Consciousness and Intentionality
To say you are in a state that is (phenomenally) conscious is to say—on a certain understanding of these terms—that you have an experience, or a state there is something it’s like for you to be in. Feeling pain or dizziness, appearances of color or shape, and episodic thought are some widely accepted examples. Intentionality, on the other hand, has to do with the directedness, aboutness, or reference of mental states—the fact that, for example, you think of or about something. Intentionality includes, and is sometimes seen as equivalent to, what is called “mental representation”.
Consciousness and intentionality can seem to pervade much or all of mental life—perhaps they somehow account for what it is to have a mind; at any rate they seem to be important, broad aspects of it. But achieving a general understanding of either is an enormous challenge. Part of this lies in figuring out how they are related. Are they independent? Is one (or each) to be understood in terms of the other? How we address the issues to which these questions give rise can have major implications for our views about mind, knowledge, and value.
Sections (1) and (2) offer introductory accounts of what is meant by “consciousness” and “intentionality” respectively, highlighting relevant difficulties of interpretation. Then influential perspectives that have emerged in phenomenological (Section 3) and analytic (Section 4) philosophy are sketched so as to facilitate recognition of some common, recurrent themes. These concern, first: the question of whether either consciousness or intentionality is “internal to the subject” or instead essentially tied to environment—the theme of detachability. The second concerns the issue of how (or whether) to distinguish basic kinds of intentionality—e.g., intellectual and sensory; conceptual and non-conceptual—and where to place consciousness with respect to such divisions: this is the theme of basic forms. Third, there are questions about how consciousness is related to self-consciousness—the theme of reflexivity. Section (5) describes diverse perspectives on the consciousness-intentionality relationship engaging with the themes of detachability and basic forms. Here separatist views that divorce consciousness from intentionality are contrasted with various intentionalist views that bind them together: externalist and non-externalist; reductive and non-reductive; restrictive and inclusive; reflexivist and non-reflexivist. This section links to two supplementary discussions: one summarizes recent ways of arguing for intentionalism; the other considers how intentionalism figures in classic phenomenological writings. Section (6) focuses on the restrictive/inclusive contrast, and on issues regarding “cognitive phenomenology”. Section (7) returns to the reflexivist theme, and higher-order representationalist and self-representationalist accounts of consciousness—linking to a supplementary discussion of consciousness of self. Section (8) considers how one’s view of the relationship of consciousness to intentionality might figure in one’s understanding of its place in the mind generally. Finally, Section (9) suggests some ways in which the issues of previous sections impinge on four broad areas of philosophical interest: the nature and boundaries of mind and self; the place of consciousness and intentionality in explanation; forms of knowledge and justification; and kinds and instances of value.
- 1. The Interpretation of “Consciousness”
- 2. The Interpretation of “Intentionality”
- 3. Consciousness and Intentionality in Phenomenology
- 4. Intentionality and the Analytic Heritage
- 5. Varieties of Intentionalism
- 6. How Rich is Consciousness?
- 7. Consciousness and Self-Consciousness
- 8. Consciousness in Mind
- 9. Why It Matters
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
This entry includes the following supplementary documents linked into the text, as described above.
1. The Interpretation of “Consciousness”
On an understanding fairly common among philosophers, consciousness is the feature that makes states count as experiences in a certain sense: to be a conscious state is to be an experience. Widely (but not universally) accepted examples would include sensory states, imagery, episodic thought, and emotions of the sort we commonly enjoy. For instance, when you see something red, it looks somehow to you; when you hear a crash, it sounds somehow to you. Its looking to you as it does, and its sounding to you as it does are experiences in this sense. Likewise, when you close your eyes and visualize a triangle, or when you feel pain, the visualizing and the feeling are experiences. Similarly, you typically have experiences in thinking about how to answer a math problem, or what to say in an email, in recalling where you parked the car, and in feeling anger, shame, relief, or elation. Experiences in this sense are said to have varying “phenomenal character” for one who has them. Where feelings are concerned, these would be the varying ways they feel to you. However, not all experiences are classifiable as feelings. So more broadly we might say that how you experience your own experience—how it is “subjectively experienced”—is its phenomenal (or its “subjective”) character.
The relevant notion is also often introduced by saying that there is, in a certain sense, always “something it is like” to be in a given conscious state—something it’s like for one who is in that state—and what it’s like for you to be in a state is what makes it a conscious state of the kind it is. The phenomenal character of an experience is what someone would inquire about by asking, e.g., “What is it like to experience orgasm?”—and it is what we speak of when we say that we know what that is like, even if we cannot convey this to one who doesn’t know. Coordinating this with previous remarks: how you experience your experiences (e.g., how your feelings feel to you) is what it is like for you to have them.
Our understanding of what is meant by “conscious” might also be sharpened by contrasting conscious states with what we can readily conceive of keeping from their company. A leaf’s fall from a tree branch, we will likely suppose, is not a conscious state of the leaf—an experience in the desired sense. Nor, for that matter, is a person’s fall off a branch a conscious state of that person. Rather, it is the feeling of falling that is paradigmatically conscious, if anything is. Dreaming of falling would also be a conscious state in this sense. By contrast: we can be said to sense (and so adjust) the position of our limbs when dreamlessly asleep. But this proprioception, we may suppose, is not conscious—provided it does not feel anyhow to us sleepers, as it commonly does when we are awake. And in general we may understand a contrast between the familiar sensory experience we have of stimuli (when, say, these smell or sound somehow to us), and other discriminatory responses to the same stimuli in the absence of any such experience—which we may still intelligibly describe as sensing or perceiving. (We can readily think of the sensing or perceiving attributed to plants and simple artifacts in this way.)
Though the terms “experience” and “something it”s like for…’ are commonly used more or less in the way just suggested to identify the notion of consciousness, it must be said right off that their interpretation is subject to doubt and controversy that can affect one’s fundamental ideas about the topics treated here. Anyone wanting to think carefully about consciousness must face the fact that the basic terms of discussion are infused with complex disagreements from the start.
To see how the notion of experience might occasion such disputes, consider: Christopher Hill (2009) acknowledges that you may say that both being struck by a thought (e.g., that the email you just received is a scam), and feeling a sensation (say, a tingling in your foot) are “experiences”. But he maintains this is ambiguous: only the second is properly an experience, hence conscious, in the phenomenal sense. On this view, it seems episodic thought and sensation would count as univocally experiential, hence conscious, only if the former is identified with imagery. By contrast, Charles Siewert (2012a, 2014, 2021) holds thinking and sensing are indeed univocally experiences, though we should take care to distinguish the relevant sense from others (such as we might find, for example, in saying “sea slugs learn from experience” and “Hurricane Sandy was quite an experience”). Meanwhile, Alex Byrne 2009 voices skepticism about the very idea of experience in the “special philosophical” sense.
When it comes to the “what it’s like” locution, Hill and Siewert would agree that we can speak of there being something it’s like to be in a state whose status as conscious, in the target sense, can hardly be taken for granted. (As Jaegwon Kim 2011 points out, we can meaningfully ask someone what it was like for her to meet the President.) However, Siewert (2021) argues that we can surmount this difficulty, provided we think of conscious states as ones there is unconditionally something it’s like for one to be in. But Kim and Hill conclude that the locution is simply ill-suited to give us a grip on the notion of consciousness, preferring terminology that Siewert, in turn, finds suspicious; for them, conscious states are states with “qualia”, or “qualitative character”. (After C.I. Lewis 1929 introduced the term “qualia” for what is given sensorily to the mind prior to conceptualization, it became common to use it to speak of consciousness generally. See Crane (2019) and Keely (2009) for illuminating histories.)
Other problems of interpretation complicate recent discussion in ways very germane to the present topic. As suggested above, the experiential/what it’s like conception of consciousness is sometimes marked by the term “phenomenal”. The qualifier suggests that there are other kinds of consciousness (or perhaps, other senses of “consciousness”). Indeed there are, at least, other ways of introducing notions of consciousness. And these may appear to pick out features or senses altogether distinct from that just presented. But their relationship is controversial. For example, it is said that some (but not all) that goes on in the mind is “accessible to consciousness”. This may encourage the thought that consciousness itself is nothing but a certain kind of access to or accessibility of information—for instance, to a “speech center” responsible for generating “direct verbal reports” of the contents of one’s states of mind—as in Daniel Dennett’s early (1969) theorizing about consciousness. And Ned Block (1995, 2001, 2002) has proposed that, on one understanding of “conscious”, (which he finds at work in psychological theories) a conscious state is just a “representation poised” (or as he later has it, “broadcast”) “for free use in reasoning and other direct ‘rational’ control of action (including reporting)”. Block labels consciousness in this sense access consciousness. (Early examples of theories he sees as employing this notion include Baars 1997 and Dennett 1978, 1991.)
But what is the relationship between various kinds of information access and consciousness in the phenomenal, experiential sense? Block distinguishes the notions of phenomenal and access consciousness, arguing that a mental representation’s being poised or broadcast for use in reasoning and rational control of action is neither conceptually necessary nor sufficient for the state’s being phenomenally conscious. Similarly he distinguishes phenomenal consciousness from what he calls “monitoring consciousness”—where this has to do with one’s capacity to represent one’s mind’s to oneself; to have, for example, thoughts about one’s own thoughts, feelings, or desires. One need not take Block’s notions of phenomenal, access, and monitoring consciousness to reflect clear, definite distinctions already contained in our pre-theoretical use of the term “conscious”. Block himself suggests that (on the contrary) our initial, ordinary concept of consciousness is too confused (too “mongrel”) even to count as ambiguous. Thus in articulating an interpretation of the term adequate to frame theoretical issues, we cannot simply describe how it is currently employed (Block 1995, 2021).
Though Block’s proposed threefold distinction has proven influential, some would balk at proceeding on its basis. John Searle, for example, would recognize phenomenal consciousness, but deny Block’s other two candidates are proper senses of “conscious” at all (Searle 1992). The dispute here may seem no more than terminological. However, Hill 2009 doubts there is a clear sense in which the information in all the states theorists want to count as conscious actually is continually being broadcast to some control faculty. And this is to doubt the reality of access consciousness, as often understood. The reality of the forms of monitoring consciousness that figure in contemporary theories (such as “inner sense”) may also be doubted (Dretske 1995; Siewert 1998, 2012b). Finally, some raise doubts that there is a properly phenomenal sense we can rightly apply to ourselves and distinguish from the other two (see Dennett 1988, 1991; Rey 1997; Frankish 2016). So it seems the issues here are not trivially terminological. This is evident also when we consider the idea that while phenomenal consciousness is real, and our notion of this may be distinguishable from those of access or monitoring, a proper theory of these latter two explains what consciousness is—what it consists in. So, what it is for one to have a phenomenally conscious visual experience of a color or shape, for example, is just for one to have a visual representation of a certain (potentially unconscious) type that is poised to affect belief (Tye 1995, 2002), or that furnishes information of a restricted sort to a short term memory store with a special role in behavioral control (Prinz 2012). Or it is to have the right sort of “higher-order representation” of a visual state (Armstrong 1968; Rosenthal 2021; Carruthers 2000, 2004; Lycan 1995, 2004). However, for some (Siewert 1998, 2010) recognizing nothing but access or monitoring in the manner of such theories amounts to denying the reality of phenomenal consciousness. These are evidently not just disputes about words; they concern what there is to talk about.
For the purposes of this survey we will assume there is a reasonable interpretation of the remarks in the first three paragraphs of this section under which they pick out something real for us to call “consciousness”, even if this term may be legitimately interpreted in other ways. But we should acknowledge it is open to question whether, when the philosophers here under discussion use the term “conscious”, its cognates and their standard translations, they are all talking about consciousness in that sense. And we will leave open as much as possible how precisely to relate it to notions such as rational control, higher-order representation, and conceptual activity—disputed issues important to determining its relationship to intentionality, to be encountered below in various guises.
2. The Interpretation of “Intentionality”
The term “conscious” is not esoteric. But, as we’ve seen, its use is not readily characterized in a manner that provides some coherent, impartial framework for disciplined investigation. This is part of why theorizing about consciousness is so hard. Where the term “intentionality” is concerned, we also face confusing and contentious usage. But here the problem lies partly in the fact that the relevant use is definitely not that found in common speech employing cognate terms (as when we speak of doing something intentionally). In any case, here too we must recognize basic problems of interpretation that affect substantive issues, highly pertinent to the present discussion.
One way philosophers have often explained what they mean by “intentionality” is this: it is that aspect of mental states or events that consists in their being of or about things, as pertains to the questions, “What are you thinking of?” and “What are you thinking about?” Intentionality is the aboutness or directedness or reference of mind (or states of mind) to things, objects, states of affairs, events. So if you are thinking about San Francisco, or about the cost of living there, or about your meeting someone at Union Square—your mind, your thinking, is directed toward San Francisco, or the cost of living, or the meeting in Union Square. This “directedness” conception of intentionality plays a prominent role in the philosophy of Franz Brentano and those whose views developed, directly or indirectly, in response to his (to be discussed in Section 3).
But what positive features distinguish the relevant intentionality-marking senses of these words (“about”, “of”, “directed”) from those found in: “the cat is wandering about the room”; “she is a person of integrity”; “the river”s course was directed towards the fields’? As for talk of intentionality as reference, just how are we to distinguish the way thoughts refer from the way names and descriptions do? And how does this notion of intentionality apply to the senses? When we see or touch something, does our mind also “refer” to what we see or touch, in the same way as does thought? What unifies the notion of intentionality and governs its range of application?
One way of bringing the senses under the “intentionality” umbrella, while suggesting what’s special about mental directedness, focuses on phenomena of perceptual constancy. This plays an important role in the conception of intentionality in Edmund Husserl’s phenomenology. It also figures, in a rather different way, in Tyler Burge’s 2010 conception of what it is for the senses to represent objects. We perceive things as constant with respect to some determinable (such as shape, color, or size), through fluctuation in (a) the subjective experience of them with respect to this determinable, and (b) the corresponding pattern of proximal (e.g., retinal) stimulation from them. Husserl takes the (a) type constancy-though-flux to show perceptual experience is directed at or refers to objects that go beyond (or “transcend”) it, while Burge takes the (b) sort of constancy to show perceptual states are representations of an objective realm.
However, these approaches seem tailored to the senses, and one will wonder how to apply “intentionality” univocally to both sense perception and thought. One peculiarity that may encompass the directedness/aboutness/of-ness/reference of both sense experience and thought (while covering desire and imagination as well): they all may seemingly relate (“purport to point”) to objects that do not exist. Thoughts, unlike roads, can direct you to a city that is not there. One can think about a meeting that has not occurred and never will; one can think of Shangri La, or El Dorado, or the New Jerusalem; one may imagine their shining streets, their total lack of poverty, or their citizens’ peculiar garb; one may long to live in them. Likewise, when one hallucinates, one can experience what is not there to be seen. Maybe this suggests a unifying way to identify the relevant sort of directedness.
But this invites new perplexities. Are we to say (with apparent incoherence) that there are objects we think of that don’t exist? And what does it mean to say that, when a state of mind is in fact directed toward something that does exist, that state nevertheless could be directed toward something that does not exist? For instance, should we agree that there is some experiential “common factor” in perception and hallucination? This has been much disputed by “disjunctivist” philosophers of perception, who would insist that perceptual experience, in the non-hallucinatory “good” case, is fundamentally relational. When there is a snake you see, your experience is a relation between you and that snake, and could not occur at all without it—any more than could stepping on it. This is not so if you experience a hallucination of a snake, even when you cannot subjectively discriminate such experience from the “good” kind. If this is right, then it is hard to see how we could get a notion of intentionality to cover both cases, as long as this is understood as some kind of reference to what might not exist. It can well be fundamental to the nature of mind that its states can be of or about things or “point beyond themselves”. But getting a satisfactory grasp of such mental pointing in all its generality presents theoretical challenges.
A second approach to intentionality may start from the idea that the potential reference to the non-existent just discussed is closely associated with the potential for falsehood, error, inaccuracy, illusion, hallucination, and dissatisfaction. What makes it possible to believe (or even just suppose) something about Shangri La is that one can falsely believe (or suppose) that something exists. What makes it possible to seem to see or hear what is not there is that one’s experience may in various ways be inaccurate, or nonveridical. What makes it possible for one’s desires and intentions to be directed toward what does not and never will exist is that one’s desires and intentions can be unfulfilled. And each of these negative assessments contrasts with a positive one: truth, accuracy, veridicality, and fulfillment. This suggests another general strategy for gaining a theoretical hold on intentionality, employing a notion of satisfaction, stretched to encompass susceptibility to each of these forms of assessment. On John Searle’s (1983) conception, intentional states are states having “conditions of satisfaction”. For a belief, they are the conditions under which it is true; for sense-experience, they the conditions under which it is veridical; for an intention the conditions under which it is fulfilled or carried out.
A “conditions of satisfaction” approach to intentionality may seem to furnish an alternative to talk of directedness to objects. But it is not clear that it can get us around its problems. For instance, what are we to say where thoughts are expressed using names of nonexistent deities or fictional characters? Will we do away with a troublesome directedness to the nonexistent by saying that the thoughts that Zeus is Poseidon’s brother, and that Hamlet is a prince, are just false? This is problematic. Moreover, how will we state the conditions of satisfaction of such thoughts? Will this not also involve an apparent reference to the nonexistent? (For discussion of these issues, see Thomasson 1999 and Crane 2013.) And questions about the proper understanding of the relationship among perception, illusion and hallucination remain.
A third important way to conceive of intentionality, one particularly central to the analytic tradition derived from the study of Frege and Russell (see Section 4), is based on the notion of mental (or intentional) content. Often it is assumed: to have intentionality is to have content. But what is content? Here appeal is sometimes made to the idea of representation: a state has content insofar as it “represents something to be a certain way”, or else “tells” or “says” to one something about how the world is—where the notion of representing and the saying/telling metaphor are assumed to be intuitively clear enough to get things started.
Another way to see what is meant by “content” is to think of this as what is reported when answering the question, “What does she think?” by something of the form, “She thinks that p”. And one might regard the content of thought as what two people share, when what they think is the same (and they think the same thought)—and it’s what differs when what they think is different. Analogous remarks apply to belief and intention. (Though it is not quite as clear that when we speak of what one perceives, this is to be understood in just the same way.) Content is also what may vary independently of the “psychological modes” of states of mind in ways illustrated by saying: Believing that I’ll soon be bald and fearing that I’ll soon be bald differ in mode, but share the content: that I’ll soon be bald, while each differ in content from believing and fearing that I’ll soon be dead. (One may also wish to treat perception as a “mode” alongside believing, fearing, etc.)
Differences in the content of mental states are also commonly thought to be revealed by certain logical features of sentences we use to report them. Reports of thoughts or beliefs and other intentional states (like intention, hope, fear) often do not seem to retain their truth value when co-extensive expressions are substituted in “that-clauses”. For example: “Barack Obama” and “the 44th president of the United States” are co-extensive or co-referential. And if it’s true that Barack Obama was born in Hawai‘i, it’s true that the 44th U.S President was. Even so, Sam can think that Barack Obama was born in Hawai‘i without thinking that the 44th U.S President was. It seems plausible that this “failure of substitutivity” reflects the fact that just what Sam might be said to think—the “contents” of his thoughts—differ in such a case. Or, as it is sometimes said, intentional states relate to the conditions that would satisfy them, or to what they are about, only “under some aspects” and not others—and differences in the “aspect under which” are differences in content. (Searle speaks here of the “aspectual shape” of intentional states.)
This raises the question of just how a “possession of content” conception of intentionality may be coordinated with the conditions of satisfaction conception. It is sometimes assumed that if states of mind contrast in respect of their satisfaction (say, one is true and the other false), they differ in content. And if one says what the intentional content of a state of mind is, one says much or perhaps all of what conditions must be met if it is to be satisfied—what its conditions of truth, or veridicality, or fulfillment, are. But one might also hold that content only determines satisfaction conditions relative to context. This seems especially plausible when we consider thoughts expressed with indexicals or demonstratives. (When I think, on multiple occasions, of multiple objects, this is F, what makes what I think true may differ with context, but what I think of each this (and how I think of it) on each such occasion may be just the same.) And we may allow that states differing “aspectually” can in some sense have the same conditions of satisfaction. This, and related issues, have given rise to diverse interpretations of the notion of content, and the term has often been alleged to be ambiguous or in need of subtle theoretical refinement. Consider, inter alia: Edward Zalta’s 1988 distinction between cognitive and objective content; Jerry Fodor’s (1991) defense of a distinction between narrow and wide content; John Perry’s (2001) distinction between reflexive and subject-matter content); David Chalmers’ (1996, 2010) two-dimensional conception of content; and Katalin Farkas’ “uncompromisingly” phenomenal conception of content. See also Walter Hopp (2011, Chapter 1) for a discussion of the confusing diversity of “intentional content” notions in philosophical circulation.
Talk of content clearly has some intuitive basis. We can talk about what someone thinks (believes, intends, doubts, etc.) and regard this “what” as remaining the same on multiple cases, with multiple subjects: this we may call the content of thought (belief, intention, doubt). But once we raise questions about just what this repeatable “what is thought” amounts to, and what makes it the same or different, “content” becomes a highly contentious theoretical term. It can be unclear what assumptions lie behind its use by various philosophers, and whether they have the same sort of thing in mind.
Each of the gates of entry into the topic of intentionality identified above—directedness; conditions of satisfaction; content—arguably opens onto a unitary phenomenon. And some of the connections among them have been hinted at. But there is a fair amount of fragmentation in the conceptions of intentionality in the field, and the complexities just mentioned cannot be ignored. Perhaps the term “intentionality” only roughly indicates an area of inquiry, covering a variety of interestingly (but uncertainly) interrelated phenomena of thought, belief, desire, imagination, perception, and symbol use. Here, in any case, we leave much open about how to interpret the notion, in the interests of conducting a broadly inclusive survey that aims to illuminate different ways in which what “intentionality” is used to pick out has been related to consciousness. In the interests of such ecumenical breadth, it will be useful to conduct an overview of the near history of thinking about intentionality, covering important ideas arising both in the phenomenological tradition from the late 19th to mid-20th century, and in the area of research that in the last half century or so has come to be known as philosophy of mind.
In telling this story, we have to acknowledge (and traverse) the divide in twentieth century western philosophy between so-called “analytic” and “continental” traditions. This distinction is misleading however, partly because the tendency to categorize phenomenologists en masse as “continental” wrongly suggests they are all somehow more like all others placed in that class than they are like anyone in the (also wildly heterogeneous) group of “analytic philosophers”. Nevertheless, the history of influence and dialogue linking figures in the phenomenological movement with one another, and that unifying the analytic tradition, yield largely distinct narratives. This, together with the differences in approach, vocabulary, and background assumptions, make some disjoint treatment of the two inevitable. However, it seems fitting to try to encompass both in a single article. For, as will be seen, there are significant thematic commonalities across the two histories, and the differences and similarities in how these themes are treated in each may be revealing and intellectually stimulating.
3. Consciousness and Intentionality in Phenomenology
A history of ideas about consciousness and intentionality could easily take us further into the past than this article can cover. A convenient, relatively recent starting point would be in the philosophy of Franz Brentano. He more than any other single thinker is responsible for keeping the term “intentional” alive in philosophical discussions of the last century and a half or so, with something like its current use, and was much concerned with its relationship to consciousness (Brentano  1973). Brentano himself was quite aware of the deep historical background to his notion of intentionality: he looked back through scholastic discussions (crucial to the development of Descartes’ immensely influential theory of ideas), and ultimately to Aristotle for his theme of intentionality (Brentano  1977). One may well go further back, to Plato’s discussion (in the Sophist, and the Theaetetus) of difficulties in making sense of false belief, and yet further still, to the dawn of Western Philosophy, and Parmenides’ attempt to draw enormous consequences from allegedly finding that it is not possible to think or speak of what is not. In this section, we will review how Brentano conceived of intentionality and consciousness, and their relationship, and how that conception was transformed in the thought of his student Husserl—whose name is that most strongly associated with the phenomenological movement—and in the writings of some of those he strongly influenced. This will allow us to introduce the three themes mentioned in the introduction—detachability, basic forms, and reflexivity—by which one might unify the disparate discussions of consciousness and intentionality arising over roughly the last century.
For Brentano, initially at least, what seems crucial to intentionality is the mind’s capacity to refer or be directed to objects that may exist only in mind—what he called “mental or intentional inexistence”. In a famous passage, he introduces the notion this way.
Every mental phenomenon is characterized by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference [or relation] to a content, direction toward an object (which is not to be understood as a reality), or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself, although they do not all do so in the same way. In presentation something is presented, in judgment something is affirmed or denied, in love loved, in hate hated, in desire desired and so on. (Brentano  1973: 88)
It is not straightforward just what Brentano meant by saying mental phenomena include objects within themselves, or that an immanent object of mentation is not assumed to be “a reality”. He complained of being misunderstood by his students, and he revised his position as his thought developed. Experts continue to differ considerably over how to interpret his view. But clearly his conception of intentionality, and arguably that of the whole phenomenological tradition he influenced, is dominated by the first strand of thought mentioned in Section 2—intentionality as directedness towards or reference to an object—and whatever difficulties that brings in train.
More clearly worked out than Brentano’s early, general notion of intentionality are his views about what he took to be its most basic forms (alluded to in the quote above). Brentano’s philosophical project of giving a typology of intentional states, their constituents and interdependencies—what he called “descriptive psychology”—was ambitiously aimed at providing a framework for experimental inquiries into causal psychological laws, as well as for logic (including theory of knowledge), aesthetics, and ethics.
All intentionality, he holds, involves a presentation (Vorstellung) (in some sense, an appearance) of an object (including mere imaginings or conceivings of objects). To this neutral mere appearance of an object one may then add a committal attitude towards it—of either judgment or “emotion” (Gemüt)—each of which takes positive and negative forms. In judgment: one either affirms (accepts) or denies (rejects) the presented object. In Gemüt, one either likes (loves or values) or dislikes (hates or disvalues) it. The mere affirmation (or liking) of an object presented does not require categorizing it under a general concept, grouping it together with like instances, or anything on the order of Kantian “synthesis”.
How did Brentano relate consciousness to intentionality? He did so by holding first, that every mental phenomenon is “of an object” in the intentional sense. Secondly, he held that every mental act is, in fact, conscious, which he took to imply there is an intentional consciousness of it, which in turn he construed as a kind of “inner perception”—every conscious mental act is itself presented, and judged (accepted) as presented. Brentano did not consider it absurd to suppose there are unconscious (for him, unperceived) mental acts. But he found inadequate such reasons as had been offered in his time to posit their occurrence. On his view, wherever this is proposed on the grounds of explanatory usefulness, nonmentalistic (e.g., physiological) explanations would do as well. In this connection, he also took seriously the worry that if we hold (as he does) that all mental acts are conscious, and all conscious acts are objects of consciousness, an infinite regress would erupt. But he thought his theory could handle the problem: the key was to see that, since inner perception is not separate from the object it makes conscious, no regress gets started.
Brentano’s lectures in Vienna attracted and inspired an impressive, diverse group of central European intellectuals in the 1870s. Of these, it was Husserl who was to have the widest philosophical impact on the European Continent in the twentieth century, largely because of his influence on thinkers inspired by his phenomenology to explore existentialist themes—Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty. Though these are the heirs of Brentano and Husserl on which we will focus here, a full treatment of phenomenological ideas about intentionality and consciousness would need to cast its net much more broadly, covering figures such as: Aron Gurwitsch, Roman Ingarden, Anton Marty, Alexius Meinong, Adolph Reinach, Max Scheler, Edith Stein, Carl Stumpf and Kasimir Twardowski.
Husserl ( 1970) adopted Brentano’s concern with understanding, “descriptively”, from the subject’s point of view, how experience is object-directed, reinterpreting Brentano’s “descriptive psychology” as “phenomenology”, and giving this a similar foundational role in philosophy. However, Husserl’s basic conceptions of both intentionality and of consciousness were significantly shaped by his criticisms of Brentano’s. First, consider his response to Brentano on intentionality. One of Husserl’s principal points of departure in his early treatment of intentionality (in the Logical Investigations  1970, V §§ 9–11, 14) was criticism of what he—controversially—took to be Brentano’s notion of the “mental inexistence” of the objects of thought and perception. Husserl thought it a fundamental error to suppose that the object (the intentional object) of a thought, judgment, desire, etc. is something with a special kind of being in the mind of the thinker, judger, or desirer. For we should recognize that objects of one’s mental acts of thinking, judging, etc. often are or can be ordinary objects that “transcend”, and enjoy some sort of independence from the acts (states of mind) that are directed towards them (that “intend” them, in Husserl’s terms). At least if I am not hallucinating, the object of my visual experience is not something immanent to my mind, whose existence comes and goes with the experience—but something (a box, for example) that goes beyond or transcends any (necessarily perspectival) experience I may have of it, as relative position, lighting, or attention alters. This conception of the “objective reference” of sense experience is grounded in a phenomenology of perceptual constancy, mentioned earlier in comparison with Burge.
But how about a case in which there is no transcendent object targeted by one’s experience, and it merely seems as if there is one, as presumably can occur in hallucination? Here we should say, on Husserl’s view, not that there is an object of reference existing in one’s mind, but that the object intended simply does not exist. This does not do away with the directedness of such experience, since it is still true to say one’s experience is of something (a snake, a dagger), even though there exists no snake or dagger one then sees—much as it may be true to say one is thinking of a golden mountain, or Zeus, though there exists no such mountain or god to think of. For (according to the Logical Investigations V §§ 16–17, 20) it is sufficient to make such “conscious of” statements true that the experience have some “matter”—where the matter of a mental act corresponds to what, through it, something is interpreted as. This factor—matter as “interpretive sense”—may vary among acts with the same object (in Husserl’s example, one may think of one and the same object (the Kaiser) either as the grandson of Queen Victoria or as the son of Friedrich III). It also may vary independently of what he called “act-quality”—of whether, e.g., one judges, or doubts, or wonders, or hopes, or imagines, or perceives. Husserl held that every intentional act must have both matter and quality. Post-Investigations, he came to re-interpret these notions in terms of what he called (in Ideas  1983) the “noema” that can be common to distinct particular acts. But this much of the basic picture seems to have survived: intentional directedness is understood not as a directedness to special (“in mind”) objects, but rather as the possession by mental acts of matter/quality (or later, noematic) structure. This can be considered a version of the content conception of intentionality described in Section 2, insofar as Husserl would accept that, in some sense, the matter of an act (later, its “noematic sense”) is the same as its content, that content goes with differences in “aspect”, and that acts can have content even when there exists no object to which they refer.
However, to say only this much leaves basic questions about Husserl’s view unsettled. One concerns whether or in what sense perceptual experience ever constitutes a relation to the object experienced. Here we encounter the first of the three big themes announced at the outset: the question of the “detachability” of either consciousness or intentionality from “external” “worldly” objects. In what way, if any, is the conscious subject with its intentionality in essence intelligible apart from objects in the world it inhabits?
Clearly Husserl thought that a hallucination would still be intentional, though there exists no object of the experience (mentally immanent or otherwise) to which it relates the subject. Still, this leaves open whether, for Husserl, in non-hallucinatory cases—when there really is a snake you see—the matter/noematic sense (thus content) of the experience properly contains the experience-transcending object the experience is of, so that the experience is essentially a relation to (e.g.,) this very writhing, flesh-and-blood creature that can strike and bite you. On this interpretation, if instead you have a subjectively indistinguishable snake-hallucination, you may have what is in other respects the same noema, minus the snake constituent. Alternatively, we may interpret Husserl to hold that the experience itself, along with its entire matter or noematic sense, is always essentially detachable from whatever “external object” it is of. (For discussion, see Crowell 2013; Drummond 1990; Erhard 2022; A.D. Smith 2008; D.W. Smith 2007; Zahavi 2003.)
Interpretations of Husserl diverge, partly due to difficulties in being clear about how to interpret his shift from the “quality/matter” to the “noema” terminology, his immanent/transcendent contrast, and a closely associated aspect of his philosophy—one to which he attached great importance—his method of “transcendental-phenomenological reduction”. Husserl claimed it is possible (and, indeed, essential to the practice of phenomenology as an a priori discipline, distinct from psychology) that one investigate consciousness in a way that withholds certain commitments concerning spatio-temporal particulars. Husserl held that what makes the relevant suspension of commitment possible is that, given the essentially perspectival (in his terms, the evidentially incomplete or “inadequate”) nature of perceptual experience of an object, in no case does anything subjectively evident about the actual course of your experience of an F as such completely rule out the possibility that there was in fact no transcendent object, then experienced as an F. (Ideas  1983 §§ 42–50.) On one interpretation of his methodological “bracketing”, Husserl infers that intentional experience is always in essence detachable from any such worldly (“external”) objects to which it is in fact directed.
However, on other, “externalist” –or perhaps better, “relationalist”—interpretations, Husserl didn’t deny experience is (sometimes) essentially a relation to experience-transcending objects, or that its contents include these as constituents. The methodological aim is just to restrict the scope of concern with these objects (and hence the relevant evidence) proper to phenomenology: one considers them specifically only as intended (i.e., as interpreted) in whatever kind of experience is under investigation. To this end it is unnecessary to embrace an ontology of experiences that says they could always remain essentially the same, even when detached from such objects altogether.
Another complication concerns just how Husserl would view the general relationship between content in his sense (either act-matter or noematic sense) and such semantic correlates of ordinary language sentences—“propositions”—that some would identify with the contents of states of mind reported in them. Relevant here are Husserl’s discussions in Logical Investigation VI of the relationship between the intentionality of perception and judgment. Husserl maintains that perception allows us to express judgments with demonstratives like “this” (what he called “essentially occasional” terms) via non-conceptual, “non-attributive” senses, and that experiencing features in things perceived (e.g., experiencing the color or form in an object), is distinct from and underlies our capacity to predicate the relevant features to them. (See Mulligan 1995; Hopp 2011; and Kidd 2019 for discussion of relevant issues.) Important here too is Husserl’s discussion in Experience and Judgment  1973 of what he called “pre-predicative” experience. Husserl holds that the sort of judgments we express in ordinary and scientific language are founded on the intentionality of pre-predicative experience, and that it is crucial to clarify the way in which such experience underlies judgment. While Husserl rejected Brentano’s general conception of judgment as the non-predicative affirmation of objects presented, he endorsed the related idea that there is a form of intentionality, found in perception, distinct from—and making possible—that in which we bring objects under general concepts. Here we encounter in Husserl the second of the initially announced themes—that of basic forms of consciousness or intentionality.
It is disputed how significantly the most well-known philosophers strongly influenced by their study of Husserl—Heidegger, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty—depart from him in their views. Partly this is due to interpretive difficulties just mentioned (regarding the detachability of experience from experience-transcending objects, and the basic forms of intentionality or content). First, regarding relationality and reduction: on the views of Heidegger ( 1962, 1982, 1985) and Merleau-Ponty ( 2012) at least, intentionality (or as Heidegger prefers, Verhaltung—“comportment”) essentially involves an engagement with the world that cannot be cancelled by any abstention from judgment. If Husserl’s reduction denies this, then their responses to Husserl involve a significant break with him. But as we’ve seen, interpretation of the reduction is controversial. An additional complication comes when we try to consider exactly how attitudes towards consciousness figure into all this. If, as one interpretive approach suggests, Husserl holds consciousness (or rather, experience of the sort ordinarily involved in perceptual constancy) is intrinsically both relational and intentional, then the sort of consciousness we enjoy will be no more detachable in nature from its transcendent objects than is our intentionality. What Heidegger would have to say to this will depend partly on what exactly we make of his abandoning the terminology of consciousness for his distinctive vocabulary of “showing” and “unconcealment/discovery”. Might we regard him as still speaking of consciousness, but only by other, allegedly less theory-burdened names? Or should we interpret Heidegger (in line with Crowell 2013) as maintaining (against Husserl) that consciousness by itself (even of the ordinary sort we enjoy) is insufficient for comportment/intentionality? How we decide to view this will undoubtedly be entangled with how we ourselves understand “consciousness”.
Sartre’s ( 1956) conception of consciousness as nothing apart from its objects can also be interpreted as a relationalist view (see McCollough 1994). And in Merleau-Ponty at least, we clearly have a version of what has since come to be known as “disjunctivism” regarding perceptual experience: for him the visual consciousness of an ashtray (his example) is either genuinely seeing the ashtray—or else (in illusory and hallucinatory cases) merely like seeing an ashtray. In the first case there is no concrete experience that would remain once the ashtray is subtracted in thought, so as to constitute an ashtray hallucination. On Merleau-Ponty’s account, ordinarily, when you see an ashtray (a chair, a tree, etc.), your visual experience is both intentional and object-dependent. Our understanding of defective, illusory and hallucinatory cases rests on an analogy with ordinary cases of visual consciousness understood in an essentially relational manner. This does not keep him from agreeing with Husserl that, given the perspectivalness of perception, there’s a sense in which one can never, in a particular case, rule out the possibility that one’s experience wasn’t relational after all. But this doesn’t make it intelligible that all one’s experience is non-relational, or make rational a global Cartesian doubt that it ever reveals the world. (Merleau-Ponty  2012: 308–311, 359–360, 393–396)
When it comes to the question of whether ordinary perception and action involve a kind of intentionality distinct from that of conceptual judgment, it seems fair to say this about Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. They took up the theme of an intentionality that is distinct from and makes possible the kind involved in judgments that posit and predicate properties of objects, and they gave this, each in his own way, a strongly pragmatic cast. Heidegger describes a type of understanding of entities in which they “show themselves” or are “discovered” as “ready-to-hand” or “available” (zuhanden)—in which they are understood in their functionality (as hammers, as doors, as pens, etc.) relative to our aims: we understand them in using them for something. This is a kind of directedness that belongs to our everyday practical engagement with our surroundings. He sees this as distinct from, and making possible an understanding of entities in which they show themselves as “present-at-hand” or (merely) “occurrent” (vorhanden)—as they do when we understand them in a more detached or theoretical way, merely as objects that possess certain properties (Heidegger  1962, 1982). (For a general account of Heidegger’s taxonomy of understanding, sensitive to recent interpretive controversies, see Wrathall 2013a.) Merleau-Ponty  2012 developed a related view, influenced not only by both Husserl and Heidegger, but by his study of Gestalt psychologists (who were themselves influenced by the Brentano school and by Husserl), in which he defends a conception of perceptual consciousness as a kind of bodily understanding. Partly on the basis of contrasts drawn with case studies of pathologies of perception and action due to brain damage, he argues that, in normal sensory perception, our exploratory and goal-directed movement itself constitutes a way of being conscious of things—and a form of understanding what is perceived—not derived from activities of conceptual categorization and inference (which belong properly to the intellect). Relatedly for Merleau-Ponty: the organization and adjustment of movements involved in bodily understanding, though norm-guided, and experienced, must not be regarded as always chosen— your moves are objects of personal choice only when specifically endorsed for reasons.
This may convey some central aspects of phenomenological conceptions of intentionality and its relation to consciousness. But what can be said about the general nature of consciousness? How did conceptions of this develop in the wake of Brentano? Here too it is useful to see how Husserl’s views emerged from criticism of Brentano’s—in particular from rejection of the latter’s inner perception account of consciousness. And here we can see how the third of the initially identified themes—that of reflexivity, the relation of consciousness and self-consciousness—became elaborated in phenomenology.
Husserl held that for a mental state to be conscious is for it to be an experience (Erlebnis), a part of some “stream of consciousness”. Experiences in this stream of consciousness sense include, for Husserl, “perceptions, imaginative and pictorial representations, acts of conceptual thinking, surmises and doubts, joys and griefs, hopes and fears, wishes and acts of will”. (For the clarification of his concept of consciousness from which this is quoted, see Husserl  1970, V §§1–6.) An experience in this sense is necessarily experienced (erlebt). But, contra Brentano, this does not mean that experiences continually appear as objects of some inner perception. (When, for example, a sensation is felt, the sensation is not some object of which the feeling is an appearance; the sensation simply coincides with feeling it.) Husserl did, however, affirm that some kind of reflexivity is essential to consciousness. Crucial to this view was a certain conception of time-consciousness (Husserl 1991). Husserl argues that, distinct from any capacity for memory directed on an object in the past, in which you recall what experience you just had, there is a sort of “retention” of what has just happened in your experience (e.g., what you just heard in a melody or in a phrase) that enables you to perceive temporally extended wholes. Likewise, more basic than any predictions about what lies in the future is an anticipation or “protention” of what you are about to experience. You are thus in a sense primitively conscious of your own experience in retaining and anticipating it, even though you do not thereby make it into an intentional object, as you do when, in reflection, you think and make judgments about your experience. Consciousness is, for Husserl, in this way necessarily reflexive without necessarily being reflective. A similar view, influenced by Husserl, is prominent in Sartre’s doctrine that “every consciousness is a non-positional consciousness of itself”. Though Sartre defends this idea on the somewhat different grounds that denying it would involve the (allegedly) absurd notion of a consciousness totally “ignorant of itself” (Sartre  1957,  1956). (For recent exposition and defense of Sartre’s view, see Williford 2016.)
One might, as Sartre did, distinguish the question of whether consciousness is somehow necessarily consciousness “of itself” without becoming “an object for itself” from another reflexivity question: is all consciousness essentially, in part, a consciousness of oneself—not “as object”, but “as subject”? Sartre answered this question in the negative. All consciousness (even “pre-reflective”) is self-conscious, but only when reflection occurs, and consciousness becomes (as commonly it is not) itself an intentional object, is there any consciousness of an ego. Husserl earlier, in the first edition of Logical Investigations, affirmed a similar view. However, he did not claim, as Sartre sometimes seems to, that pre-reflective experience is “non-egological” in the sense of being no one’s, or literally selfless, only that, phenomenologically, there are no grounds for regarding an ego as some unifying “center” of intentional relations. On this view, when I correctly say that (even pre-reflectively) an experience belongs to me, I have no phenomenological justification to think this means anything more than that this experience is a constituent in a certain unified complex—a certain stream of consciousness; I have no warrant to posit that the ego, the “me” to whom experience belongs, constitutes a persisting “unifier”. However, Husserl (as he announces in the second edition of the Logical Investigations) significantly revised his views, and held there to be a phenomenological case for the “transcendental ego”. Figuring centrally in this shift was his desire to recognize an aspect to experience through which one is active in making commitments (e.g., in judging something to be a certain way) that—qua personal commitments—necessarily involve a persisting “I”. There is a kind of consciousness of self in experience, which, while evident to phenomenological reflection, does not itself consist in reflectively attributing to oneself some property. (Husserl  1960 §§ 31–33)
We may now identify three distinct ideas found in phenomenological thinking about the alleged reflexivity of consciousness. First, there is the idea that necessarily, whenever there is a conscious state, there is, in some sense, consciousness of it. Second, one finds the notion that it is, however, only occasionally, and only in reflection, that a conscious state is simultaneously an intentional object for the one whose state it is. Third, there is the claim that one’s conscious states ordinarily somehow include a non-reflective consciousness of oneself—though not as intentional object, but “as subject”.
With these distinctions in mind, we can see that to speak of the phenomenological view of these matters risks eliding significant differences. For philosophers in this tradition differed interestingly with respect to the three theses just named. Brentano would maintain the first, deny the second, and seems to have been silent on the third. Husserl, however, (eventually) affirmed all three—with the first two importantly grounded in a view of time-consciousness, and the third in the idea that we experience ourselves as active understanding subjects. Sartre, meanwhile, affirms only the first two theses, and embraces the second on different grounds from Husserl. One may attribute some version of the second and third ideas to Heidegger, since he says that when things in our surroundings show themselves to us (or are “uncovered”) through our dealings with them, we are also thereby non-reflectively “disclosed” to ourselves: what we are is disclosed to us through our use of things as we engage in our everyday projects (Heidegger 1982 §15b). This may be taken to commit Heidegger also to the idea that consciousness involves some kind of reflexive, but non-reflective, consciousness of self as subject. But it does so only on the assumption that, when something is uncovered to me in my use of it, I experience it or am somehow conscious of it, and that, in being disclosed to myself though my activity, I am somehow self-conscious. But that interpretation would be resisted by those who regard it as crucial to seeing what makes Heidegger differ from Husserl that we take him to deny we are ordinarily conscious of things in dealing with them (see Dreyfus 1991; Kaüfer and Chemero 2015). Again, these interpretive matters seem closely tied to one’s own assumptions about the notion of consciousness. At least we might say Heidegger’s view’s about uncoveredness and self-disclosure gives him something strongly analogous to the third idea about consciousness. In any case, it is crucial to recognize this peculiarity of his account: unlike Husserl, Heidegger links such basic reflexivity (self-disclosure) to the notion of an inescapable, everyday “inauthentic” or conventional self-understanding, to be contrasted with an authentic form that can emerge from this in a kind of (“Angst”-triggered) crisis of meaningfulness. As for the first of the three reflexivity ideas (all consciousness is “of itself”), it is unclear Heidegger endorses (or even mentions) it at all. However, notably, Sartre bases his own quasi-Heideggerean interpretation of authenticity in Being and Nothingness on his way of combining this with the second notion.
All three notions are endorsed in Merleau-Ponty. But in his account (perhaps somewhat like Heidegger’s) the second (non-reflectiveness) and third (experienced self-as-subject) seem to carry far more weight. For Merleau-Ponty understanding oneself as subject connects importantly with his notion of consciousness as embodied understanding: in perceiving, one experiences one’s own body as subject of a distinctively sensorimotor form of understanding, manifest in normatively guided responses that are not analyzable as personal choices made for reasons. (For discussion of phenomenologists’ views about consciousness and its relation to self-consciousness that assimilates them much more than does the present one, see Zahavi 1998, 2005, 2014. For further discussion specifically of Brentano’s views on this topic: Kriegel 2018; Textor 2012, 2017; and Thomasson 2000. For Heidegger, see Blattner 2013 and Crowell 2013. For Merleau-Ponty: Siewert 2013a.)
This overview of consciousness and intentionality in the Brentano-Husserl tradition brings to light several broad areas of discussion. Closely related to general concerns about how to interpret either of these two notions, three interrelated themes have emerged. One concerns whether intentionality or consciousness are detachable from one’s relation to the world and things within it. A second concerns how to distinguish basic forms of consciousness and intentionality—and in particular whether, distinct from the activity of the intellect or of a properly conceptual understanding, we should recognize something equally intentional on which it based, manifest in perception and action. Finally, there is the theme of the reflexivity of consciousness: is consciousness somehow essentially bound up with a kind of self-consciousness—either consciousness of itself, or of the self (as subject)? As we shall see, these themes have become important—somewhat later, and largely independently—in analytic philosophy.
4. Intentionality and the Analytic Heritage
The late nineteenth/early twentieth century heritage of most analytic treatments of intentionality (or mental representation or content) lies most significantly not in the writings of Brentano, Husserl and their direct intellectual descendants, but in the seminal discussions of logico-linguistic concerns in Gottlob Frege’s ( 1952) “On Sense and Reference”, and Bertrand Russell’s (1905) “On Denoting”, widely considered defining documents of the analytic tradition. But Frege’s and Russell’s work comes from much the same era and intellectual milieu as Brentano’s and the early Husserl’s. And certain points of contact have long been recognized: Russell’s discussion of Meinong’s theory of objects; Chisholm’s and Quine’s discussion of what they took to be “Brentano’s thesis”; and the similarities between Husserl’s meaning/object distinction (in Logical Investigation I) and Frege’s (prior) sense/reference distinction. Indeed the case has been influentially (though controversially) made (by Føllesdal 1969, 1990) that Husserl’s meaning/object distinction is borrowed from Frege (though with a change in terminology) and that Husserl’s “noema” is properly interpreted as having the characteristics of Fregean sense.
However, in comparing phenomenological treatments of intentionality to those found in the analytic tradition the following should be kept in mind. What Husserl (like Brentano) sought was to characterize general features of intentional experience from the subject’s point of view. Accordingly, his conception of intentionality is fundamentally rooted in reflections on: object-constancy in perceptual experience; contrasts between the ostensible objects of paradigm intentional experiences with these objects “as intended” (i.e., how and “as what” they are intended); and the idea that experience (whether perceptual, imaginative, or conceptual) can somehow continue to be “of” something, even when it is without genuine relation to an object. Thus, in the phenomenological tradition, the discussion of intentionality is thoroughly enmeshed with that of experience or consciousness from the start. On the other hand, those of Frege’s and Russell’s writings most influential for discussions of intentionality concentrate on issues that grow from their achievements in logic, and gave rise to ways of understanding mental states largely through questions about the language used to report them. Moreover, for other reasons, during much of the twentieth century, analytic philosophy often dissociated consciousness (understood largely or entirely in sensory terms) from aspects of the mind connected with intentionality. Thus our treatment of intentionality in this section will leave the concept of consciousness largely in the background. It will, nonetheless, reemerge explicitly in Section 5, when we see how consciousness and intentionality were separated, and then reunited in analytic philosophy.
Central to Frege’s legacy for discussions of mental or intentional content has been his distinction between sense (Sinn) and reference (Bedeutung), and his use of this distinction to cope with the apparent failures of substitutivity of (ordinarily) co-referential expressions in contexts created by psychological verbs, of the sort mentioned in Section 2. In Frege’s famous example: you may understand the expressions “The Morning Star” and “The Evening Star” and use them to refer to what is one and the same object—the planet Venus. But this is not sufficient for you to know that the Morning Star is identical with the Evening Star. For the ways in which an object (the “reference”) is “given” to your mind when you employ these expressions (the senses or Sinne you grasp when you use them) may differ in such a manner that ignorance of astronomy would prevent your realizing that they are but two ways in which the same object can be given.
While Frege did not himself elaborate a general account of intentionality, what he says suggests the following picture. Intentional states of mind—thinking about Venus, wishing to visit it—involve some special relation (such as “grasping”)—not to a Venus “in one’s mind”, nor to an image of Venus, but to an abstract entity, a thought, which also constitutes the sense of a linguistic expression that can be used to report one’s state of mind, a sense that is grasped or understood by speakers who use it.
This style of account, together with the Fregean thesis that “sense determines reference”, and the history of criticisms both have elicited, provide a significant part of the background of contemporary discussions of mental content. It is often assumed, with Frege, that we must recognize that thoughts or contents cannot consist in images or essentially private “ideas”. But philosophers have frequently criticized Frege’s view of thought as some abstract entity “grasped” or “present to” the mind, and have wanted to replace Frege’s unanalyzed grasping of abstract entities with something more “naturalistic”, or at any rate more explanatory of what is involved in thinking.
Reaction to the Fregean picture has determined the character of analytic discussions of intentionality or content in another major way. It may be granted that the content of the thought reported is to be identified with the sense of the expression with which we report it. But then, it is argued, the identity of this content will not be determined individualistically, and may in some respects lie beyond the grasp (or not be fully “present to” the mind) of the psychological subject. For what determines the reference of an expression may be a natural causal relation to the world—as Saul Kripke (1972) and Hilary Putnam (1975) have argued is true for proper names, like “Nixon” and “Cicero”, and “natural kind” terms like “gold” and “water”. And (as Tyler Burge (1979) has argued) a speaker who, considered individually, remains qualitatively the same, may nevertheless assert something different simply because of a variation in the linguistic community to which she belongs. (For example, what her utterance of “arthritis” means is determined not by what is “in her head”, but by the medical experts in her community. If their usage were to shift, so would the meaning of her assertions, independently of any internal change in her.) Now if reference and truth conditions of expressions by which one’s thought is reported or expressed are not determined by what is in one’s head, and the content of one’s thought determines their reference and truth conditions, then the content of one’s thought is also not determined individualistically. Rather it is necessarily bound up with one’s causal relations to certain natural substances, and one’s membership in a certain linguistic community. Both linguistic meaning and mental contents are “externally” determined.
The development of externalist conceptions of intentionality informs the reception of Russell’s legacy in contemporary philosophy of mind as well. Russell also helped to put in play a conception of the intentionality of mental states, according to which each such state is seen as involving the individual’s “acquaintance with a proposition” (counterpart to Fregean “grasping”)—which proposition is at once both what is understood in understanding expressions by which the state of mind is reported, and the content of the individual’s state of mind. Thus for many philosophers influenced by the Russellian heritage, intentional states are conceived of as attitudes towards propositions—propositional attitudes. Also importantly, Russell’s famous analysis of definite descriptions into phrases employing existential quantifiers and predicates underlay many subsequent philosophers’ rejection of any conception of intentionality (like Meinong’s) that sees in it a relation to non-existent objects. And, Russell’s treatment drew attention to cases of what he called “logically proper names” that apparently defy such analysis in descriptive terms (paradigmatically, the terms “this” and “that”), and which (he thought) thus must refer directly to objects. Reflection on such “demonstrative” and “indexical” (e.g., “I”, “here”, “now”) reference led some (Kaplan 1979; Perry 1977) to maintain that the content of our states of mind cannot always be constituted by Fregean senses but must be seen as consisting partly of public objects in the world outside our heads to which we refer, demonstratively, indexically—another source of support for an externalist view of mental content, hence, of intentionality.
Yet another important source of externalist proclivities in twentieth century philosophy lies in the thought that the meaningfulness of a speaker’s utterances depends on its potential intelligibility to hearers: language must be public—an idea that has found varying and influential expression in the work of Ludwig Wittgenstein, W.V.O. Quine, and Donald Davidson. This, coupled with the assumption that intentionality (or “thought” in the broad (Cartesian) sense) must be expressible in language, has led some to conclude that what determines the content of one’s mind must lie in the external conditions that enable others to attribute that content.
It would be appropriate here to note the emergence of another sort of externalism in philosophy of mind and cognitive science since the 1990s, distinct from the “content externalism” made prominent by Putnam and Burge, as strains of “embodied”, “embedded”, or “enactive”, theorizing about perception, cognition and action gained prominence. For instance, on the “extended mind” view advocated in Clark and Chalmers 1998, mental processes are not confined to representational activity inside one’s head—they encompass an embodied interaction with one’s environment—cognition (broadly construed) is not limited to the manipulations of internal representations, but extends to the use of things out in the world.
It should be noted here too that the movement from Frege and Russell toward externalist views of intentional content has been, and continues to be subject to serious detailed challenges, and has prompted development of alternative (sometimes avowedly internalist) accounts. (Consider, for example: Crane 1991, Farkas 2008, Ludwig 1996b, and Searle 1983.) And it is no easy matter even getting clear about the fundamental theses at issue—partly insofar as what it means to talk about what is “internal” to the subject, and just what is assumed about the notion of content, are often unclear. In fact, Brie Gertler (2012b) argues that the “internalism/externalism debate” is something of a mess, and there is ultimately no satisfactory univocal understanding of just what is under dispute.
One other aspect of the Frege-Russell tradition of theorizing about content that impinges on the consciousness/intentionality connection is this. If content is identified with the sense or the truth-condition determiners of the expressions used in the object-clause reporting intentional states of mind, it will seem natural (even if it’s not inevitable) to suppose that possession of mental content requires the possession of conceptual capacities of the sort involved in linguistic understanding—“grasping senses”. Here, however, another issue rears its head: is there not perhaps a form of sensory intentionality that does not require anything as distinctively intellectual or conceptual as is needed for the grasping of linguistic senses or propositions? (This would be a kind of intentionality that could be had by the pre-linguistic (e.g., babies) or by non-linguistic creatures (e.g., dogs).) Advocates of varying versions of the idea that there is a distinctively “non-conceptual” kind of content include Bermúdez (1998), Crane (1992), Evans (1982), Kelly (2001), Peacocke (1992), and Tye (1995). For “conceptualist” voices of opposition to this trend, see Brewer (2005), McDowell (1994), and Speaks (2005). A deep difficulty in assessing these debates lies in getting an acceptable conception of concepts (and of concept possession) to work with (see Wright 2015).
We can now see, in the analytic tradition, the emergence of themes similar to the “detachability” and “basic forms” themes identified in the connection with the phenomenological movement. Later we will discuss these parallels. For now, to round out the present historical sketch so as to inform such comparisons, we may note some of the factors seemingly important to the course discussion took in analytic philosophy. Though its approach to intentionality is historically rooted in Fregean and Russellian treatments of logic and language, developments during the twentieth century sketched above—various forms of externalism, along with opposition to allegedly over-intellectualized views of perceptual intentionality—came in conflict with this heritage to some extent. Among the sources of this shift, one might plausibly find: a disenchantment with early twentieth century conceptions of philosophy’s distinctive role (of, e.g., providing conceptual analyses, and solutions to logico-linguistic puzzles); aligned with this, an increasingly perceived need to support claims in philosophy with experimental science, especially as systematic, academic psychology grew more sophisticated and successful; and finally—relatedly—the belief that defending a scientific worldview requires defending an ontology typically described as “physicalist” against objections deemed to have unacceptably dualist implications. Such factors (and others) helped encourage philosophers in the analytic tradition to tie consciousness more closely to intentionality in ways that raised issues similar to those canvassed above in connection with phenomenology—though often from rather different motives.
5. Varieties of Intentionalism
One evidently fundamental division in views about the relationship of consciousness and intentionality separates those who think that consciousness—more specifically, the phenomenal character of the sort of experience we actually have—necessarily carries with it some kind of intentionality, and those who do not. We might call the former (as will be seen, quite varied group) “intentionalists” and the latter (following Horgan and Tienson 2002) “separatists”. Intentionalism, so characterized, can cover a wide variety of positions, partly because of potential variety in just how intentionality is conceived. Exactly what contrast is marked by “intentionalism vs. separatism” will depend heavily on one’s conception of intentionality.
Still, operating at first only with a broad and open notion of this contrast, perspectives reasonably regarded as separatist occupied the mainstream of much twentieth century analytic philosophy. According to an important (once predominant) view, consciousness is exhausted by non-intentional “qualia” or “raw feels”. Plausibly, the acceptance of this view owes much to the profound influence of Gilbert Ryle’s Concept of Mind (1949) in the development of analytic philosophy. As part of his argument against a Cartesian notion of mind as the site of hidden (“occult”) “ghostly” occurrences, Ryle contends that the stream of consciousness has nothing to do with what’s central to mind, since it contains only sensations and imagery that provide “no possibility of deciding whether the creature that had these was an animal or a human being; an idiot, a lunatic, or a sane man”—nothing of which it is appropriate to ask whether it is correct or incorrect, veridical or nonveridical. Also powerfully influential, in the same era and intellectual milieu, was Wittgenstein’s (1953) attack on the idea of understanding as an “inner process”, and his criticism of the notion that there could be a private language. Popularity of Wittgensteinian insistence on the need for public criteria of meaning could—and plausibly did—reinforce a Rylean belittlement of consciousness, on the assumption that consciousness, being something hidden or “inner”, could bring with it distinctions in understanding and intelligence only if meaning were something purely private—as it cannot be. At any rate, partly through the reception of Ryle and Wittgenstein in U.T. Place’s (1956) and J.J.C Smart’s (1959) influential brain-based materialist view about consciousness, the reduction of consciousness to sensation and sensory imagery became firmly implanted in philosophy of mind, since these writings did so much to set the terms of its debates.
Also influential, to similar effect, was the conception expressed in Wilfrid Sellars’ (1956) distinction between sentience (sensation) and sapience. Whereas the qualities of feelings involved in the former—mere sensations—require no cognitive sophistication and are readily attributable to brutes, the latter—involving awareness of, awareness that—requires that one have the right concepts, which cannot be guaranteed just by having sensations, but needs learning and inferential capacities (which Sellars believed come only with language). Richard Rorty (1979) was not alone in taking Sellars’ views to support a strict separation of the phenomenal and the intentional (see also Brandom 1994). Rorty’s appropriation of Sellars (blended with Quinean eliminativism) leads him to deny not just the importance, but even the reality of consciousness.
Externalist arguments (of the sort mentioned in Section 4) have also been taken to support the separation of the “qualitative” from meaning and content (hence the separation of consciousness from intentionality). For it has been sometimes assumed that the phenomenal character of one’s experience is “fixed internally”—i.e., it has no necessary relation to the nature of particular substances in one’s external environment or to one’s linguistic community. Thus if externalist arguments (like those of Putnam and Burge) show that neither meaning nor content is “in the head”, phenomenal consciousness cannot imply any intentionality or content. Putnam (1981) himself drew such a conclusion, and much like Ryle, took the stream of consciousness to comprise nothing more than sensations and images, which (recalling Frege) are to be set apart from thought and meaning. Without denying important differences in the views just mentioned, it seems reasonable to suppose that together they helped entrench in analytic philosophy a conception (sometimes welded to the term “qualia”) that confines consciousness, in the experiential/what it’s like sense, to sensations and sensory images—and thus segregates it from thought, concepts, and “propositional attitudes”—hence from intentionality. (For a recent defense of this tradition, see Papineau 2021.)
Objections to this conception of sense-experience became increasingly common towards the end of the twentieth century, from diverse angles and motivations, in writings affirming a variety of intentionalist positions. But even before that, separatism was neither unambiguously embraced nor universal in analytic philosophy (consider Anscombe 1965). And an important explicit statement of broadly intentionalist views of perceptual experience can be found even in the early nineteen eighties (Searle’s 1983 Intentionality). One significant strain of intentionalism (quite unlike Searle’s) arising in the 1990s, combines acceptance of externalism about content with a rejection of internalism about phenomenal character. Thus Martin Davies (1997), Fred Dretske (1995), and Michael Tye (1995, 2002) argue that the phenomenal character of experience is also essentially determined by causal environmental connections. Pace Putnam, externalism about intentionality should not be taken to support separatism. Philosophers working from this perspective also characteristically limit what kind of intentionality they took to be inseparable from phenomenal character—to some extent preserving the Rylean, purely sensory stream of consciousness—but giving this a crucial intentionalist twist. One draws a distinction between two sorts of intentionality or mental representation, one of which is found in sensory states, the other in cognitive or conceptual states. One then maintains that only the former is entailed by or constitutive of phenomenal character. As alluded to earlier, Tye identifies phenomenal character with the non-conceptual, picture- or map-like representational content he attributes to perceptual states which are poised to affect belief.
Tye’s account also exemplifies two other features common to a number of externalist intentionalist views of consciousness that arose in the shadow of separatism. First, his view is, as we might put it, thoroughly “non-reflexivist” (in the sense introduced in Section 3): it finds essential to one’s conscious state neither a representation of that state (i.e., no higher-order or self-representation), nor any directedness/reference to that state, nor any self-consciousness (whether this be construed as consciousness of the state itself, or of the self whose state it is). Secondly, Tye’s intentionalism is of what we might call a reductive sort. That is to say, the claim is not merely that it follows from an experience’s having certain kinds of phenomenal character that it is intentional or has intentionality of some sort. The claim is that its being phenomenal, and having the character it does, comes as a necessary consequence of what kind of intentionality it has (or what kind of mental representation it is), where this type of intentionality/representation can be explained in terms that involve no primitive appeal to phenomenal character. Thus the idea is not just the minimal intentionalist one that some kinds of phenomenality entail some kinds of intentionality. The idea is that phenomenal character can be explained as nothing but—it can be explanatorily reduced to—a certain kind of intentionality or representation.
Such reductive intentionalism is significantly motivated by a metaphysical aim that has animated much analytic philosophy of mind: to say what mental states are in non-mentalistic, physical terms. Part of what inspires this goal is the thought that, if mind is real and efficacious, it must somehow be necessitated by the facts of nature that science reveals—a nature in itself fundamentally mindless. But how could there be such necessitation of the mental by the non-mental? Reductive intentionalism about consciousness offers the outline of an answer. Like the separatist, one starts from a general conception of intentionality (or mental representation) that does not assume consciousness, along with some idea about how such intentionality must arise in a world governed by the operation of certain non-intentional, natural-causal processes. Then, still without appeal to consciousness, one purports to identify a certain species of intentionality (in terms of its use, its sources, its content), whose presence (and here one parts from separatism) purportedly guarantees the occurrence of experience with a certain phenomenal character. On such a reductive intentionalist perspective, separatist philosophers do no more than contain the problematic “inner”, “private”, “subjective” mind of the Cartesian legacy and mitigate its harm, by sequestering it in a zone—consciousness—from which understanding, intelligence, meaning, intentionality have been safely evacuated (as in the view suggested by Kim 2011). The problem will be fully resolved, only if, instead of merely shrinking and isolating consciousness, we find a way of entirely subsuming it in a conception of mental representation that owes nothing to it.
We have just focused on the emergence of a kind of intentionalism about consciousness that is not only reductive, but externalist, strongly restrictivist, and completely non-reflexivist. But we now need to make it clearer how intentionalist views can be advanced that depart significantly from that position along one or more of each of these dimensions. Consider first how an intentionalist might oppose both separatism and externalism. One might begin with a Cartesian thought experiment in which one conceives of one’s consciousness with all its subjective riches intact, though the spatial realm of nature is supposed a fiction. Or less radically, one may start with the science fiction scenario of a “brain in a vat”, whose artificially induced activity generates an extended history of sense experience that is indistinguishable—in its subjective, phenomenal character—from that of a subject with a human body moving about in the environment, as we believe ourselves to do. Again, if you assume an externalist view of intentionality, you may conclude that phenomenal character, being thus detachable from the external world, is also separable from (and insufficient for) intentionality. However, you might instead turn your guns in the opposite direction—against externalism. It may seem to you that the most intuitively plausible reading of the vat scenario would take the brain’s experience to be a global hallucination, something like a vivid, massively coherent dream, and so a systematically incorrect experience of where the subject of experience is and what is happening around it. And so, we should think the intentionality or representational character of such experience would survive its estrangement from the world, along with its phenomenal character. One may then infer that for at least some contents/kinds of intentionality or representation, the kind of causal tie between mind and world that, according to some externalisms, we need for fixing its intentional content, is not strictly necessary after all. This route to a non-externalist intentionalism about consciousness finds varying expression in, for example, Kriegel 2011, Horgan and Tienson 2002, Loar 2003, and Ludwig 1996b.)
Such a challenge to externalist intentionalism would clearly also challenge its strategy of reductionism. There are other ways to be an intentionalist and reject both. One approach (albeit still using radical thought experiments) would draw on the sort of “zombie” scenario whose metaphysical significance is explored in such sophisticated detail by Chalmers 1996: one conceives of a world type identical to our own in terms of basic physics (laws, distribution of particles and forces), but with consciousness left out. One might take the conceivability of such a world to give one reason to reject the externalist-intentionalist assumption that the right combination of natural, non-intentional, non-phenomenal facts metaphysically guarantees the presence of consciousness. And one might still combine this with the claim that certain forms of consciousness do guarantee some sort of intentionality. This sort of non-reductive intentionalist view would actually go beyond challenging externalist intentionalism about consciousness, to upset the metaphysical picture commonly motivating it. For this would be to reject the assumption that mind (conscious mind at least) is not a basic aspect of reality, to reject, that is, the idea that it’s a necessary consequence of certain non-mental facts.
There are yet other routes to a non-reductive intentionalism, less metaphysically bold. One might question the adequacy of various reductionist strategies that have been employed for specifying a kind of intentionality (or mental representation) that non-circularly guarantees phenomenality—as in Tye’s theory. One way doubts can get a grip is by considering variations on the phenomenon of “blindsight”—which may be reasonably interpreted as involving limited visual discriminatory abilities regarding stimuli that (on account of cortical damage) don’t look—don’t visually appear—anyhow to the discriminating subject. Can we coherently conceive of some such blindsight—a kind of “seeing” without visual consciousness (experience) of the visual stimuli—that nonetheless would meet the conditions this or that reductive intentionalist is committed to thinking guarantee phenomenal vision? Various kinds of enhanced blindsight have been envisaged (Block’s superblindsight 1995, 2002; Siewert’s spontaneous amblyopic blindsight 1998, 2010). We are invited to consider the prospect of visually mediated responses, in action and report, to stimuli of which the subject lacks visual experience—responses that correspond, in their spontaneity and acuity, to what is afforded by very low-grade visual experience. Suppose we can find no non-phenomenal intentional/representational difference, necessarily distinguishing such low-grade visual consciousness from its closest blindsight analogue, to which we can reduce the difference between the two. Then certain prominent versions of reductionism are threatened. But opposition or skepticism regarding all such accounts can coexist with intentionalism in the broadest sense. However, this sort of challenge to reductive intentionalism would leave open questions about what, if anything, to say about brains in vats, zombies, physicalism, and metaphysical basic-ness—and it would even be compatible with some forms of externalism.
The possibility of non-reductive intentionalism may be evident in another important way, particularly relevant to sense experience. Reductive intentionalism may seem to require that phenomenal character necessarily supervenes on intentional content—or on this plus “intentional mode” (where that encompasses sensory modality). Or, as one might put it, for any phenomenal difference there must be a difference in what properties something is represented to have, or a difference in the cognitive mode (or in sensory modality—e.g., visual or tactile) through which it is represented to have them. But a nonreductive intentionalism is not committed to such a strong thesis. For one may allow that various differences in phenomenal character are sufficient for differences in intentional features, while holding that there can be differences in character without differences in what something is represented to be, or in mode/modality of representation. Such would be the case, for example, if one argued (like Block 1990) that two visual experiences could represent the same objective color property on account of sharing appropriate causal linkages to the physical environment, even though subjectively the experience of color differed—there was a difference in “mental paint”—in virtue of some internally contrived inversion of what it was like for one to experience color on the two occasions. Independently of such views about the metaphysics of color and visual representation, one might maintain (like Siewert 2005) that the subtle but ubiquitous differences in the subjective character of experience that come with shifts between what is less and what is more “attended-to” in the visual field often cannot be justifiably matched to represented differences in “what properties look to be where”. Both views appear incompatible with reductive intentionalism. But both are consistent with the idea that the phenomenal character of visual experience brings intentionality with it—for example, in making things in your environment look to you shaped, sized, or positioned either accurately or inaccurately.
Part of what this section aims to make clear is the variety of views that might be seen as intentionalist. Intentionalism may be either externalist or not, reductive or not. Further, intentionalisms may be, as already suggested, either more or less restrictive or inclusive (and this in various ways). And they may be either completely non-reflexivist, or in some respect reflexivist—where the latter category is very heterogeneous, and can encompass deeply divergent views. And both of these latter contrasts admit of being developed in diverse, and either reductive or non-reductive ways. Section 6 will explore the inclusive/restrictive contrast and some of the positions that have appeared along this dimension, and Section 7 some varieties of reflexivist notions. Before delving into these complications, the reader may wonder what is supposed to justify intentionalism, and how the issues of this section might appear from the phenomenological perspectives canvassed in Section 3. Discussion of the first question can be found in the supplement, Arguments for Intentionalism. The second question is discussed in the supplement, Phenomenology and Intentionalism.
6. How Rich is Consciousness?
We have met with a contrast between views that are relatively inclusive, and those that are relatively restrictive in what they count as properly experiential. Specifically: non-separatists’ positions diverge with respect to what differences in intentionality they regard as brought along with differences in the phenomenal or subjective character of experience. If we think of “phenomenal intentionality” as whatever intentionality comes along with certain varieties of phenomenal consciousness, we can distinguish those views that recognize more phenomenal intentionality from those that recognize less. Philosophers disagree then over how richly intentional (and thus, as we might also say, how cognitively rich) phenomenal character is. In this section we will set separatism aside, and focus on how intentionalist perspectives differ along this dimension.
We have noted how distinguishing basic forms of intentionality or content (such as “conceptual” and “non-conceptual”) may be allied (as in Tye) with a broad restriction on phenomenal intentionality: phenomenal character is confined to a non-conceptual sort of intentionality (or content or representation) that is found in sensory states (where these would encompass, e.g., both visual perception and imagery). Similarly, one may draw a general limit to the kind of properties that can be represented in the phenomenal character of one’s experience. This is illustrated in Prinz’s (2012) representationalist theory: he limits phenomenal character to “intermediate level” “viewpoint dependent” properties that one may perceive something to have (such as “2½-D” shapes); “higher-level” properties (such as being a chair) are excluded.
However, to think of such theories as admitting relatively less richness to phenomenal intentionality could mislead us. An aspect of this: one may limit richness in the manner just suggested, while expanding it in other ways. In the case of vision one indication of richness might lie in how finely discriminatory the intentional/representational differences in phenomenal character are: a richer view would recognize more differences in colors or shapes figure in experience in this way, a sparser view fewer. The question here would be roughly: how much can you visually experience of space, of color, in a given amount of time? On such matters, both Tye’s and Prinz’s accounts would come out as rich relative to others—since they would say that a higher level of spatial detail is experienced even in relatively brief visual presentations (such as letter arrays) than would others—like Dennett, who advocates a professedly “sparse” view of consciousness. Controversies of this sort about richness versus sparseness have recently played out in complex ways that combine phenomenological considerations with detailed interpretation of experimental work on vision (concerned, e.g, with “change blindness”, “inattentional blindness”, “masking”, and “Sperling paradigm” cuing effects). (See, for example, Block 2012 for discussion of such issues, in support of a relatively rich view.) And such questions about the “fineness of grain” or “detail” in visual experience have often been discussed in connection with questions about the conflict or harmony between what first-person reflective judgment (“introspection”) seems to tell us about experience and what experimental data reveal (see Noë 2002 on the “grand illusion hypothesis”).
At issue in these latter sort of “richness” controversies is, roughly speaking, the amount of “richness at a level”—e.g., how finely differentiated is spatial experience of an array of objects? These contrast with the earlier indicated issues concerning what we might call “richness of levels” in experience. For example, does subjective experience not only distinguish (“at a level”) differences in (e.g.) how far a surface bulges out, but differences of additional levels—say, whether an object is spherical or cubical, and not just these, but whether it is a ball or a chair? It seems clear one can have a rich view with respect to one sort of issue, while maintaining sparseness at the other. If the question is richness “at a level” Dennett would seem to hold a sparse view relative to Prinz. But if we are asking about richness “of levels”, the comparison comes out differently: Dennett’s view of consciousness, as Prinz (disapprovingly) notes, puts no limits on what sort of properties might figure in its content.
Another complicating factor here has to do with how one situates a taxonomy of views with respect to a distinction between sensory or perceptual phenomena on the on hand, and thought or cognition, on the other. Susanna Siegel has argued for the view that so-called “high-level” features, like being a pine tree, are “represented in visual experience”. Tim Bayne (2009) has argued for a position similar to Siegel’s, partly by appeal to consideration of the kind of deficits in visual recognition found in associative agnosia. Such views of visual consciousness contrast with Tye’s and Prinz’s. (See Byrne and Siegel 2017 for an illustration of this debate. And see Connolly 2019 for defense of a relatively low-level view, discussed in connection with research on perceptual recognition and learning.) Yet other alternatives are possible here—one might maintain experience encompasses a greater richness of levels than do Byrne, Tye, or Prinz, though without (like Siegel) putting visual experience in the business of representing objects to have high-level properties. One might argue for the experiential reality of spatial object constancy, and of visual recognition of kinds, without committing to Siegel’s version of representationalism: something might subjectively and irreducibly look recognizable to you as a pine tree or a glove, for example—but this isn’t necessarily to say that your visual experience (like your thought) correctly or incorrectly represents it to have a property that would be missing in a genetically different plant, or in a differently purposed artifact (Siewert 2013a, 2015, 2019). The issues raised here turn partly on what sort of description of experience yields the best understanding of visual recognition in the light of what is made evident by Gestalt phenomena and selective deficits in vision, and they seem to call for careful interpretation of relevant experimental work (see Block 2014).
Another species of “richness” controversy that arises with a distinction between thought and sensory states is this. Again, we may distinguish thinking (cognition of the sort involved in conceptual, rational understanding) from both perceiving with the senses and forming sensory images. We may thus think of things when we neither perceive them by the senses, nor form sensory images of them (by e.g., visualizing), and even where such images as we may then form (say, such as an utterance in inner speech) do not suffice for the thoughts we then have. Even if Siegel’s view is in doubt, it may seem at least that conceptual thinking in this sense can, in virtue of its subjective character, be about pines (and not merely “pine-ish” things), and about gloves (and not merely “glove-ish” things). That is, one might affirm a phenomenal-intentional richness of levels, not by having sensory experience attribute to objects a richer class of properties, but by holding that thinking and understanding possess phenomenal character that yields richer cognitive differences than can be delivered by the sort of sensory experience one can have without full-blown conceptual abilities.
Is there something it’s like for us to think that is not exhausted by what it’s like for us to have merely sensory states? Here we come upon the issue that has lately emerged under the heading “cognitive phenomenology”. Or rather, we come upon one way of articulating an aspect of issues so labeled. Much of the challenge of this debate lies in properly framing it; different parties have done so in significantly different ways. As a start, and very roughly, we might distinguish views that include in phenomenal character the sorts of differences in thinking and understanding that go beyond the “purely sensory” and those that restrict phenomenal character in a way that excludes these. The latter philosophers hold that phenomenal character is exhausted by or reducible to non-cognitive, purely sensory differences, while the former say there is more to it than this—the “something more” found in thought. The articles in Bayne and Montague 2011 provide an array of perspectives on this issue. Chudnoff 2015 furnishes a detailed overview and assessment of the debate.
A prominent defender of an inclusive view—David Pitt—takes the question to concern, crucially, whether thought has its own “proprietary and distinctive” phenomenal character (Pitt 2004). His affirmative answer to this has been glossed by saying there is a special sort of “non-sensory phenomenology”. (See also Michelle Montague’s 2016 formulation.) This has been taken to imply the phenomenal character of thought can be separated from that of sensory states in certain ways critics have found highly dubious. Tye and Wright 2011, for instance, assume that if there is indeed “cognitive phenomenology”, then there is an aspect to the phenomenal character of verbally expressed thought that would remain the same if all imagery and sense perception (including the verbal imagery involved in its expression) were removed from it—a phenomenological constant that would inevitably be shared by monolingual speakers of different languages expressing their thoughts intertranslatably. And they find this consequence quite incredible. Prinz 2011 assumes that if inclusive (what he calls “expansionist”) views were right, we should be able to engage in experiential thought independently of all sensory activity, much as we can enjoy experience in one sensory modality in the absence of another (as when we see without hearing). But, he says, we do not. Related criticisms appear in Pautz 2013 and 2021.
Some proponents of inclusivity do embrace a quite radical in-principle separability of thought and sensory experience. Kriegel 2015, for example, invites us to consider the cognitive experience of a subject engaged in “pure” mathematical reasoning, unaccompanied by imagery or sensed symbolic expression of any sort. However, neither this sort of radical separability, nor the kinds criticized in Pautz, Prinz, and Tye, are essential to all inclusive views. For Siewert 1998, 2011 the issue does not turn on whether linguistic expression or sensory vehicles are merely incidental to our conscious thinking, or on whether there’s a cognitive component to its subjective character that would remain identifiably the same, were everything sensory is stripped away from it. Rather, the question is whether the subjective character of your experience when you read, speak, or listen to others, would remain unchanged if all understanding were stripped away, or if differences in how you understood the words were radically switched around. Chudnoff 2015 also takes pains to separate the question of cognitive phenomenology from the claims critics have associated with it.
Clearly then, no small part of justifying a position on this aspect of the “cognitive richness of levels” issue consists in arguing for a certain way of framing the issues. Additionally, and in connection with this, arguments proceed by asking us to consider what sort of differences (or contrasts) in phenomenal character we recognize in reflection. For instance: is there a difference in what it’s like for you to take an ambiguous phrase in one sense, and then another? Is there such an experiential difference between reading or hearing something without following it, and then again, with understanding? Are we justified in thinking such differences as we find always coincide with merely sensory differences? Would what it’s like for us when we understand something differently be just the same if understanding were absent? Arguments here also focus on the idea that differences in what it’s like for one to have experience make for differences in self-knowledge for which we cannot adequately account, if we assume the relevant phenomenal differences to be independent of conceptual thought and understanding. (For a sampling of arguments appealing in a variety of ways to experiential contrasts, see Chudnoff 2015, Horgan and Tienson 2002, Pitt 2004, Siewert 1998, 2011, and Strawson 1994. For an interpretation and critique of “contrast arguments”, see Koksvik 2015. For representative arguments that all relevant contrasts are exhausted by purely sensory differences, see Tye and Wright 2011; Prinz 2011, 2013; and Robinson 2011. For an argument against such sensory “reductions” appealing to the phenomenon of aphantasia, see Lennon, forthcoming. For arguments that appeal, in different ways, to connections between experiential and epistemic differences, see Pitt 2004 and Siewert 2011. For discussion of Pitt’s epistemic argument, see Chudnoff 2015. For an overview of the issues and strategies of argument, see Smithies 2013a and 2013b.)
Another aspect to these issues concerns what conception of thought content one employs, and how this is introduced. Some ways of defining the issues invoke at the very outset a notion of content (or of representation). Pitt sees the basic question as whether the phenomenology of thought “individuates its content”. One may, however, also approach the issue initially by asking about the relation of phenomenal differences to differences in how we understand our words, or how we think of what we are thinking about—where “understanding” and “thinking” are taken to imply the possession of relevant conceptual abilities. Only after this, does one pose questions about content, on consideration of various ways of construing that notion (see Siewert 2011 and Chudnoff 2015). But when questions about the subjective experience of thinking do join with questions about differences in what is thought—differences in content—assessment of the externalist arguments about content (mentioned in Section 3) again become relevant. Somewhat as in the case of sense perception, thorny questions arise about how to interpret envisaged scenarios in which the subjective character of experience apparently remains constant, while certain facts about one’s environment are varied in imagination (facts such as: which of a pair of “twin” objects is found there, what type of hidden microstructure its natural kinds have, what linguistic practices are followed locally). Should we accept that subjective character would be invariant across scenarios described in terms of such variations? If we do, should we take this, together with an inclusive attitude, to indicate that some differences in content are, and some are not, set with phenomenal character? Or should we instead adopt an unqualified externalism that concludes no sort of thought content supervenes on subjective experience? Or, on the contrary, should we regard no fully extra-phenomenal differences as constituting genuine differences in what is thought? To thoroughly address questions about the phenomenal character of thought and understanding, one needs to examine various notions of thought content, and what theoretical role they are supposed to serve.
Further issues that seem to call for treatment in connection with the phenomenal character of thought include the following. How should we align a view of this with an understanding of what concepts are (and what it is to possess them)? (See, e.g., Peter Forrest’s 2017 argument that the notion that phenomenal character “determines thought content” aligns poorly with the best theories of concepts, given certain assumptioins about the relation between concepts and contents.) In this connection too we may ask—how, if at all, subjects’ concepts could vary, even if the totality of facts (including dispositional facts) regarding the subjective character of their experience is held constant? How should a sense of agency (and thought “authorship”), and differences among mental actions (e.g., judging, doubting, merely considering) figure in our understanding of the experience of thinking? And how is that experience related to the idea of a “fringe of consciousness”?
Finally, we may note that this section’s issues raise important methodological questions for the philosophy of consciousness especially acutely. What role should reflection on one’s own experience play in argument? And what role should interpretation of recent intellectual history have here? Regarding the first question: it has been suggested that if this sort of reflection—“introspection”—did have a legitimate role to play, it should have easily resolved questions of cognitive phenomenology—as it evidently has not (Schwitzgebel 2011, Spener 2011). Against this, it has been argued that reflection on experience has indeed a crucial place here, but its value depends on how well one has framed the questions one puts to it and how good are the assumptions that guide one’s reflection—controversial matters of philosophical quality we have no right to expect to be easily assessed (Siewert 2011). Regarding the place of historical understanding: one may wonder why (as noted earlier) separatist and restrictive conceptions of consciousness—of the sorts that now make inclusive views controversial—are so little in evidence in phenomenology, or even in early twentieth century analytic philosophy or psychology. How and why did the framework in which philosophers think about consciousness shift? What can this tell us about the dialectical situation in which we currently find ourselves? (See Crane 2019.)
7. Consciousness and Self-Consciousness
One could see the question of how consciousness relates to self-consciousness as opening up a further dimension of potential cognitive richness to investigate: here again one may contrast those who find more and those who find less in experience—the former finding in it this or that form of self-consciousness where the latter do not. But these issues exhibit a unity and complexity of their own, and an importance that calls for separate treatment. To prepare to survey some ways they have found expression in recent philosophy, we may recall three questions about the alleged reflexivity of consciousness that were earlier identified in phenomenological writings. The first asks in what sense if any, when there is a conscious state, there must be consciousness of it. The second asks whether it is only occasionally, in reflection, that a conscious state is simultaneously an intentional object for the one whose state it is. Third, there is the question of whether consciousness ordinarily somehow involves a non-reflective consciousness of oneself—as subject. These questions may be seen in the context of understanding the consciousness-intentionality relationship, insofar as self-consciousness may be considered a kind of intentional directedness either to one’s own states of mind, or one’s self, or perhaps, an aspect of conscious intentionality directed at other things.
In recent analytic philosophy of mind, higher-order and self-representationalist theorists of consciousness (of the sort mentioned in Section 1) combine an affirmative answer to the first of the three questions above with a negative answer to the second. Their theories typically work from the idea it is a necessary to any conscious state that one who is in that state be conscious of it—where to say one is conscious of something implies it is somehow an intentional, or represented object. In this respect they resemble Brentano, and are unlike Husserl and other phenomenologists in how they view the consciousness/self-consciousness relationship. But unlike Brentano, they use this stance as the springboard for a reductive intentionalist theory of consciousness, ultimately to be put at the service of a physicalist conception of mind. What it is for a state to be conscious can be fully explained by specifying the right sorts of representation and mental target—where what these are can be ultimately cashed out in non-mental, non-intentional terms. If one form of self-consciousness consists in being conscious of one’s own states of mind—these reductive reflexivist theories could be said to claim that state consciousness generally is explained by being reduced to what we might call “state self-consciousness”.
The advent of such theories accounts for much recent attention to the relationship between one’s manner of being conscious of one’s own conscious states and the fact that they are conscious. But there are other reasons for interest. One may well think it is in the nature of conscious states to be available for a distinctively first-person reflective self-consciousness—when they occur in beings capable of reflection—and that this involves a form of thought that cannot arise in the absence of its object. This way of drawing a close connection between consciousness and self-consciousness can be found, for example, in “acquaintance” theories of self-knowledge (Gertler 2012a) and certain interpretations of the notion of “phenomenal concepts” (Chalmers 2010), as well as other accounts of how we know our own minds (Smithies 2012a, 2019; Siewert 2012b, 2014). But these ideas involve no commitment to claiming that what makes a state conscious is its being represented in a special way in the very mind to which it belongs. Their positive philosophical significance lies not in supporting a reductive intentionalism, but in their efforts to elucidate the distinctive way we understand ourselves, grounded in an interpretation of consciousness.
However, it is suitable here to focus on theories that do hold that what makes a state conscious is being an object of the right sort of representation, since these lie close to the concerns that have most dominated philosophy of mind over the last fifty years or so. And, in any case, they raise issues about the relationship of consciousness and self-consciousness whose interest goes beyond their immediate connection with these theories. It will first be useful to note some of the different forms these theories may take. They differ, for instance, on the question of whether the conscious-making representation and its target are distinct states, or collapse into one. The latter option identifies consciousness with a certain sort of mental self-representation (Kriegel 2009), while the “higher-order theory” label is sometimes reserved for accounts of the former type. Another important fork in the road for such accounts: whether they propose that the targeting representation aims at its target in a “thought-like” manner, or in a “perception-like” manner. To take the first option is to endorse (like Rosenthal 1986, 1991, 1993, 2002b, and Weisberg 2011) a “higher-order thought” theory of consciousness; to take the second, a “higher-order perception” (or an “inner sense”) theory (as is found in Armstrong 1968, Carruthers 2004, and Lycan 1995, 2004). Kriegel, for his part, entertains the idea that the right sort of targeting representation is properly regarded as neither thought-like or sensory, but sui generis. Here it becomes clear how some distinction between what properly belongs to thought, and what to the senses (in the last section seen to figure centrally in disputes about cognitive richness), also figures crucially in articulating and assessing different metacognitive theories of consciousness.
Such theories can also differ with respect to what they regard as a suitable candidate state. Is any type of mental state fair game for being made conscious by being represented, or only sensory “qualitative” states? Here we see how higher-order and self-representationalist theories might make consciousness cognitively rich in one way (by including metacognition in it constitutively), while making it cognitively sparse in another (only sensory states need apply).
Proponents of such accounts sometimes explicitly deny that they aim to explain the “qualitative character” of experience in terms of higher-order or self-representations. This might lead one to think that they are not trying to give a theory of phenomenal consciousness at all—on the assumption that a theory of that would be a theory of “qualia”. However, they do purport to explain generally, in metarepresentational terms, what it’s like for one to be in a state of mind. And they don’t appear to treat the phenomenal separately, under the “qualitative” label. This is especially clear when (as in Rosenthal) qualitative states are illustrated by examples commonly regarded as paradigmatically non-phenomenal: unfelt pains, for example, and “blindsight” vision. Thus it seems fair to regard these accounts as proposing a reductive intentionalism about phenomenal character—pursuing a reflexivist strategy analogous to that noted in the non-reflexivist accounts of Tye and Prinz. One starts with some way of classifying mental states that is understood as applying to states of mind regardless of whether there is anything it’s like for one to have them—regardless of whether they have phenomenal character. Then, consciousness (phenomenal character, subjective “what it’s likeness”) is supplied by adding in further representational factors—though in the reflexivist story, the extra ingredient comes in having the states themselves be represented in the right way. So, for example, in Rosenthal’s higher-order thought theory, what it is for a pain to feel to you as it does is for you to have pain (of a type that can occur unfelt), when (seemingly without inference) the thought occurs to you that you do.
An important inspiration for such theories lies in the idea that, pre-theoretically or commonsensically, we are inclined to endorse the idea that conscious states are states we are conscious of. One takes this to have the status of a necessary truth pertaining to all conscious states, and gives it a representationalist construal. This yields the starting point: some sort of higher-order or self-representation is necessary for a state to be conscious in a pre-theoretically recognized sense. We also have reason to believe mental states can occur unconsciously. So maybe: targeting potentially unconscious mental states with the right sort of representation necessary for them to be conscious will also yield a condition sufficient for them to be so, and reveal what it is to be a conscious state.
Such theories’ advocates also draw on interpretation of the idea that conscious states are ones there is something it’s like for you to be in—arguing that what it’s like for you to be in a state is best construed in terms of how you represent that state. (Carruthers 2004; Lycan 1995, 2004; Rosenthal 2002, 2019). Rosenthal argues his higher-order thought variant version of the view has a particular advantage in this regard, since it can account for how what it’s like for you to have sensory states can be transformed, when you learn to classify sensory states via new concepts (as, for example, when you learn to discriminate how wine tastes to you in a connoisseur’s terms). This transformation is best explained, he argues, on the assumption that what you think about your gustatory state just constitutes what it’s like for you to have it.
Additional arguments for metacognitive accounts of consciousness appeal to their alleged explanatory value. For example, Rosenthal argues that the fact that our conscious states comprise the part of the our minds available for our first-person report is best explained by supposing they are always objects of thoughts of the kind such reports would express. And advocates of higher-order perception or inner sense versions of the metacognitive approach argue that such views best explain our capacity to attend to our own experience introspectively (Lycan 2004), and to form “recognitional concepts” of our own sensory states (Carruthers 2004).
These strategies of argument have all occasioned criticism. One may doubt whether commonsense really does support the requisite interpretation of the idea on which the theories ground their appeal (i.e., the idea that conscious states are states we are conscious of) (Prinz 2012; Siewert 1998, 2013b). One may even doubt whether that idea should be endorsed on any construal; according to Dretske 1995, conscious states are not states we are conscious of, but states we are conscious with. The metacognitive interpretation of “what it’s like” locution has also been criticized (see Byrne 2004; Siewert 2013b; and Stoljar, forthcoming), as have some of the above appeals to explanatory value (Siewert 1998, 2012). And one may doubt whether reflection supports the sorts of self-attributions posited by the theory. With respect to the higher-order thought theory: whenever I feel pain, does it in fact occur to me that I am in pain in Rosenthal’s sense (a sense in which one can be in pain without feeling anything)? With respect to the inner sense view: when I feel nauseated, do I find there is some way the feeling is sensed, distinguishable both from how I feel, and from what I think about it (Siewert 1998, 2012b)?
One venerable concern about metacognitive theories of consciousness focuses on the prospect of an infinite regress. We have seen how Brentano addresses this concern, recently renewed in connection with contemporary theories (see Kriegel 2009 and Siewert 2013b). The worry is roughly this. The theories assume we cannot be in a conscious state without being representationally or intentionally conscious of it. But it seems at least as compelling that an unconscious state cannot make one conscious of something. Putting both assumptions together appear to lead to the idea that every conscious state must be represented by a conscious state that makes it conscious. But does this not generate a vicious infinite regress of representations? Kriegel’s favored response resembles Brentano’s: we cut off the regress by means of the notion of self-representation: conscious states necessarily point at themselves, and the self-pointing is conscious—not by being the object of a further act of pointing—but by being one with what it points at. Other defenders of metacognitive approaches (Carruthers, Lycan, Rosenthal) respond to the regress problem differently: they reject the intuition that you can’t be conscious of things by unconsciously perceiving them or thinking of them. So on Rosenthal’s view, typically we are conscious of our vision (and it is conscious) because, as it occurs, we unconsciously think it does.
Another traditional line of criticism (also addressed by Brentano), specifically targets the idea that all consciousness involves “thought-like” metacognition. Does such thought not require the ability to classify one’s own states of mind—to bring them under concepts? Such conceptualization seems to imply a level of cognitive sophistication one may doubt belongs to neonate human beings and many nonhuman animals. But in harboring such doubts, we shouldn’t take ourselves to question whether these creatures have any sensory consciousness at all—e.g., whether colors look somehow to them, or whether they feel pain (Seager 2004; Siewert 1998). So we shouldn’t think consciousness requires higher-order thought. In response, some would not flinch at simply keeping the cognitive bar high for thought, and embrace doubts about animals and babies feeling pain (Carruthers 1989). The other option is to set the metacognitive bar low. Brentano ( 1973: 141–142) took that route: again, for him judgment is the mere affirmation of a presented object. This requires nothing so fancy as predicating of the object affirmed something one takes it to share with others. So there really is no cognitive ability involved in judgments aimed at one’s own sensory states that we can reasonably doubt young children possess. Rosenthal offers a different version of the “low bar” response, proposing that it is enough to have lowgrade concepts of one’s own sensory states that one can make certain fairly primitive nonverbal discriminatory responses to them; the idea is that creatures apply such concepts to themselves whenever they feel something. A question facing “low bar ” views is to explain why, if thought of sensation comes so easily, we should take it to be absent in cases of unconscious perception (such as blindsight, and unfelt pain).
A final important source of challenges to metacognitive theories of consciousness concerns the fallibility of the posited representations. What should we say when your higher-order or self-representation misfires? If it misrepresents what sort of sensory state you are in, will the theory claim this makes you feel just as you do when actually in that sort of state? Will it say, for instance, that when one falsely thinks one is in pain what this is like for one is the same as what it’s like to actually feel pain? Some critics—Block 2011, Neander 1998—regard the problems raised by misrepresentation as profound. From a Brentanian perspective, however, the envisaged problem simply cannot arise. The inevitable affirmation of one’s conscious sensation infallibly affirms it as presented, and it cannot be presented as other than it is—and, since such judgment does not really categorize the sensation at all, it cannot miscategorize it. By contrast, contemporary accounts tend to allow that the relevant form of metacognition can represent you to be in a sensory state you aren’t actually in. They then seek to make acceptable what the theories imply—for instance, that the way one feels can be constituted out of false self-attributions of sensation, and that one can feel pain by being conscious of pain, though there is in fact no state of which one is thus conscious (see Rosenthal 2011; Weisberg 2011).
In this section the issue of how consciousness is related to self-consciousness has been seen as a question of how it is related to “state self-consciousness”. But we may also see this issue as encompassing the question of how consciousness is related to consciousness of self “as subject”—what we might call “subject self-consciousness”—a question earlier broached in the survey of prominent phenomenologists. Views on this topic are discussed in the supplement Consciousness of Self.
8. Consciousness in Mind
How do views about consciousness, intentionality, and their relationship impinge on the question of what it is to have a mind? Given a thin enough conception of intentionality, we might readily accept that having intentionality hardly suffices for having a mind. After all, street signs, books, and computer files could be said to represent or refer to things, and whatever we want from a distinction between the minded and the mindless (or between what has and lacks genuine understanding) we intend it to be more restrictive than that. We may say that the intentionality of true minds is obviously a rather different matter than the intentionality of the symbols that minded beings use. But still we may wonder exactly what makes for that difference.
Could consciousness perhaps be what confers “minded” status? Given a paltry enough conception of consciousness, it’s hard to see how it could—or even how it could be necessary to mind at all. If one thinks of consciousness as brute, non-intentional sensation, for instance, it may seem not to have much to do with mind in any robust sense. But maybe if the right forms of consciousness are recognized, then these, rightly related to intentionality, will be enough to make a mind. If one sees consciousness as sufficient for fairly rich and important forms of intentionality, one has some prospect for arguing that, since it alone can endow what has it with intentionality of the right sort, only what has it, has a mind.
Such a proposal requires we recognize some significant, “in kind” difference between the minded and the mindless, between those capable of understanding and those devoid of comprehension. Such recognition is not universal. On Dennett’s (1981) view, there is fundamentally nothing more to your being, as he puts it, “a true believer”—and thus nothing more ultimately to mind and understanding—than being interpretable by observers in the right way, via “the intentional stance”, so as to facilitate successful predictions of your behavior. Dennett points out that even the behavior of simple mechanisms like thermostats and natural phenomena like lightning can be regarded in this way. He of course recognizes a significant psychological difference between human beings and such marginal case “intentional systems”. This is, however, conceived of as a (considerable) difference of degree. Given your patterns of behavior, observers will be able to use much more complex intentional state attributions to predict what you will do, so as to get a much bigger pay-off in predictive value, than they will in other cases. But there is no more profound division among “intentional systems” than this, to be marked by talking about what is conscious and what isn’t. For consciousness is either just some mythical raw feel of atomic, non-intentional, ineffable “qualia”, or else it has to do with the fact that a predictive advantage accrues from regarding systems as possessed of some assortment of capacities, the exercise of at least some of which one is inclined to call “conscious”. But such differences are again a matter of degree, and the capacities in question exhibit no deep unity (Dennett 1991).
However, many will think there is more to mind (and to consciousness) than Dennett allows. In offering an alternative to his perspective, one might try to locate the basic difference in kind between minded and mindless beings in something other than consciousness. (See, e.g., Burge 2007. For a critique of his approach, see Morgan 2018.) Here however, we will briefly consider how one might put consciousness to work.
Ways of making consciousness integral to mind are potentially very diverse. The issue will look rather different, for example, depending on whether one adopts this or that reductive intentionalist view. Suppose you hold that consciousness is reducible to states generated by sensory mechanisms, feeding the information they bear to certain other cognitive faculties. Then, to maintain consciousness is essential to mind, you would presumably need to maintain a broadly empiricist view that required such sensory input for mind. And a question would then arise about the sufficiency of consciousness for mind—at least for mind at a human level—as one may doubt that such perception by itself brings with it the requisite kind of understanding. On the other hand, if one’s reductive representationalism appeals to some sort of higher-order or self-representational account, one would need a conception of mind that explained why some such self-monitoring is necessary to—and how it could be enough for—mindedness.
Generally, recent views that (explicitly or implicitly) make consciousness central to mind have tended not to base their arguments on reductive intentionalism. Some relevant strategies of argument unreliant on reductivist accounts are sometimes gathered under the rubric of “Phenomenal Intentionality Theory”. Such views aim to show how all intentionality may be traced to phenomenal intentionality.
This approach often trades on the idea that there is a difference between what comes by intentionality in some secondary or derivative way (as when an image or inscription is interpreted as referring to something), and what has intentionality in an original or more fundamental way. The proposal would be: consciousness, and only consciousness, brings with it original intentionality. It would be natural to assume further that only beings that have original intentionality truly have minds. Consider how this works in the case of Searle (1990, 1992). He distinguishes between what he calls “intrinsic” intentionality on the one hand, and merely “as if” and “interpreter relative” intentionality, on the other. We sometimes may speak as if artifacts (like thermostats) had thoughts and wants (“Mr. Thermostat thinks it’s too warm in here”)—but this isn’t to be taken literally. And we may impose conditions of satisfaction on our acts and creations (words, pictures, diagrams, etc.) by our interpretation of them—but they have no intentionality independent of our interpretive practices. The intentionality of mental states, on the other hand, is neither a mere manner of speech, nor is our possession of it derived from others’ interpretive stance towards us. But then: what accounts for the fact that some states of affairs in the world have intrinsic intentionality—that they are directed at objects under aspects—and why they are directed under the aspects they are (why they have the content they do)? With conscious states of mind, Searle says, their phenomenal or subjective character determines their aspectual shape. Where non-conscious states of mind are concerned, there is nothing to do the job but their relationship to consciousness. The right relationship, he holds, is this: non-conscious states of mind must be potentially conscious. If some psychological theories (of language, of vision) postulate an unconscious so deeply buried that its mental representations cannot even potentially become conscious, so much the worse for those theories.
Searle’s views have aroused a number of criticisms. (See the peer commentary in response to Searle 1990.) Among the problem areas are these. First, how are we to spell out the requirement that intrinsically intentional states be potentially conscious, without making it either too easy or to difficult to satisfy? Second, just why is it that the intrinsic intentionality of non-conscious states needs accounting for, while that of conscious states is somehow unproblematic? Third, it appears Searle’s argument does not offer some general reason to rule out all efforts to give “naturalistic” accounts of conditions sufficient to impose—without the help of consciousness—genuine and not merely interpreter relative intentionality.
One way to get around some of the problems of Searle’s account, while similarly holding that all intentionality is tied to consciousness, would be to argue that non-experiential “aboutness” can be found all too pervasively, and had all too cheaply—so that only the aboutness that experience brings should be considered “real intentionality”. This, roughly, is the view Galen Strawson (2008) proposes. He acknowledges we may try to narrow the attribution of intentionality, and avoid a trivializing Dennett-like proliferation of “intentional systems”—but without appeal to consciousness. We might, for example, propose that real intentionality depends on evolution-imposed functions to indicate. But such approaches he thinks offer us no truly principled demarcation; they end up simply dismissing legitimate counterexamples, and ultimately trade on “anthropomorphic/zoomorphic human prejudices”. However, once we recognize that “experiential qualitative character” encompasses a richly diverse range of sensory and cognitive states, we will be able to see how it also can constrain what our perceptions are of, and what our thoughts are about; only such consciousness-imposed constraints will give us a non-arbitrary “stopping place” for their of-ness or aboutness to find an object.
Kriegel’s 2011 version of Phenomenal Intentionality Theory pursues a line of thought with resemblances to both Searle’s and Strawson’s. Drawing a distinction between original and interpreter-relative intentionality, he argues consciousness is the sole locus of the former: consciousness “injects intentionality into the world”. However, unlike Searle, Kriegel has consciousness confer intentionality both on otherwise meaningless symbols and on unconscious mental or cognitive life in much the same way. What has nonexperiential intentionality gets its aboutness by being such as would be seen to have it in the experience of an “ideal interpreter”. Kriegel, in effect, takes the sort of “interpretivist” view of intentionality advocated by Dennett, while (unlike Dennett) confining it to cases where consciousness is missing. Thus it seems he should want to reject theories like Dennett’s that purport to account for consciousness in terms of intentional or representational notions that do not presuppose it. This creates a difficulty, inasmuch as Kriegel also proposes a self-representationalist account of consciousness that seems to follow that general reductive representationalist strategy. He responds to this problem by distinguishing the sort of natural (or objective) “tracking” mental representation that figures as a posit in psychological theorizing from the sort of mental representation we are familiar with from reflection on our own minds, with its susceptibility to the appearance/reality distinction. Consciousness, Kriegel argues, is what accounts for the latter.
Angela Mendelovici (2018) advances another type of “consciousness first” view. What does the crucial work in her argument is the demand that an account of mental representation attribute it in accordance with our introspective judgments about it—leading neither to a “mismatch” with this (as, she says, “tracking” accounts of visual representation do with respect to color), nor to unacceptable indeterminacies in the content assigned (which she finds are inevitable with non-tracking functional role accounts). Only an account that bases intentionality on phenomenal character can avoid these problems, she argues; and she explains how such special content “matching” challenges that theory prompts can be overcome.
There are also consciousness-based accounts of mind that do not depend on an original/derived intentionality distinction (as do Searle’s, Kriegel’s, and Mendelovici’s). Consider, for example, the argument proposed by Kirk Ludwig (1996a). He argues that consciousness is needed to rightly draw the boundaries of an individual’s mind—for there is nothing to determine whose state of mind a given non-conscious state of mind is, unless that state consists in a disposition to produce a conscious mental state of the right sort. Alleged mental processes that did not tend to produce someone’s conscious states of mind appropriately would be no one’s, which is to say that they would not be mental states at all. Roughly: consciousness provides the unity of mind without which there would be no mind. Only with consciousness do we have a suitable boundary between what’s in a mind, and what’s outside of it. And Ludwig argues that it is therefore a mistake to attribute to our minds many of the unconscious inferences with which psychological theorists have long been wont to populate the brain’s visual system.
Another approach that makes consciousness central (but without appeal to an original/derived contrast) is that of Declan Smithies 2019. For him, crucially, beliefs are essentially rationally assessable states, capable of justifying and being justified. And we can properly account for their epistemic status, he argues, only by understanding them in terms of consciousness—as dispositions to conscious judgments. For only this will yield the intuitively right verdicts regarding when someone is favorably or unfavorably assessable with respect to epistemic norms. And only this will properly cohere with a general epistemology that correctly links justification to introspectability, and introspection to consciousness. Thus, while we may conceive of beings behaviorally similar to us, but bereft of subjective experience (“zombies” of a sort), we should not suppose they would literally have person-level, rationally assessable attitudes, even if they harbored internal representations playing casual roles with respect to their behavior. Without the right sort of consciousness, they couldn’t have the introspective self-knowledge they need to be properly subject to epistemic norms, and so couldn’t literally have attitudes like beliefs.
Another way to give consciousness a starring role is suggested by Siewert 2014 who uses consideration of blindsight scenarios to argue that the only perception that will supply the mind with an understanding of type demonstratives (e.g., “this shape”) and so be capable of functioning in empirical concept acquisition, is the experiential, conscious kind. (If this shape looks no way to you at all, you will not understand by vision just which shape this shape is, and thus won’t be in a position to learn visually, e.g., this shape is a circle.) Partly on these grounds it is argued that mind requires consciousness. And given a cognitively rich view of experience, we can see how consciousness (of the right sort) will be sufficient for mind as well. Siewert’s view, like Smithies’, sets aside the original/derived contrast. But both crucially rely (as does Searle’s) on a requirement that certain facts about the mind should be discernible from the first-person point of view. Doubts about these views are likely to challenge the legitimacy of that reliance (see, e.g., Shoemaker’s 1994 criticism of Searle).
Finally, Adam Pautz (2013, 2021) argues that intentionality is based on consciousness in a way that combines an empiricist appeal to interpretation theory with a rejection of the idea that our experience of thought and understnding is inherently cognitive. Embracing a nonreductive representationalist view of the phenomenal character of perceptual experience, Pautz draws on a Lewisian theory of interpretation to argue that we can satisfactorily account for the determinacy of our mental content if (but only if) we take the phenomenal intentionality of perceptual experience as basic. Our thoughts have the content they do not because their phenomenal character is inherently conceptual, but because the best interpretation of the totality of the perceptual experience we have and are disposed to have would assign us that thought content.
9. Why It Matters
Consciousness and intentionality are inherently fascinating. But no doubt part of their interest lies in the sense that understanding them is crucial to understanding much else. And an adequate grasp of what is at stake in views about them may be lost in the abstract matrix of positions generated in this survey (“reductive restrictive reflexivist” etc.). Perhaps these views will themselves also become a little clearer if we summarize and make explicit a few of their connections with the following four broad areas of philosophical concern.
- The nature and boundaries of mind and self
- The place of consciousness and intentionality in explanation
- Forms of knowledge and justification
- Kinds and instances of value
Let’s take each of these briefly in turn. First: “the nature and boundaries of mind and self”. Here we may be interested in questions about: (a) what distinguishes minded from mindless beings; (b) what unifies the domain of the mental; (c) how far beyond the brain of a minded organism its mind (its mental content, or its mental states or processes) properly speaking extend, and what are their constituents; (d) what sorts of non-mental constraints (in constitution or organization) limit the range of minded beings; and finally (e) what constitutes a self (e.g., what is required for its existence and continuity, how this relates to the organism, and to its social and natural environment).
Topics (a) and (c)—what makes a minded being differ from a minded one, and what its properly mental content and activity extend to encompass—have evident connections with topic (b): the unity of the mental. For presumably a minded being will be one whose states have “mental content” and whose activities are properly mental or psychological in character; to decide what those contents and activities include will be to decide not only what is part of its mind, but also what puts something in the domain of the mental at all. Further, insofar as such boundaries of mind also mark boundaries of self (or person or psychological subject—however these categories are to be related)—we will find topics (a-c) closely related to topic (e)—regarding the constitution, continuity and situatedness of self.
As we have seen, disputes over the consciousness-intentionality relationship are strongly tied to all these “boundary drawing” questions. As some rough indication (and reminder) of the connections, we may note, first, that it is difficult to see how a unified conception of mind (or of its extent) can be had on strongly non-intentionalist, separatist views, which suggest a deeply bifurcated conception of the domain of the mental. Even if one does not embrace separatism, one may wish to draw the boundaries of the conscious mind much further “in” than those of the extended mind. Whichever way one goes, questions emerge about where this leaves the self. And turning back to the minded vs. mindless question—a rejection of separatism still leaves one with the prospect of a division between two rather different kinds of mind (conscious and “zombie”). Views on which no being totally lacking in consciousness would have a mind will avoid such disunity.
Questions about (d)—the potential constitution and range of realizations of mind—seem to depend partly on one’s attitude towards reductive intentionalism. This is readily joined with broadly functionalist or computationalist perspectives friendly to the idea that mind is realizable in physically very diverse entities. If indeed it is, then a confidence in reductive intentionalism should inspire confidence in the wide diversity of constitutions that artificial conscious beings can have, and similarly make us more confident of the potential to extend our own conscious existence in artifacts transcending our biological limitations. On the other hand, if we reject or are skeptical about reductive intentionalism, we lose certain these for such confidence. And if we combine this with the idea that the right kind of subjective experience is necessary and sufficient for mind, a corresponding biological conservatism about our grounds for attributing mind to highly physically diverse entities, and about our own prospects for indefinitely artificially extended futures, may seem more reasonable.
But these statements need qualification. For one thing, once the details of an acceptable reductive intentionalism about consciousness emerge, it could turn out that—as a matter of natural fact—something very like the biological organization found in ourselves and other animals is needed for its realization, so it could turn out that consciousness is not as independent of neurophysiology as functionalist theories often suggest (consider Prinz’s 2012 “neurofunctionalism”). On the other hand, one could reject reductionism of any sort about consciousness, while still arguing on independent grounds (like Chalmers 1996) that, as a matter of natural (though not metaphysical) necessity, the realization of consciousness is very loosely physically constrained. And then there are panpsychist views to consider (Strawson 2006, Goff 2017). If there is no genuinely non-mental, or at least non-phenomenal, reality to be found even in particle physics, then the whole “diversity of realization” question will have to reconfigured. Perhaps the question then will be something like: which mental or experiential properties can emerge from which others, and how?
From this sketch, we can see something of how “nature and boundaries of mind and self” questions associated with earlier canvassed issues about consciousness and intentionality gain significant interest from concerns about what (if anything) unifies the field of study that we label “the mind”—the domain of the “mental” or “psychological”—and about how we should regard the prospects for engineering new minds or radical extensions of our own.
But to limit ourselves to these remarks may be to neglect another (albeit related) dimension to the interest of these “nature and boundaries of mind and self” questions, one perhaps more evident in the phenomenological tradition—an inherent interest in understanding what sort of beings we are. If being minded (or being capable of understanding) is essential to what we are, the question of how consciousness figures in mind (or understanding) is also a question of how it figures in our nature. And, if a satisfactory philosophical conception of what sort of beings we are involves a grasp of how our consciousness reveals to us ourselves and the world, “boundary” questions about its detachability from our natural and social environments take on an additional dimension of interest. To answer them, we need also to address the themes of basic forms and reflexivity. If (as some phenomenologists’ views suggest) a pre-predicative, pre-reflective, practical understanding undetachable from the world is part of what makes us what we are, we may need to recognize the undetachability of our intentional consciousness. And if the right conception of basic forms and reflexivity sees us as essentially embodied understanders (as in Merleau-Ponty’s view), we should perhaps be suspicious of hopes or plans to keep our minds and leave our bodies behind. Further, we need to see—against this background—what kind of distinctive self-understanding reflective self-consciousness makes possible, if this is also part of what we are. We need to ask how much this sort of self-consciousness can do to detach us from social roles and practices, and what room this allows for authenticity, autonomy and self-constitution. (This brings us to issues prominent in Heidegger and Sartre—but also, in Korsgaard, and in Kantian moral psychology generally.)
Let’s now consider the second of the four areas labeled above, the “place of consciousness and intentionality in explanation.” This is intended to cover questions about what should be taken (or sought) to explain each of them, as well as about what they should be used to explain. It should be clear now roughly how a reductive intentionalist would configure these issues. Consciousness is to be explained as a form of intentionality (or mental representation) that can be characterized without primitive appeal to experiential notions (like “looking” or “appearing”)—and the facts about representation can in turn be explained without primitive appeal to intentional or representational notions. But it would be too simple to think that reductive intentionalists in no sense explain intentionality in terms of consciousness, or that non-reductive intentionalists in no sense explain consciousness in terms of intentionality. As we have seen, it is open to both to say (albeit in very different ways) that what makes for the intentionality of mind is the special kind of representation that consciousness is. And both can say (in a very different ways) that to understand how consciousness figures in mindedness, one must understand in what ways it is intentional.
What we think consciousness can account for would seem to vary with how cognitively rich we think experience is, and whether it figures in understanding generally, or in grounding a substantial “in kind” distinction between the minded and the mindless. (For instance, it is hard to see how a strongly separatist position would allow us to explain very much in terms of consciousness.) And our answers to questions about richness affect our view of how consciousness is to be explained. For example, certain inclusions and restrictions on what’s in consciousness are presupposed in reductive intentionalist theories—to question their views of how consciousness is limited is to question the explanations of it they offer.
The second “explanation” category also encompasses questions about how to see non-mental nature explaining mind. Physicalism generally seems committed to saying the former strongly necessitates the latter—and does not merely guarantee it in virtue of contingent laws. Typically this claim has been motivated by the worry that anything less than strong (“metaphysical”) necessities would leave mind a superfluous add-on, disturbingly ineffectual or epiphenomenal; our minds would not really explain our actions and their results. And that it seems would leave us with no coherent conception of our place in the world that we can live with. It is often thought that consciousness is the real sticking point here: that is what makes it hard to secure the strong form of necessitation desired, or to put to explanatory use such necessity as we have grounds to think is there. These difficulties are articulated in modal conceivability arguments (Kripke 1972; Chalmers 1996); in “knowledge” arguments (Nagel 1976; Jackson 1982); in arguments for the “explanatory gap” (Levine 2001); and in the case for a “mysterianism” about how consciousness arises (McGinn 1991). Controversies about whether we can justify the claim that the right combination of non-mental facts or properties makes it the case that mind must occur, and about whether this affords us explanations of the facts of mind, will take different forms, depending on how one conceives of the consciousness-intentionality relationship.
Here again, a separatist position would seem to accord concerns about consciousness the least general import—though one may (like Kim 2011) argue that by closing off the prospect of reductive intentionalism, separatism would have us resign ourselves to an irreducible, epiphenomenal “mental residue” of qualia. But if one is an intentionalist, then the problems of consciousness will spread to the intentionality of our minds, and will apparently cut more deeply, the richer one takes experience to be in intentionality. And if one accounts for the minded/mindless difference in terms of consciousness, then whatever metaphysical problem consciousness raises will affect the mind quite generally. Thus the stakes will evidently be higher in deciding whether we can secure the controversial “bottom-up” necessitation of consciousness, and whether securing this could secure, or is needed to secure, a place for consciousness in nature—either as explanans or explanandum. To deny that it is needed is not necessarily to foreswear the goal of scientifically explaining facts about consciousness, or to embrace the supernatural. It is just to allow that such principles as we can appeal to in explaining what sort of consciousness arises, in what circumstances, are ones we must confess might have been otherwise than they are. (But—why these principles aren’t in fact otherwise ultimately has no explanation.) The epiphenomenalist worry may then still rear its head: aren’t physicalist necessities required if experience is itself to explain anything that happens in the physical world? One’s answer will depend on just what one thinks generally needs to be the case for what happens in the physical world to receive legitimate explanations (or be produced by causes) that don’t belong to physics.
Turning now to the third category, “forms of knowledge and justification”: our questions here concern the epistemic significance of consciousness. What role does consciousness have in knowledge acquisition, in understanding, and in warranting judgments? One might argue that it has none (Lee 2014). If we cannot rule out the possibility of beings functionally like us (but physically different) that lack consciousness (this kind of “zombie”), we should arguably admit that such zombie counterparts would have minds, and then: that the consciousness-free epistemology accounting for their knowledge would have all that any epistemology really needs. In response to this, one could argue (as in Section 8) that nothing that utterly lacked consciousness would really understand anything or have a mind—so there is no “zombie epistemology”. Alternatively (or in addition) one could argue that we shouldn’t assume the epistemology of conscious beings like ourselves would be no different than the epistemology (assuming there is one) applicable to such hypothetical beings.
If pre-emptive challenges to the epistemic significance of consciousness can be met, other issues arise to which the consciousness-intentionality relationship appear relevant. To take first the question of our knowledge of our surroundings: we want to say sense perception plays a role in this. But what role is played by sensory consciousness in our account would seem to depend on how we see that as related to intentionality. As in the other cases, the potential importance of consciousness seems diminished by separatism. Thus we have the Davidsonian view that suggests subjective experience, consisting just in sensations, can play only a causal, and no justificatory role in support of perceptual judgments (Davidson 1982, 1986). Against this, we have the McDowellian argument in favor of conceptual content for sensory experience: only if it is this richly cognitive can it play the epistemic role we rightly assume it does (McDowell 1994). But this suggests difficult questions (of the sort canvassed in Section 5) about how to justify an assessment of the richness of phenomenal character.
Different views on the theme of basic forms of intentionality will face different challenges in accounting for the sources of our knowledge, or of warrant for our mundane beliefs about the things we find around us. Roughly, it might seem that in certain respects, the story of justification will be easier, the more the intentionality of sensory experience is assimilated to that of full-blown concept-applying judgment or belief—inasmuch as it seems unmysterious how beliefs justify beliefs. On the other hand, going very far in that direction can bring puzzles of its own. It seems that sense experience should be of the right sort to enable us to acquire concepts (which assumes we don’t already have them), and to support our applying concepts to things (which assumes we haven’t already done so). But it may seem harder to maintain these assumptions, if we make sensory experience itself a kind of judgment or belief (see the discussion in Siegel and Silins 2015).
Treatments of detachability may also have epistemic implications. Some (e.g., John Campbell 2002) have argued that we can’t do justice to the role of sense experience in providing knowledge of the particulars in our surroundings, unless we regard the experience (and even its subjective character) as essentially “object-dependent”. On the other hand, one may wonder if one can do justice to the subjectivity of experience, its perspectival and error-prone nature, while maintaining some form of object-dependence. Consideration of Husserl’s and Merleau-Ponty’s views on perceptual experience, and discussion of contemporary disjunctivism’s treatment of illusion and hallucination, engages with this aspect of the epistemic significance of consciousness.
How one sees the relationship of consciousness to intentionality will also shape what account one can give of “introspective” self-knowledge. That is, it will bear on our accounts of how we know or have warrant for judgments about our own states of mind. One will likely think the difference between what is conscious and what isn’t makes some difference to what one can know of one’s own mind in a distinctively first-person way. Roughly, what’s conscious would seem to be more directly knowable introspectively. But holding either a separatist or strongly restrictivist view would appear to limit the role consciousness can play in one’s account of self-knowledge. For example, Carruthers’ view of phenomenal consciousness restricts it almost entirely to nonconceptual sensory states and patterns of imagery, and correspondingly limits distinctively first-personal self-knowledge: beyond these confines of consciousness, your epistemic relation to your mental life—to how and what you are thinking, for example—is held to be basically the same as it is to another’s (Carruthers 2011). Alternatively, one might think that your knowledge of your own thoughts is also fundamentally and distinctively first-personal—but in a very different (perhaps “rationalist”) way than knowledge of your own sense experience and imagery: knowing one’s own mind comes in two quite different varieties (Moran 2001; Boyle 2009). However, assuming an inclusive conception of experience, it will be more open to maintain that consciousness accounts in a partly similar way for self-knowledge, regardless of whether it is one’s own sensing or thinking that is known.
Clearly too, understanding the relationship of consciousness to self-consciousness with respect to the reflexivity theme will play an important role in determining what to say about self-knowledge. For instance, proponents of higher-order thought or inner sense theories of consciousness will have different strategies available in accounting for the special self-knowledge consciousness affords (and face different challenges) than those who reject these accounts. For example, obviously, one cannot offer an inner sense account of self-knowledge if one thinks there is no inner sense. And if one does believe in inner sense, special questions arise about how to account for the possibility of introspective error and self-correction. Also, even if one distinguishes consciousness from state self-consciousness, one may think that consciousness makes possible a form of self-consciousness—a first-person form of reflection—with distinctive epistemic properties (as, e.g., in Gertler 2012a; Siewert 2012). We might note further that having a rich conception of consciousness, and putting this to work in a unified and comprehensive account of introspective self-knowledge fits naturally into an “internalist” view of justification: if, as an internalist, you think that what justifies your judgments needs to be appropriately available to you, a consciousness-based conception of self-knowledge may seem tailor-made to tell us what “appropriate availability” comes to here. (See Smithies 2019.)
Finally, a few words about the fourth topic mentioned above: how our views of consciousness and intentionality might affect the kind of value we recognize. What kind of value do we see in experience? It will not be unusual to think it has for us a non-instrumental (and in that sense “intrinsic”) value. One way to make this explicit: consider what goods you think your own experience brings you, which you could conceive of getting without it—in an experience-less, “zombified” state. Would you still much rather have experience than not, even on the condition that without it, all the goods you think it provides that could be had without it, were in fact available? An answer “yes” seems to indicate you accord conscious experiences some kind of non-instrumental value. Another question: do you think something very bad has happened if your own or another person’s existence is terminated, even if you (or they) are replaced with an exact duplicate? If you say yes, does the badness of such an extinction-plus-replacement scenario remain, presuming that prior to it, the person’s consciousness has already been totally and permanently extinguished? Suppose you say no—the truly terrible part to this story comes at the stage where one is utterly and forever “zombified”; after that, nothing of significant non-instrumental value remains to be destroyed by the envisaged replacement. This suggests that for you the kind of irreplaceable value you accord particular persons is essentially tied to the non-instrumental value experience has for you (Siewert 1998, 2014, 2021). Intuitive responses to such scenarios appear to bring to the surface convictions about the kind of non-instrumental value consciousness has (and conscious beings have) for us. But how should we relate this to our views about consciousness and intentionality?
It seems open still to hold to the value-revealing responses just imagined, even if one divorces consciousness from intentionality, or maintains that experience lacks the kind of cognitive richness involved in conceptual understanding. However, it would then appear that the value you accord consciousness would be importantly detached from whatever non-instrumental value you accord the exercise of understanding. And questions would arise about how, on such a view, there could be a valuable pleasure in that exercise, and about how one could continue to tie the irreplaceable value of persons to consciousness. In general, giving high intrinsic value to consciousness and reserving the irreplaceable value of persons for conscious beings will likely seem easier, the richer one takes experience to be.
But even then we may wonder whether, if consciousness—no matter how rich—is strictly inessential to mindedness, we should really care about it so much. On the view proposed by Neil Levy (2014), it is assumed that zombies could have minds possessed of rational understanding, desires and interests—and so their well-being would count in considerations of value no less or differently than that of conscious beings. Thus he maintains (by a reasoning that parallels Lee’s epistemological deflation of consciousness): even in our own case (phenomenal) consciousness is incidental to value. But again, one may contest the assumption of zombie minds. And even if one does not, it may well seem that, when it comes to entities that can have no subjective experience of frustration or satisfaction, it should not much matter to us whether they get what they are alleged to want, except insofar as we happen independently to want it ourselves.
There is surely much more to say about how views of the consciousness-intentionality relationship bear on large questions about mind, self, explanation, knowledge and value. But what has just been said hopefully brings out some prominent features of the philosophical landscape.
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