Constructive Empiricism

First published Wed Oct 1, 2008; substantive revision Tue Jan 17, 2017

Constructive empiricism is the version of scientific anti-realism promulgated by Bas van Fraassen in his famous book The Scientific Image (1980). Van Fraassen defines the view as follows:

Science aims to give us theories which are empirically adequate; and acceptance of a theory involves as belief only that it is empirically adequate. (1980, 12)

With his doctrine of constructive empiricism, van Fraassen is widely credited with rehabilitating scientific anti-realism. There has been a contentious debate within the philosophy of science community over whether constructive empiricism is true or false. There is also some unclarity regarding what van Fraassen's arguments for the doctrine actually are. In addition, there are controversies about what the doctrine actually amounts to. While constructive empiricism has not gained a wide number of adherents, it continues to be a highly influential doctrine in philosophy of science.

1. Understanding Constructive Empiricism

1.1 Contrast with Scientific Realism

Constructive empiricism is a view which stands in contrast to the type of scientific realism that claims the following:

Science aims to give us, in its theories, a literally true story of what the world is like; and acceptance of a scientific theory involves the belief that it is true. (van Fraassen 1980, 8)

In contrast, the constructive empiricist holds that science aims at truth about observable aspects of the world, but that science does not aim at truth about unobservable aspects. Acceptance of a theory, according to constructive empiricism, correspondingly differs from acceptance of a theory on the scientific realist view: the constructive empiricist holds that as far as belief is concerned, acceptance of a scientific theory involves only the belief that the theory is empirically adequate.

1.2 On Literalness

Even given her stance about what theory acceptance involves, a constructive empiricist can still understand scientific theories literally.   What makes for a literal understanding of a theory?  While van Fraassen does not offer a full-fledged account of literalness in The Scientific Image, he does offer the following two necessary conditions for a theory's being understood literally:

  1. The theory's claims are genuine statements capable of truth or falsity.
  2. Any literal construal of a theory cannot change the logical relationships among the entities claimed by the theory — “most specifically, if a theory says that something exists, then a literal construal may elaborate on what that something is, but will not remove the implication of existence” (1980, 11).

In insisting on an understanding of scientific theories as literally true, the constructive empiricist sides with the scientific realist against conventionalists, logical positivists, and instrumentalists. While advocates of these latter positions may take scientific theories to be true, they do so only by interpreting those theories in non-standard ways — in ways that, for instance, violate (1) or (2) above.

1.3 Contrast with Logical Positivism

One of the reasons constructive empiricism is viewed as significant is that it carries on the tradition of the logical positivists without being saddled with the problematic aspects of the positivists' positions. The constructive empiricist follows the logical positivists in rejecting metaphysical commitments in science, but she parts with them regarding their endorsement of the verificationist criterion of meaning, as well as their endorsement of the suggestion that theory-laden discourse can and should be removed from science. Before van Fraassen's The Scientific Image, some philosophers had viewed scientific anti-realism as dead, because logical positivism was dead. Van Fraassen showed that there were other ways to be an empiricist with respect to science, without following in the footsteps of the logical positivists.

1.4 A Doctrine about Aims

Constructive empiricism has the look of an epistemological view about what one should believe — namely, that one should be agnostic about the claims about unobservables that our scientific theories make. But the view is not intended to be read in that way. Constructive empiricism is to be understood as a doctrine about what the aim of science is, not a doctrine about what an individual should or shouldn't believe.

To make this clear, we can, following van Fraassen (1998, 213), make the following terminological distinction:

scientific agnostic: someone who believes the science s/he accepts to be empirically adequate but does not believe it to be true, nor believes it to be false.

scientific gnostic: someone who believes the science s/he accepts to be true.

It's clear, in light of this distinction, that one can be a scientific gnostic and a constructive empiricist — one would simply choose to have beliefs that go beyond what science is aiming at. There is, of course, a connection between the scientific realist/constructive empiricist dichotomy and the scientific gnostic/scientific agnostic dichotomy:

Scientific realists think that the scientific gnostic truly understands the character of the scientific enterprise, and that the scientific agnostic does not. The constructive empiricist thinks that the scientific gnostic may or may not understand the scientific enterprise, but that s/he adopts beliefs going beyond what science itself involves or requires for its pursuit. (van Fraassen 1998, 213–214)

A final point to make about aims is that the constructive empiricist distinguishes between the aim of an individual scientist or group of scientists (which may be fame, glory, or what have you) and the aim of science itself. The aim of science determines what counts as success in the enterprise of science as such (van Fraassen 1980, 8).   Because constructive empiricists do not identify the aim of science with whatever goals the majority of scientists may have, they deny that constructive empiricism is a thesis in sociology subject to the kind of empirical confirmation or disconfirmation any scientific thesis faces.  Instead, constructive empiricism is to be understood as a philosophical description of science that seeks to explain how an empiricist can regard the activity of science as consistent with the empiricist's own standards of rational activity. Like the interpretation of any human activity, constructive empiricism is constrained by the “text” of the scientific activity it interprets. Within those constraints, it succeeds or fails according to its ability to provide an interpretation of science that contributes to our understanding of science, making intelligible to us various elements of its practice. (van Fraassen 1994, 188–192)

1.5 Empirical Adequacy

Here is a rough-and-ready characterization of what it is for a theory to be empirically adequate:

a theory is empirically adequate exactly if what it says about the observable things and events in the world is true — exactly if it ‘saves the phenomena.’ (van Fraassen 1980, 12)

A sufficiently unreflective constructive empiricist might adopt this construal of empirical adequacy for her theory, but a more sophisticated constructive empiricist would probably embrace an account of empirical adequacy akin to that which van Fraassen develops later in The Scientific Image

To understand that account, one needs first to appreciate the difference between the syntactic view of scientific theories and van Fraassen's preferred semantic view of scientific theories. On the syntactic view, a theory is given by an enumeration of theorems, expressed in some one particular language. In contrast, on the semantic view, a theory is given by the specification of a class of structures (describable in various languages) that are the theory's models (the determinate structures of which the theory holds true). As van Fraassen says,

To present a theory is to specify a family of structures, its models; and secondly, to specify certain parts of those models (the empirical substructures) as candidates for the direct representation of observable phenomena. (1980, 64)

A theory is empirically adequate, then, if appearances — “the structures which can be described in experimental and measurement reports” (1980, 64) — are isomorphic to the empirical substructures of some model of the theory. Roughly speaking, the theory is empirically adequate if the observable phenomena can “find a home” within the structures described by the theory — that is to say, the observable phenomena can be “embedded” in the theory. See Figure 1 for a graphical illustration of the relations that make a theory empirically adequate on van Fraassen's view, with the cloud shapes representing the relata of the isomorphism relation.

empirical adequacy diagram
Figure 1: A Theory's Empirical Adequacy

This conception of a theory’s empirical adequacy is arguably what allows a constructive empiricist to avoid the kind of doxastic commitment Friedman (1982, 278) and Rochefort-Maranda (2011, 61-62) describe as posing a problem for the constructive empiricist (a problem that Rochefort-Maranda subsequently attempts to solve). Here is that problem:

Since we might initially think that sentences about observables are, according to a theory, equivalent to certain sentences about unobservable entities, we might also think that commitment to belief in the existence of the observables undesirably commits the constructive empiricist to the existence of the corresponding unobservable entities. (And so correspondingly, agnosticism about the unobservables undesirably commits the constructive empiricist to agnosticism about the equivalent observables.)

The constructive empiricist arguably dissolves this problem by invoking the above conception of empirical adequacy. (Rochefort-Maranda gestures in the direction of, but does not explicitly describe, this dissolution in his footnote 1.) Belief that a theory is empirically adequate amounts to the belief that the observables can be properly embedded in at least one of the theory’s models. Belief in the possibility of that embedding does not require the constructive empiricist to take the truth of sentences about observables to entail the truth of sentences about unobservables. By taking a theory to be empirically adequate, the constructive empiricist is simply saying that the phenomena we observe (and believe to exist) can exist within the structure the theory describes, without additionally being committed to saying that the unobservable parts of that theoretical structure are parts of the actual structure of the world.

Note that the phenomena relevant to a theory's empirical adequacy are all actual observable phenomena (1980, 12). So for a theory to be empirically adequate, it has to be able to account for more than just the phenomena that have actually been observed and the phenomena that will be observed. See Section 3.4 below for a discussion of the worry that the constructive empiricist's belief in the empirical adequacy of her accepted theories thereby extends beyond what a bona fide empiricist ought to believe.

1.6 What's Observable

Insofar as the empirical adequacy of a theory amounts to the embeddability of observable phenomena within substructures of the theory's models, the constructive empiricist's account of empirical adequacy rests heavily on the distinction between what is observable and what is not. If, as it is natural to think,‘is observable’ is a vague predicate, we should not expect there to be a precise demarcation between what's observable and what's unobservable. Observability can still serve as a useful concept in the philosophy of science, as long as there are clear cases of observability and clear cases of unobservability.

Here is one rough characterization of observability:

X is observable if there are circumstances which are such that, if X is present to us under those circumstances, then we observe it (van Fraassen 1980, 16).

For the constructive empiricist, this characterization is “not meant as a definition, but only as a rough guide to the avoidance of fallacies” (van Fraassen 1980, 16). It is important to clarify that, as a constructive empiricist would use the terminology, one only observes something when the observation is unaided. One does not see cells through a microscope; instead one sees an image, an image which the scientific gnostic understands one way but the scientific agnostic understands a different way.

Note that the observability of interest is relativized to “us,” the members of the epistemic community whose scientific theories are the topic of interest. Since what counts as observable is relative to what epistemic community the observer is part of, and since the members of that epistemic community are the subject of scientific theory, the constructive empiricist takes what counts as observable as the subject of scientific theory and not something that can be determined a priori (van Fraassen 1980, 56–59). Science itself, then, is ultimately the arbiter of what counts as observable. For worries about circularity in the use of accepted scientific theory to determine which parts of the world are observable (and hence to determine which theories of science are empirically adequate and thereby candidates for acceptance), see Section 3.7 below.

1.7 Acceptance

Acceptance has both an epistemic and a pragmatic component. When one accepts a theory, one has a belief, and also a commitment. The belief is that the theory is empirically adequate. The commitment is “a commitment to the further confrontation of new phenomena within the framework of that theory, a commitment to a research programme, and a wager that all relevant phenomena can be accounted for without giving up that theory” (1980, 88). According to the constructive empiricist, this commitment is made at least in part on pragmatic grounds: there is an important role for non-epistemic values in theory choice (van Fraassen 2007, 340).

For the constructive empiricist, acceptance comes in degrees. This can influence how one engages in discourse in the domain of the theory:

If the acceptance is at all strong, it is exhibited in the person's assumption of the role of explainer, in his willingness to answer questions ex cathedra. (van Fraassen 1980, 12)

Van Fraassen goes on to explain that acceptance produces contexts where one engages in discourse “in a context in which language use is guided by that theory.”

One reason the constructive empiricist's account of acceptance is important is that it allows us to make sense of scientific anti-realists such as constructive empiricists (of the scientific agnostic variety) talking as if a particular theory is true. When one looks at scientific discourse, this is what scientists are often doing: they treat a theory as if they fully believe it, and answer questions and give explanations using the resources of the theory. The constructive empiricist can account for this behavior, without attributing full belief in the theory to the scientists, by describing the scientists as merely accepting, without fully believing, the theories they develop (van Fraassen 1980, 81–82).

The constructive empiricist can acknowledge that scientific realists also recognize that there is a pragmatic dimension to theory acceptance. But “because the amount of belief involved in acceptance is typically less according to anti-realists, they will tend to make more of the pragmatic aspects” (van Fraassen 1980, 13).

2. Arguments For Constructive Empiricism

2.1 Poor arguments for constructive empiricism

Before turning to stronger arguments for constructive empiricism, it will be helpful to draw attention to a couple scientific anti-realist arguments that the constructive empiricist would be well-advised not to use in support of her view.

First, consider the Argument from Underdetermination. This argument starts by pointing out that for any theory, there are rival theories that are empirically equivalent to it — the theories make all the same predictions about what's observable, but differ only with regard to what's unobservable. The argument goes on to say that it follows that all the empirically equivalent theories are equally believable, and hence belief in the truth of any one of those empirically equivalent theories must be irrational.

While the constructive empiricist view is a view about the aims of science and not a normative theory in epistemology, the constructive empiricist is an individual who values the sort of epistemic modesty which might motivate one to harbor anti-realist sympathies in general. To the extent that the constructive empiricist embraces epistemic modesty, she might also be an epistemic voluntarist, a person who believes that “rationality is only bridled irrationality” (van Fraassen 1989, 172). Any behavior that does not make one inconsistent or incoherent is rational, by the voluntarist's lights. Such an attitude might seem the natural epistemic one for the constructive empiricist to hold, insofar as the constructive empiricist is impressed by the cognitive limits that prevent us from having conclusive evidence in favor of any one particular theory.

One reason the constructive empiricist would be well-advised not to embrace the Argument from Underdetermination, then, is that it goes against a voluntarist position in epistemology. (This point is clearly made by Van Dyck 2007, 19–22, and agreed to by van Fraassen 2007, 347.) By the voluntarist's reckoning, going beyond the evidence to the extent that one chooses to believe in the truth of a theory, both in its observable and unobservable aspects, could very well be rational.

The relatively permissive epistemological view of a constructive empiricist who is also an epistemic voluntarist helps explain why such a constructive empiricist would be prudent not to take constructive empiricism to be a normative theory concerning the deliverances of science. Mistakenly understood in that normative way, constructive empiricism would imply that belief in a theory's empirical adequacy is the only rational candidate for the belief involved in a theory's acceptance. Such a constraint on the rationality of opinion is clearly at odds with any epistemic voluntarism the constructive empiricist might embrace.

Gideon Rosen (1994, 160–161) gives another reason that the constructive empiricist ought not accept underdetermination arguments as grounds for constructive empiricism. Consider the following two hypotheses:

  1. T is empirically adequate — i.e., T is adequate to all observable phenomena, past, present, and future.
  2. T is adequate to all phenomena observed so far.

As Rosen notes, one's current evidence does not tell in favor of either hypothesis over the other. So by an underdetermination-style argument, one is not justified in believing either hypothesis. But belief in (A) is the belief the constructive empiricist contends is involved in theory acceptance. (For more on how one might take Rosen's argument as an argument against constructive empiricism, see Section 3.4 below.)

The second scientific anti-realist argument a person would be well-advised not to use in support of constructive empiricism is the Pessimistic Induction Argument. This argument points out that scientific theories in the past have been shown to be false, so by induction, we should think that current theories are false, too. If this argument is taken to have the conclusion that belief in our current theories is irrational, then, as above, the argument is incompatible with any voluntarism the constructive empiricist might embrace. The argument is also incompatible with the view of a constructive empiricist who, in the skeptical spirit of anti-realist views in general, rejects reasoning based on a principle of induction. Van Fraassen, for instance, writes: “I do not think that there is such a thing as Induction, in any form” (2007, 343).

2.2 Empirical Adequacy versus Truth

So how might one argue for constructive empiricism? One argument for constructive empiricism hinges on the fact that belief in the empirical adequacy of a theory is less epistemically audacious than belief in the truth of the theory. Both beliefs, of course, go beyond the evidence:

In either case we stick our necks out: empirical adequacy goes far beyond what we can know at any given time. (All the results of measurement are not in; they will never all be in; and in any case, we won't measure everything that can be measured.) (van Fraassen 1980, 69)

So why is belief that a theory is empirically adequate preferable to the belief that the theory is true? Van Fraassen famously and pithily puts the point as follows:

it is not an epistemological principle that one might as well hang for a sheep as for a lamb. (1980, 73)

The constructive empiricist rejects arguments that suggest that one is rationally obligated to believe in the truth of a theory, given that one believes in the empirical adequacy of the theory.

For this epistemological argument to work, the distinction between empirical adequacy and truth has to be well-founded. A significant part of The Scientific Image is devoted to that task. As described in Section 1.6, the constructive empiricist argues that one can make sense of the observable/unobservable distinction, even if observation is theory-laden. (If the distinction between observables and unobservables didn't make sense, the concept of empirical adequacy would be incoherent.)

Rosen (1994, 161–163), as well as Monton and van Fraassen (2003, 407–408), offers an additional rationale for the constructive empiricist's embrace of empirical adequacy rather than truth as the hallmark of the belief component of theory acceptance. One might reasonably think of belief in the empirical adequacy of accepted theories as the weakest attitude one can attribute to scientists at the same time that one is still able to make sense of their scientific activity. At the same time, belief in the empirical adequacy of a theory is sufficiently cautious as to allow the believer to remain faithful to the spirit of empiricism. Thus, constructive empiricism is a view which allows one to regard the activity of science as activity the empiricist can safely endorse.

2.3 The Relationship Between Theory and Experiment

The constructive empiricist argues that constructive empiricism “makes better sense of science, and of scientific activity, than realism does” (van Fraassen 1980, 73). The constructive empiricist can be understood as giving two arguments for this claim; the first argument will be presented here, and the second argument will be presented in the next subsection.

Constructive empiricists might maintain that, for working scientists, the real importance of scientific theories is that they are a factor in experimental design. They contrast this with the traditional picture presented by philosophy of science. According to the traditional picture, the main goal of scientific practice is to discern the fundamental structure of the world, and experimentation simply is used to determine whether theories should be taken to be true, and hence as contributing to our knowledge of the fundamental structure. The constructive empiricist, in contrast, suggests that the reason a scientist turns to a theory is that experimental design is difficult, and theories are needed to guide experimental inquiry. But what scientists are really aiming to discover, according to the constructive empiricist, are “facts about the world — about the regularities in the observable part of the world” (van Fraassen 1980, 73).

Van Fraassen argues for this position in part by describing Millikan's famous experiment measuring the charge of the electron. Scientific realists take this experiment to be making a discovery about the nature of the unobservable entities known as electrons. Van Fraassen, in contrast, presents the experiment as “filling in a value for a quantity which, in the construction of the theory, was so far left open” (1980, 77). In doing the experiment, Millikan was discovering a regularity in the observable part of the world, and was providing a value for a quantity in atomic theory. Millikan need not be understood as discovering something about the nature of unobservable objects in the world. Van Fraassen says that in a case like Millikan's,

experimentation is the continuation of theory construction by other means. The appropriateness of the means follows from the fact that the aim is empirical adequacy. (1980, 77)

2.4 The Pragmatics of Theory Choice

Another way in which, according to the constructive empiricist, constructive empiricism makes better sense of science than realism does has to do with theory choice. Some virtues that scientists see in theories are pragmatic virtues, not epistemic virtues. This shows that scientists are choosing between theories using criteria other than truth.

What virtues are pragmatic? Here is what van Fraassen says:

When a theory is advocated, it is praised for many features other than empirical adequacy and strength: it is said to be mathematically elegant, simple, of great scope, complete in certain respects: also of wonderful use in unifying our account of hitherto disparate phenomena, and most of all, explanatory. (1980, 87)

Some scientific realists might hold that some of these are epistemic virtues, not pragmatic virtues. With regard to simplicity, the constructive empiricist can recognize that scientific realists sometimes hold that simpler theories are more likely to be true, but at the same time the constructive empiricist can contend that

it is surely absurd to think that the world is more likely to be simple than complicated (unless one has certain metaphysical or theological views not usually accepted as legitimate factors in scientific inference). (1980, 90)

With regard to explanation, constructive empiricists recognize that scientific realists typically attach an objective validity to requests for explanation (van Fraassen 1980, 13), but constructive empiricists do not grant that objective validity. Van Fraassen's arguments that explanation is pragmatic constitute a significant part of The Scientific Image, and will be discussed in the next subsection.

Constructive empiricists recognize that these pragmatic factors like simplicity and explanatory power are important guides in the pursuit of the aim of science (van Fraassen 1980, 89). But they insist that these factors are valuable in that pursuit only insofar as their consideration advances the development of theories that are empirically adequate and empirically strong. The factors do not have special value as indicators of the truth of what the theories say about the unobservable parts of the world.

2.5 The Pragmatics of Explanation

Scientific realists, by contrast, sometimes say that they believe in the truth of scientific theories because the theories provide a satisfying explanation of the observable phenomena, an explanation that unifies what would otherwise be disparate observations. The constructive empiricist is not moved by such considerations:

A person may believe that a certain theory is true and explain that he does so, for instance, because it is the best explanation he has of the facts or because it gives him the most satisfying world picture. This does not make him irrational, but I take it to be part of empiricism to disdain such reasons. (van Fraassen 1985, 252)

Indeed, one can recognize the explanatory power of a theory without taking it to be true. Van Fraassen points out that theories can explain well even if they are false. Newton's theory of gravitation explains the motion of the planets and the tides, “Huygens's theory explained the diffraction of light, Rutherford's theory of the atom explained the scattering of alpha particles, Bohr's theory explained the hydrogen spectrum, Lorentz's theory explained clock retardation.” But none of these theories is now thought to be true.

For the constructive empiricist, the explanatory power of a theory amounts to nothing more than the theory's ability to provide certain bits of information in response to contextually defined queries.  Scientific explanation amounts to the highlighting of various aspects of the structure postulated by the theory, to answer, in a contextually dependent way, various questions of interest to us (van Fraassen 1980, 124).  Science, then, contributes nothing to explanation over and above the descriptive and informative content of the scientific theory: “a success of explanation is a success of adequate and informative description” (van Fraassen 1980, 156–157). Explanation cannot be reduced to that content, though, since explanation cannot occur unless an appropriate question, offered in a particular context, is provided.  Explanation thus goes beyond what science reveals to us. The constructive empiricist can hence avoid saddling scientists with a commitment to the unobservable entities invoked in such explanations, properly claiming that such commitments are not licensed by the activity of science.  (See Kitcher & Salmon 1987 for the view that even if requests for explanation are contextually delimited, what counts as a good / relevant explanation depends also on non-contextual factors.)

A fair portion of the constructive empiricist's account of scientific explanation is thus devoted to an explication of the contextual dependence of explanation. Among other reasons given in favor of that contextual dependence, van Fraassen points out that explanations are typically causal in character — they attempt to situate the event-to-be-explained in the “causal net” postulated by the scientific theory. Which events in that net are picked out as “the” cause(s) of some event-to-be-explained depend upon the interests of the individuals asking the explanatory question (1980, 124–126).

Explanation will frequently involve the invocation of counterfactuals, often of the form: if event B had not occurred, neither would event A have (van Fraassen 1980, 118). That's because (as just noted) explanations are frequently causal in character, and analyses of causation typically invoke some sort of counterfactual. Another component of the constructive empiricist's efforts at showing explanation to be context-dependent, then, amounts to his exposition of the context dependence of counterfactuals.

Van Fraassen points out that any counterfactual has a ceteris paribus clause, but what is “being kept equal” by the asserter of the counterfactual varies from context to context. For example, consider the counterfactual, “If Tom were to light the fuse, there would be an explosion.” If the ceteris paribus clause of the speaker keeps constant the fact that the fuse leads to a barrel of gunpowder, and the fact that lit fuses leading to barrels of gunpowder typically result in explosions, then the counterfactual would, in that context, be true. If, on the other hand, the ceteris paribus clause of the speaker also kept constant the fact that Tom is generally paranoid about explosions around barrels of gunpowder and fuses, and would only light the fuse if he had disconnected the fuse from the barrel, then the counterfactual would, in that context, be false (1980, 116).  Until the context that fixes the ceteris paribus clause is specified, we cannot say what the truth value of the counterfactual in question is. Only once the context is determined does the counterfactual admit of an objective truth value.

One of the reasons the constructive empiricist highlights the context dependence of explanation is that she wishes to show how efforts at explaining various parts of the world extend beyond the activity of science. Since, for instance, the propositions of science are not context-dependent in character, but the counterfactuals involved in explanation are, we have reason to think that explanation involves something more than the descriptive information science gives us: namely, the context-dependent interests of the individual seeking an explanation in answer to some question. Also, if (as seems likely) the concept of a law of nature has to be understood in a counterfactual way, counterfactuals' context-dependence implies that those laws, too, go beyond what science reveals to us (van Fraassen 1980, 118).

It should be clear here, then, that the constructive empiricist's efforts at showing explanatory efforts to extend beyond the activity of science are part of an effort to show that the scientific realist is mistaken in thinking that science gives us reason to think that claims about causation, laws of nature, and other counterfactuals represent objective, context-independent truths about the world.

Scientific realists might point out that constructive empiricists do allow that explanatory power can count as a pragmatic virtue of a theory (van Fraassen 1980, 89). But, one might naturally think, no scientist can acknowledge the explanatory power of a theory without taking the theory to be true. So, continues the scientific realist, the constructive empiricist cannot admit the usefulness of explanatory power to the scientist without also regarding the scientist as taking her theories to be true.

The constructive empiricist disagrees. Among other reasons, she can cite the earlier mentioned explanatory power of false theories.  Additionally, the constructive empiricist might insist that use of a theory need not entail a commitment to the theory's entire ontology. A person offering an explanation speaks from within the language of the theory she accepts. Consistent with that acceptance, she is “conceptually immersed” within the theory. But such use of language need not reflect the individual's epistemic commitment, which may be merely to take the theory to be empirically adequate (van Fraassen 1980, 151–152). So, for instance, talk of possibility and necessity can be thought of not as talk about some objective modality in nature, but as talk of what phenomena fit in the models of the accepted theory (van Fraassen 1980, 201–202). ‘X is possible’ can be interpreted as ‘X appears in some model of the theory,’ while ‘X is necessary’ can be read as ‘X appears in every model of the theory.’ Again, the constructive empiricist sees the scientist as “immersing” herself in the world of the theory, talking as if the theory were true, with language reflecting the structure of the theory. But she need not take the theory's modal structure to correspond to any in reality.

2.6 Avoiding Inflationary Metaphysics

We can see in the above discussion of the pragmatics of explanation why the constructive empiricist thinks constructive empiricism can help us to make sense of science “without inflationary metaphysics” (van Fraassen 1980, 73). By “inflationary metaphysics,” van Fraassen has in mind the scientific realists' typical beliefs in, for example, laws of nature, natural kinds, and objective modality.

The constructive empiricist recognizes that believing in empirical adequacy involves sticking our necks out, just as believing in truth does; nonetheless,

… there is a difference: the assertion of empirical adequacy is a great deal weaker than the assertion of truth, and the restraint to acceptance delivers us from metaphysics. (van Fraassen 1980, 69)

Scientific realists might not be moved by this consideration, because they might not see any problem with inflationary metaphysics. The point of The Scientific Image, according to van Fraassen, was to answer the question: what should an empiricist think about science? Since an empiricist would want to avoid inflationary metaphysics, this consideration would move them to favor constructive empiricism. The question of why one would want to be an empiricist is taken up in van Fraassen's 2002 book, The Empirical Stance.

3. Arguments Against Constructive Empiricism

3.1 The Miracle Argument

One way that the constructive empiricist might indirectly support constructive empiricism is by taking issue with Hilary Putnam's miracle argument for scientific realism. This argument holds that scientific realism “is the only philosophy that doesn't make the success of science a miracle” (Putnam 1975, 73). Putnam goes on to argue that the statements that a scientific realist would make about our mature scientific theories are “part of the only scientific explanation of the success of science.” To give an adequate scientific description of science, scientific realism needs to be assumed.

Putnam's basic idea is as follows: if the scientific theories are false, why would they be so successful? Van Fraassen famously replies with an evolutionary analogy:

I claim that the success of current scientific theories is no miracle. It is not even surprising to the scientific (Darwinist) mind. For any scientific theory is born into a life of fierce competition, a jungle red in tooth and claw. Only the successful theories survive — the ones which in fact latched on to actual regularities in nature. (van Fraassen 1980, 40)

Van Fraassen's point is that a theory can be empirically adequate, and hence latch on to the observable regularities in nature, without being true. The scientific competition between theories hinges on which theory accurately describes the observable world; it does not hinge on which theory is actually true. Thus, it would not be miraculous for science to arrive at an empirically adequate, scientifically successful, yet false theory. (See the discussion of the Miracle Argument in the entry on scientific realism for more on the miracle argument as a consideration in favor of scientific realism.)

3.2 Inference to the Best Explanation

Inference to the Best Explanation is the controversial rule of inference which basically holds that, out of the class of potential explanations we have of some phenomena, we should infer that the best explanation is the true one. If Inference to the Best Explanation is a rule we do (or ought) to follow, then it looks as if scientific realism is an accurate description (or prescription) of the aims of science — we should acknowledge the reality of the entities our best explanatory theories postulate, even if those entities are unobservable.

The constructive empiricist might offer several responses to this challenge:

  • Inference to the Best Explanation doesn't automatically win as a description of scientists' actual inferential practice, since that practice may be equally well described by saying that scientists believe our best explanatory theories to be empirically adequate (rather than true) (van Fraassen 1980, 20–21). Note, though, that the constructive empiricist does not actually endorse the rule that we should believe that the best explanation is empirically adequate (contrary to how van Fraassen, for instance, has sometimes been read; see, e.g., Bandyopadhyay 1997).
  • The scientific realist thinks that theories can only adequately explain regularities in nature if we take the theories to be true. But theories can explain if we merely take the theories to be empirically adequate. So even if we allow Inference to the Best Explanation as a legitimate rule of inference, the realist has to offer some additional reason to think “T is true” is a better explanation than “T is empirically adequate” (van Fraassen 1980, 21).
  • It may be that all the potential explanations we have are bad, and hence we would be unwise to believe that one of those explanations is the true one (van Fraassen 1989, 143–145). It's plausible to think any argument is mistaken that suggests that we are privileged to hit on the right range of potential explanations to begin with.
  • Any probabilistic formulation of Inference to the Best Explanation is probabilistically incoherent. A Bayesian will coherently update in light of new evidence, but then the proponent of Inference to the Best Explanation wants the Bayesian to unwarrantedly give extra probabilistic weight to the hypothesis that is the best explanation (van Fraassen 1989, 160–70).

In sum, because the constructive empiricist rejects Inference to the Best Explanation, she is not moved by arguments for scientific realism that make use of that rule of inference. (See the discussion of skepticism about inference to the best explanation in the entry on scientific realism for an elaboration of doubts about the use of inference to the best explanation as a motivating consideration in favor of scientific realism.)

3.3 The Observable/Unobservable Distinction

A standard type of objection to constructive empiricism, one that was especially prevalent soon after The Scientific Image was published, is the type of objection that takes issue with the clarity or cogency of the observable/unobservable distinction. A few examples of this type of objection will be presented in this section, along with constructive empiricist replies.

By the constructive empiricist's lights, distant macroscopic objects are observable, since if we were nearby we could see them. Paul Churchland (1985, 39–40) takes issue with the importance the constructive empiricist attaches to size, as opposed to spatiotemporal proximity. Churchland points out that it is just a contingent fact that humans have control over their spatiotemporal location, but not over their size. Churchland concludes that the distinction between things that are unobserved but observable, and things that are unobservable, “is only very feebly principled and is wholly inadequate to bear the great weight that van Fraassen puts on it” (Churchland 1985, 40).

Van Fraassen replies with the recognition that “scientific realists tend to feel baffled by the idea that our opinion about the limits of perception should play a role in arriving at our epistemic attitudes toward science” (1985, 258). Constructive empiricists are not asserting any metaphysical difference in the world on the basis of the observable/unobservable distinction; they are just saying that that distinction is relevant to the epistemic attitudes we take. Since “experience is the sole legitimate source of information about the world” (van Fraassen 1985, 258), it makes sense that what we can experience influences our epistemic attitudes. (Note that in his 2002 book The Empirical Stance, van Fraassen calls into question his 1985 statement about experience.)

A different argument by Churchland (1985, 44–45) asks what the constructive empiricist would say about beings who are like us except that they are born with electron microscopes permanently attached to their left eyes. Churchland says that the electron-microscope-eye humanoids would count viruses as part of their ontology, and yet by the constructive empiricist's lights we can't, even though we are functionally the same as the humanoids when we put our left eye against the viewfinder of an electron microscope.

The constructive empiricist might reply that we are not warranted in saying that the humanoids have the experience of viruses unless we already treat the humanoids as being part of our epistemic community (van Fraassen 1985, 256–257). If we do expand our epistemic community to include them, then the constructive empiricist is happy to say that in that situation viruses are observable. But if we do not accept them as part of our epistemic community, then we will simply analyze them as like us, except having electron microscopes attached to themselves, and we will say that they are “reliable indicators of whatever the usual combination of human with electron microscope reliably indicates” (van Fraassen 1985, 257). In that case the extension of ‘observable’ is unchanged.

Another argument calling into question the significance of the observable/unobservable distinction is presented by Ian Hacking (1985, 146–147). Hacking considers a machine which makes grids of the same shape but various sizes. We can see grids with the same overall shape of smaller and smaller size, but the machine makes some grids that are too small to be seen with the unaided eye. When looked at through a microscope, however, the unobservable grids are seen to have the same shape as the observable ones. Hacking writes:

I know that what I see through the microscope is veridical because we made the grid to be just that way. I know that the process of manufacture is reliable, because we can check the results with the microscope. Moreover we can check the results with any kind of microscope, using any of a dozen unrelated physical processes to produce an image. Can we entertain the possibility that, all the same, this is some gigantic coincidence? (Hacking 1985, 146–147)

Hacking concludes that it would be unreasonable to be an anti-realist about the unobservable grid, and hence we should at least sometimes believe what science tells us about unobservables.

Van Fraassen (1985, 298) replies by pointing out an unwarranted supposition in Hacking's argument: the claim that we made the grid to be that way implies what is under dispute, that the grid was successfully made to be that way. Regarding the argument that, if different types of microscopes make similar observations, then the observations must be veridical, van Fraassen replies that that argument

reveals only the unstated premise that the persistent similarities in the relevant phenomena require, must have, a true explanation. (van Fraassen 1985, 298)

But this is a premise that the constructive empiricist rejects.

Here van Fraassen is allowing for the possibility that the constructive empiricist can reasonably be agnostic about the grid. Van Fraassen replies in a similar fashion to an objection that Paul Teller puts forth about the immediacy of objects viewed through a microscope.

Teller (2007) claims that the images produced by many scientific instruments require some interpretative effort for us to make assertions about what it is that we are seeing. What we see through optical microscopes, on the other hand, is importantly different. In such an observation, we take ourselves to see the object being magnified itself, immediately and without interpretative effort.

The conclusion Teller draws is that contrary to what van Fraassen claims, what is observable extends beyond what members of our epistemic community can observe unaided by measuring instruments. What is observable minimally also includes the objects viewed through optical microscopes, as well as other objects whose observation is similarly unmediated by interpretation (132-134).

In reply, van Fraassen (2001) suggests that what we see through a microscope is akin to reflections seen in mirrors and other reflective surfaces — the reflection of a tree in a body of water, for instance. In both the case of the observation via the microscope and the object viewed in a reflection, we might assert that what we are seeing is a real object. But van Fraassen points out an important difference between the reflected object and our observation through the microscope. We are confident that the reflection is of a real object because we can observe certain invariances between the object purportedly being observed (the tree), the reflective image, and our vantage point. We can, for instance, see that the tree maintains a certain fixed position relative to the reflective body, and we can see that the angle subtended by the lines between us and the two bodies is a particular function of the observer's position. The observation of these invariances is possible, in part, because the tree is itself observable without the aid of instruments (van Fraassen 2001, 160).

That, however, is not true of the objects — the paramecia, say — that are purportedly being observed through the microscope. Because the paramecia are not directly observable without instruments, we can only hypothesize that there are objects being observed for which the invariant geometric relations hold. It is possible for us, then, to maintain an agnosticism about the paramecia that we can't about the tree (160). We can regard our observations via the microscope the same way we regard our observations of rainbows — namely, as observations of phenomena that are public (even capable of being captured by photographic equipment) without at the same time being observations of some existent object (162). (We say that the rainbow is not an actual physical object because it does not participate in the invariant geometric relations we expect of actual physical objects: “If the rainbow were a thing, the various observations and photos would all locate it in the same place in space, at any given time” (157) ).

Alspector-Kelly (2004) claims that there is not the difference described here between aided and unaided perception. If the constructive empiricist insists that rainbows, reflections, and the like constitute publicly observable phenomena despite not amounting to actually existing objects, then what we experience in the case of unaided veridical perception is also some kind of image-like observable phenomena:

…when we look directly at the tree we are also postulating an appropriate relation between object, image, and vantage point, namely, between the tree itself, our perceptual experience of the tree, and the vantage point of our bodily location. (Alspector-Kelly 2004, 336)
Insofar as it is appropriate to speak of a perceptual image when characterizing the view through the microscope - even when, so far as the science of microscopy informs us, that view is veridical - it is appropriate to speak of a perceptual image when characterizing naked-eye visualization, even when that view is veridical. (Alspector-Kelly 2004, 338)

If this is true, then unaided veridical perception is not distinguished from aided perception in the way van Fraassen suggests. Unaided veridical perception is as much mediated by image-like observable phenomena as aided perception is.

As we will see in §3.6, the constructive empiricist might naturally express skepticism, in the case of unaided veridical perception, about the existence of anything like image-like phenomena. Kusch (2015) points out one reason for skepticism: the phenomena in question exhibit fewer of the invariant relations - “unlike, say, rainbows, visual experience cannot be photographed” (177)- that would allow us to characterize the phenomena as public, verifiable ones capable of empirical study.

A constructive empiricist might also respond to Alspector-Kelly by advocating something like a disjunctivist view of perception, denying that what is observed in the disparate cases really is the same. On such a view, unaided veridical perception really is of actual physical objects, whereas perception with instrumentation results only in the experience of some kind of publicly observable phenomena akin to rainbows and reflections. It remains to be seen whether independent motivation for such a view can help recommend it over the alternative offered by the defender of microscopic observables.

3.4 Observable versus Observed

According to the constructive empiricist, “there is no purely epistemic warrant for going beyond our evidence” (van Fraassen 2007, 343). But then why does the constructive empiricist hold that the aim of science involves going beyond our evidence? Empiricism wants to be epistemically modest, but belief that a theory is empirically adequate goes well beyond the deliverances of experience. Hence, one can object to constructive empiricism by suggesting that it is not sufficiently epistemically modest: the doctrine that the aim of science is truth about what is observable should be replaced with the doctrine that the aim of science is truth about what's actually been observed. (For versions of this criticism, see for example Gutting 1985, Railton 1990, Rosen 1994, and Alspector-Kelly 2001.)

The constructive empiricist's reply, as presented by Monton and van Fraassen (2003, 407–408), is as follows. Constructive empiricism incorporates a prior commitment to the rationality of science — it is a doctrine about what the aim of science actually is; it is not attempting to present a revisionary account of how science should be done. According to the doctrine that the aim of science is truth about what's been observed,

there would be no scientific reason for someone to do an experiment which would generate a phenomenon that had never been observed before. But one of the hallmarks of good scientists is that they perform experiments pushing beyond the limits of what has been observed so far. (Monton and van Fraassen 2003, 407)

The constructive empiricist can hence conclude that the doctrine that the aim of science is truth about what's been observed “fails to capture our idea of what it is to do good science” (Monton and van Fraassen 2003, 407).

3.5 Commitments to modal realism in talk of observability?

So the constructive empiricist is firm in her construal of the aim of science as truth about the observable. One might worry, though, as James Ladyman (2000) does, that such a view brings with it a commitment to modal realism and belief in whatever entities such a commitment may require. So, for instance, talk of observability might commit the constructive empiricist to belief in the existence of possible worlds, a commitment that an empiricist would prefer not to make.

To understand why one might think this way, consider the following. As noted in section 1.6 above, one natural way of understanding “x is observable” is in the following counterfactual manner:

x is observable iff if a suitably constituted observer were in relevant circumstances C, she would observe x.

If the truth conditions of counterfactuals are understood in terms of possible worlds, it is easy to see how beliefs about what is observable entail commitments to the existence of such worlds.

One reply to this threat of modal realism is that contrary to the initial impression provided by the counterfactual characterization of observability, observability is not a modal property, after all (Monton and van Fraassen 2003, 411). As explained in section 2.5 above, van Fraassen takes the truth of counterfactuals to be context-dependent. Once a context is fixed, counterfactuals can be expressed as non-modal conditionals. In the case of the counterfactuals that explicate observability, then, fixing the epistemic community of the “suitably constituted observer” transforms the counterfactuals into straightforward non-modal conditionals whose truth or lack thereof we can empirically investigate (Monton and van Fraassen 2003, 413-414). Belief in the truth of some claim of the form 'x is observable' amounts simply to belief in the truth of such a context-fixed, non-modal conditional.

Whether such conditionals are true is an empirical question to which our best scientific theories may provide an answer. So even though observability represents some objective, theory-independent property of the world (van Fraassen 1980, 57), we can use our best scientific theories to answer the question, “What is observable?” (Monton and van Fraassen 2003, 415-416):

Consider the claim ‘if the moons of Jupiter were present to us (in the right kind of circumstances) then we would observe them’. The way to understand the claim is to note that, even though it is a counterfactual, it is entailed by facts about the world: facts that the moons of Jupiter are constituted in a certain way, and facts that we are constituted in a certain way. These facts can be disclosed by empirical research. In practice, not all the empirical research has been done, so we have to rely on our current best theories to determine what these facts are.

For worries about methodological circularity in using our accepted theories to supply facts about observability-- facts that bear on the theories' own empirical adequacy-- see section 3.7 below.

One additional worry about Monton and van Fraassen's non-modal characterization of observability is given by Ladyman (2004). Consider the claim ‘x is observable’ for some x that is never actually observed. Ladyman asserts that no empirical investigation will be sufficient to establish the truth of the relevant non-modal conditional “unless we take it that the specification by science of some regularities among the actual facts as laws … is latching onto objective features of the world” (Ladyman 2004, 762). As Ladyman sees it, only objectively existing laws, and not pragmatically selected empirical regularities, can underwrite claims about the observability of objects never actually observed.

Paul Dicken (2007) offers another promising way for the constructive empiricist to resist the threat of a commitment to modal realism that is posed by talk of observability. He suggests that the constructive empiricist take the same attitude toward the truth of observability counterfactuals that she takes toward other claims of endorsed scientific theories: namely, acceptance of the counterfactuals rather than belief in them (608).

Indeed, given that observability is itself supposed to be a subject of scientific theory (as noted above), acceptance is the natural attitude for a constructive empiricist to take toward the counterfactuals that explicate observability. She relies on those counterfactuals in the way she relies on the other elements of the theories she accepts, even (in certain contexts) talking as if the counterfactuals are true. In this way, according to Dicken, she can make use of claims about what is observable while at the same time being agnostic about possible worlds whose existence is purportedly entailed by the truth of the counterfactuals explicating observability.

3.6 Why Not Just Believe in Sense Data?

An objection related to the one from section 3.4 is the following. The constructive empiricist errs not just in believing claims about what is unobservable-but-not-actually-observed, but also in believing claims about actually observed entities the likes of macroscopic physical objects. If one really takes to heart the advice that one's beliefs should not extend beyond one's evidence, then one should limit belief to claims about the mental experiences that one is having.

A constructive empiricist might reply to the objection as follows:

Such events as experiences, and such entities as sense-data, when they are not already understood in the framework of observable phenomena ordinarily recognized, are theoretical entities. They are, what is worse, the theoretical entities of an armchair psychology that cannot even rightfully claim to be scientific. I wish merely to be agnostic about the existence of the unobservable aspects of the world described by science — but sense-data, I am sure, do not exist. (van Fraassen 1980, 72)

3.7 The Hermeneutic Circle

As noted in Section 1.6 above, the constructive empiricist says that what counts as observable is relative to who the observer is and what epistemic community that observer is part of. Since the observer is her- or himself the subject of scientific theory, what counts as observable is also the subject of scientific theory. Here are two worries about the use of scientific theory as the determiner of observability:

Relativity: If a theory of observability determines what is observable, and empirical adequacy is assessed in terms of what is observable, then a theory of observability can name the terms of its own empirical adequacy. Empirical adequacy becomes radically relative. With no objective, theory-independent constraints on empirical adequacy, it's “anything goes” when it comes to theory acceptance: one simply adopts the theory of observability that underwrites the empirical adequacy of whichever theory one is interested in accepting.

Circularity: if scientific theory is the arbiter of observability, then an individual has no choice but to use the theory of observability she accepts as a guide to observability, and hence as a guide to empirical adequacy, and hence as a guide to whether or not to accept that very theory. But to use the theory as a guide to whether or not to accept that theory involves the individual in epistemic circularity.

The constructive empiricist might reply to Relativity by insisting that while we must look to science for an account of observability, observability is not a theory-dependent notion. What counts as observable is an objective, theory-independent fact. So there's no danger of relativism about empirical adequacy (van Fraassen 1980, 57–58).

This response only addresses Relativity; the objectivity of observability does not save us from the epistemic circularity that comes about from our having to use a theory of observability as the standard of empirical adequacy by which we assess that theory's own empirical adequacy. The epistemic circularity has to do with how we come to certain beliefs about observability, not with the objectivity of the observability facts.

If such circularity were avoidable, then it would be good for us to avoid it. Unfortunately for us, the constructive empiricist might say, it is not avoidable (Monton and van Fraassen 2003, 415–416, maintains this line). Advocates of constructive empiricism might insist that any search for a Cartesian-style guarantee of the correctness of our theory of observability is a search in vain. We have to accept some such theory, imperfect though it may be, and modify our acceptance if experience proves that acceptance to be misplaced.

3.8 Observability of the Microscopic

The Hermeneutic Circle objection was prefaced on the claim that what counts as observable is, according to the constructive empiricist, determined by scientific theory. Another worry based on that presupposition, raised by Alspector-Kelly (2004), is that scientific theory determines much more to be observable than the constructive empiricist typically allows. On Alspector-Kelly’s view, we should countenance as observable whatever science says we can have reliable information about on the basis of perceptual experience, and science says we can have reliable information about what is perceptually revealed to us via microscopes.

The electron microscope is a window on the microcosm because it generates reliable images… We know of that reliability in virtue of knowing the science behind it, just as the constructive empiricist knows the limits of unaided human observation by knowing the science behind the perceptual process. (Alspector-Kelly 2004, 347)
Given what it is for experience to provide us with information about the world, electron microscopes and the rest do precisely that for our community… even a relatively conservative estimation of our perceptual abilities, concerned with both reliability and fidelity, has them extending much farther into the microcosm than the overly conservative constructive empiricist is willing to recognize. (Alspector-Kelly 2004, 348)

In response to Alspector-Kelly, Kusch (2015) insists that the constructive empiricist can rely on science to determine what counts as observable, without at the same time countenancing the microscopic as observable. That’s because “the phenomenon of naked-eye observation calls for one (kind of) theory; the phenomenon of instrumentally-aided eye-use calls for at least two (kinds of) theories: the theory covering naked-eye observation and theories of the instrument and its interaction with our naked eyes” (179). As noted earlier, constructive empiricists value epistemic modesty. If a constructive empiricist can rely on science to give us an account of the kind of unaided observation in which all science is grounded, without at the same time having to make use of scientific theories that go farther afield, then by the constructive empiricist’s lights, that more modest invocation of science is to be preferred in deciding the question of observabillity.

3.9 Commitment to the Existence of Abstract Objects?

Rosen (1994, 164–169) contends that a scientist cannot remain faithful both to the epistemic standards of the empiricist at the same time that she accepts various scientific theories in the way that the constructive empiricist describes. If what Rosen says is correct, then constructive empiricism fails as an explanation of how a committed empiricist can endorse the activity of science as rational.

Rosen's argument goes as follows. Using the terminology of van Fraassen's semantic view of theories (described in Sec. 1.5 above), Rosen says an individual believing a theory to be empirically adequate

is thereby committed to at least three sorts of abstract objects: models of the phenomena (data structures), the models that comprise T, and functions from the one to the other. To suspend judgment on the existence of abstract objects is therefore to suspend judgment on whether any theory is empirically adequate, and this just [is] to give up acceptance altogether. (166)

Indeed, we would naturally suspect that a constructive empiricist would suspend belief about the existence of abstract objects, which are unobservable entities if anything is. So it looks as if an empiricist cannot accept any scientific theories, if acceptance amounts to what the constructive empiricist says it does.

One possible response the constructive empiricist might give here is a fictionalist account of mathematical objects. Embracing such a fictionalist view, an individual could use the theoretical apparatus of mathematics without committing herself to the existence of the objects that are the alleged subject matter of mathematical theories. Rosen (1994) considers this response but contends that it is not one that a constructive empiricist may want to accept. The problem, Rosen says, is that to embrace fictionalism about a theory T that one accepts commits one to believing claims of the following form:

(T ′)   the world is such that if there were such a thing as T, it would be empirically adequate (167).

Such a counterfactual-involving belief appears to commit the believer to the truth of certain modal facts, a commitment eschewed by the typical Hume-inspired empiricist. Perhaps the constructive empiricist can view the relevant counterfactuals as reducible to non-modal conditionals, in the spirit of the context-dependent reduction of counterfactuals to non-modal conditionals entertained in section 3.5 above. If such a reduction can be successfully undertaken, the constructive empiricist can avoid commitment to belief in the truth of the relevant modal facts.

Whether the constructive empiricist would ultimately want to endorse some fictionalist view about mathematical objects is an open question. For an attempt at developing a constructive empiricist philosophy of mathematics, see Bueno 1999.


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