Notes to Seventeenth-Century Theories of Consciousness

1. Descartes expresses these claims fairly explicitly. In the Fourth Set of Replies, he claims that there are no thoughts of which we are unconscious (CSM II 171 / AT VII 246), which endorses the first half of the transparency thesis. The second half is made explicit in the Second Medition where Descartes argues that while the sensory perceptions he feels can be doubted, he goes on to say that “I seem to see, to hear, and to be warmed. This cannot be false” (CSM II 19 / AT VII 29). But, although he says these things rather clearly, there is much debate over just how strong of a thesis Descartes is committed to. See Wilson 1978; Radner 1988; and McRae 1972.

2. This thesis is developed at great length in the wax argument of Mediation 2, where he argues that any knowledge of a material object will necessarily bring with it knowledge of oneself.

3. The intentionality of thought is important to Descartes's purposes when assessing whether my thoughts, which come to me as if representing something, truly do in fact represent those objects to me. However, there is some question among scholars about the extension of the intentionality thesis. In particular, there is some question about whether Descartes believes that sensations have any representational content. But recently Simmons 1999 and De Rosa 2010 have argued that even sensations have representational content for Descartes.

4. Of course, the regress would threaten only if one grants a sufficiently strong version of the transparency thesis.

5.As noted above (see note 3), there is some dispute over whether Descartes believed that there were non-intentional thoughts. If so, then not all conscious thoughts have intentionality for Descartes, and intentionality would be conceptually posterior to consciousness. But one could make a case for the conceptual priority of consciousness, even in Descartes, whether or not Descartes ultimately believed that there were any conscious thoughts that lacked intentionality. The main line of evidence for this reading of Descartes are the texts above—if it's conceptually possible to doubt that our conscious thoughts do in fact represent anything, and if thought is defined in terms of consciousness, then it seems that consciousness will be the more fundamental concept.

6. There were other Cartesians working out just what is entailed by the intentionality of thought. The Cartesian that takes the intentionality aspect of thought the farthest is Robert Desgabets. Desgabets was prepared to infer from the thought that P to the existence of P on the basis of the intentionality of thought. Call this the Intentionality Principle.

For Desgabets, “the act by which we know an object terminates immediately and directly in the object itself, and not in the idea” (Desgabets II, 220, quoted by Cook, 191n9). The intentionality of a thought comes about because there is an actual relation holding between the thought and its object. If this is right, then we can infer from “S thinks that P” to the existence of P.

Of course, given this strong account of intentionality, Desgabets must have an account of what is going on when we think of non-existent objects (such as a chimera) or impossible objects (such as a round square). The account is complicated, but the end result is that by having an idea with extension as its object, one can infer the existence of extension as such. So, we can dispense with the early Meditations of Descartes and start with the examination of the contents of our thought. (See Cook 2002 and Schmaltz 2002, ch. 3, for more on this.)

7. Jonathan Bennett claims that Spinoza “urgently needs a theory of awareness, and unfortunately the Ethics does not contain one” (Bennett 189). And Margaret Wilson says that Spinoza “is unable to provide within his system a satisfactory conception of the human mind's consciously representing external bodies” (Wilson 1999b, 133). Jon Miller adds that “the prospects for a robust and coherent Spinozistic theory of consciousness [are] dim” (Miller 203).

8. All quotations from Spinoza's Ethics are from The Collected Works of Spinoza, transl. E. Curley.

9. The complete list of explicit use of the term conscientia (in its various forms) is rather short: 1Appendix; 2p35s; 3p2s; 3p9, d, and 2; 3p30d; 3def.aff1; 4Preface; 4p8 and d; 4p19d; 4p64d; 4Appendix32; 5p31s; 5p34s; 5p39s; 5p42s. Curley translates inscius as “unconscious” in 5p6s, which is warranted by the parallel use of the concept, using conscientia in 5p35s. Balibar provides a similar list in Balibar 40n1 but includes the following references to “conscientiae morae,” which Curley translates as “remorse”: 3p18s2, 3def.aff17, 4p47s.

10. For more discussion of the moral aspects of Spinoza's account of consciousness, see Balibar 1992. Balibar focuses on the shift in the content of consciousness from Part 3 to Part 5 and distinguishes two kinds of consciousness in Spinoza. It's not clear to me that this is the case. While the content may change, the nature of consciousness may remain constant.

11. However, if one is going to endorse the interpretation that Spinoza allows that all minds are conscious to some degree or another, then they may have another opening for the ideae idearum interpretation. Rice argues that Spinoza's theory of “ideas of ideas” does entail that consciousness comes in degrees (Rice 208).

12. Elsewhere Locke defines consciousness as “the perception of what passes in a Man's own mind” (2.1.19).

13. It is noteworthy that the objections, whether discussing the Cartesians, Spinoza, Leibniz, or Locke, often come down to one of the following:

  1. If reflection of a sort may be attributed to consciousness, it should not be understood as a distinct second-order perception.
  2. If a higher order interpretation is adopted by philosopher x, then it runs counter to other more basic metaphysical principles of philosopher x.
  3. A higher-order account (given other commitments) results in a vicious regress or is “absurdly excessive.”

14. Kulstad goes on to narrow the question further: is consciousness of our own mental operations the same thing as consciousness? To this he says that “no consistent and definitive stand is taken one way or the other” (115), but that is because Locke has competing philosophical commitments that force him one way and then the other. See Kulstad 91–115.

15. As one example of Leibniz's recognition that his is a “natural” account, see RB 58, where he charges the Scholastics with “unreasonably abandoning nature” by allowing “a leap from one state [of the soul] to an infinitely different one [which] cannot be natural.”

16. There is a more complicated story about how perceptual distinctness relates to a distinct concept, as described by Leibniz in “Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas,” AG 23–27. For more on this, see Brandom 1981 and Wilson 1999a. For more on the interpretation of perceptual distinctness offered here, see Simmons 2001 and Jorgensen 2009.

17. One further note: Leibniz's discussion of memory in this passage and in others in the New Essays suggests another possible version of the higher-order interpretation in terms of memory rather than reflection. For more on this see Jorgensen 2011a.

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Larry M. Jorgensen <>

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