet exist. Clearly God cannot begin to conserve an object at a time after it is created, since the object would only exist at that time if it had already been conserved. So there is no time at which God can begin to conserve an object. Miller responds by wondering why the object would not exist at t. Vallicella’s distinction between the time of an object’s coming into existence and the first time at which it exists is dubious, since a nonexistent object could not undergo a process of coming into existence (Miller 2009, 477).

Miller’s own objection to the agent-patient theory is that it does not allow God to conserve continuously (2009, 478–483). Though conservation is in general diachronic on the agent-patient theory, God’s initial act of conservation must occur at the moment the patient first exists. This act either brings about the existence of the patient at a later moment or through a later interval. If at a later moment, then the patient will not exist at the times between its creation and the moment in question. If through a later interval,[3] then during that interval God would not need to conserve the patient, since its existence over that interval then would have already been secured by God’s conserving act at its first moment. Any conserving act during the interval would be redundant. Beyond the interval the dilemma arises again, suggesting that conservation on the agent-patient theory would need to be discontinuous, something like a person pushing a merry-go-round every few seconds to keep it spinning.

One further problem of the agent-patient theory, Miller adds, is that if the act of conservation can bring about the existence of a thing over an interval, then there seems to be no reason that any sustaining act is needed after the moment of its creation. The interval of existence caused at its first moment could be long enough to include the object’s entire span of existence. So conservation over time appears to be unnecessary.

The arguments surveyed above illustrate how both the historical discussion and the contemporary debate about creation and conservation are multifaceted. Considerations regarding divine nature, human nature, causation, and time are all relevant to whether conservation should be understood as continuous creation. A key task of those who wish to stake out a position in the debate, then, is to assess which of these varied arguments are most powerful and which can be met by credible objections.


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