Ceteris Paribus Laws
Laws of nature take center stage in philosophy of science. Laws are usually believed to stand in a tight conceptual relation to many important key concepts such as causation, explanation, confirmation, determinism, counterfactuals etc. Traditionally, philosophers of science have focused on physical laws, which were taken to be at least true, universal statements that support counterfactual claims. But, although this claim about laws might be true with respect to physics, laws in the special sciences (such as biology, psychology, economics etc.) appear to have—maybe not surprisingly—different features than the laws of physics. Special science laws—for instance, the economic law “Under the condition of perfect competition, an increase of demand of a commodity leads to an increase of price, given that the quantity of the supplied commodity remains constant” and, in biology, Mendel's Laws—are usually taken to “have exceptions”, to be “non-universal” or “to be ceteris paribus laws”. How and whether the laws of physics and the laws of the special sciences differ is one of the crucial questions motivating the debate on ceteris paribus laws. Another major, controversial question concerns the determination of the precise meaning of “ceteris paribus”. Philosophers have attempted to explicate the meaning of ceteris paribus clauses in different ways. The question of meaning is connected to the problem of empirical content, i.e., the question whether ceteris paribus laws have non-trivial and empirically testable content. Since many philosophers have argued that ceteris paribus laws lack empirically testable content, this problem constitutes a major challenge to a theory of ceteris paribus laws.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. History and Background
- 3. A Framework for the Discussion: Distinguishing exclusive/ comparative and definite/indefinite ceteris paribus laws
- 4. The Challenge: Exclusive Ceteris Paribus Laws Between Falsity and Triviality
- 5. Exclusive CP-laws: The Method of Completers
- 6. Invariance & Stability Theories
- 7. Dispositional Accounts
- 8. Normality Theories
- 9. Prima Facie Reasons and Ceteris Paribus Conditions in Ethics and Epistemology
- 10. Ceteris Paribus Laws: Metaphysics, Language, and Science
- 11. Conclusion
- 12. Suggested Reading
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In philosophy of science, laws of nature occupy centre stage: Many explications of important key concepts in philosophy of science essentially rely on laws of nature. For instance, a majority of theories of causation, explanation, confirmation, determinism, counterfactuals etc. presuppose laws of nature.
Until the second half of the 20th century, certain characteristics of laws of nature were taken for granted by philosophers of science: Laws of nature were taken to be true, logically contingent, universal statements that support counterfactual claims. Laws were taken to play a major role in explanation, induction, confirmation, causation etc. The paradigm cases for such laws were taken from (fundamental) physics. Newton's second law (F=ma) or the Schrödinger-equation fit the bill of the traditional concept of law. Philosophers of science were aware of the fact that there are hardly any universal laws of this kind in biology, psychology, economics or other special sciences. This posed no problem as long as there was a consensus that this might be conceived as a shortcoming of the special sciences. However, with the success especially of the biological sciences it became clear that there is genuine scientific knowledge that does not conform to the paradigm of physics. As a consequence, scientific practice in the special sciences was no longer taken to be deficient but was analyzed as a legitimate practice different from physics. One important way in which the special sciences seem to differ from fundamental physics concerns the generalizations in biology, in psychology, economics etc. In order to illustrate this observation, here are some examples of generalizations that play an explanatory role in various special sciences:
Snell's Law: “At the interface between dielectric media, there is (also) a refracted ray in the second medium lying in the plane of incidence, making an angle qt, with the normal and obeying Snell's law:
sin q/sin qt = n2/n1
where n1 and n2 are the velocities of propagation in the two media and n1=(n1/c), n2=(n2/c) are the indices of refraction.” (Cartwright 1983, 47)
The lack of vitamin C causes scurvy.
Mendel's Law of Segregation: “In a parent, the alleles for each character separate in the production of gametes, so that only one is transmitted to each individual in the next generation.” (Rosenberg & McShea 2008, 36)
The Area Law in Island-Biogeography: “the equilibrium number S of a species of a given taxonomic group on an island (as far as creatures are concerned) increases [polynomially] with the islands area [A]: S = c×Az. The (positive-valued) constants c and z are specific to the taxonomic group and island group.” (Lange 2000, 235f; Lange 2002, 416f.)
People's actions are goal-oriented, in the sense that if person x wants A and believes B to be an optimal means for achieving A, then x will attempt to do B (Fodor 1987; Dray 1957, 132ff).
The Law of Demand: Under the condition of perfect competition, an increase of demand of a commodity leads to an increase of price, given that the quantity of the supply of the commodity remains constant (Roberts 2004, 159; Kincaid 2004, 177).
The lack of social integration results in a higher probability of attempted suicides.
While these generalizations may be explained in terms of lower level sciences, this is not our focus here. What is important here is that all of these generalizations are non-universal. That is, there are (actual and merely possible) situations in which the above generalizations do not hold, although all the conditions obtain that are explicitly stated in the antecedent of the generalization. In other words, there are situations in which the following is the case: at the interface between dielectric media, there is a refracted ray in the second medium lying in the plane of incidence, making an angle qt, with the normal and this ray does not obey the equation sin q/sin qt = n2/n1, the lack of vitamin C does not cause scurvy, the alleles separate differently than Mendel's law of Segregation describes, the equilibrium number of a species does not increase in accord with the Area Law, people fail to act in a goal-oriented fashion, an increase of demand of a commodity does not lead to an increase of price (even if the condition of perfect competition were realized), etc.
However, even though the generalizations are non-universal they do play a role in explanations and predictions, they may be used for purposes of manipulation and they support counterfactuals.
The question arises how to deal with this situation. Are these generalizations to be classified as laws—laws that pertain only to special conditions, i.e., ceteris paribus laws—or are they something entirely different. Given the fact that laws play a major role in most accounts of explanation, causation etc., there seem to be basically three options:
- These generalizations do not qualify as laws, because they are non-universal. Therefore there are no genuine explanations in those areas of science that rely of these generalizations, most notably in the special sciences.
- These generalizations do not qualify as laws, because they are non-universal. However, explanation, causation etc. does not presuppose the existence of universal laws.
- These generalizations do qualify as laws, despite the fact that they are non-universal, because they have important features in common with universal laws, most importantly the support of counterfactuals.
The difference between options (b) and (c) may be to some extent merely terminological. Hitchcock and Woodward, for example, who replace talk of laws by their account of ‘invariant generalizations’ (see section 6.2) admit, that their account maybe read as a reconceptualization of lawhood. (Woodward and Hitchcock 2003, 3)
The motivation of those who take option (c) and stick to the concept of law is that the generalizations cited above have enough in common with Newton's first law or the Schrödinger-equation to classify them as laws. They play the same kind of role in explanation, prediction, they support counterfactuals etc. There are two beneficial consequences of this particular approach. First (against option (a)), it need not be denied that there are genuine explanations etc in the special sciences. Second (against option (b)), in analogy to the traditional view, the concept of a law (albeit of a non-universal or ceteris paribus law) can be used in explications of notions such as explanation, causation etc.
The main problem for those who choose option (c) is that they have to spell out what is meant by a non-universal law (statement) and why it can perform similar explanatory and predictive tasks as a universal law. A convenient way to reconstruct the debate on option (c) is to understand non-universal laws as statements that are qualified by a ceteris paribus (henceforth, “cp”) clause. Yet, how to understand the meaning of the cp-clause is an open question that is answered differently by various philosophers..
Before we discuss various accounts of cp-laws, several issues surrounding the notion of “ceteris paribus” should be distinguished in order to structure the debate:
- How can different kinds of cp-laws be distinguished and classified? Are there criteria to distinguish genuine cp-laws from strict laws? How and whether the laws of (fundamental) physics and the laws of the special sciences differ is one of the crucial questions motivating the debate on ceteris paribus laws. (see section 3).
- Are there any genuine cp-laws at all? (see sections 4–5). Some authors deny that that there are any genuine cp-laws at all. (Cf. Schiffer 1991, Earman and Roberts 1999, Earman, Roberts and Smith 2002, Woodward 2002.) While most of these authors agree that there are sentences that may be reconstructed as containing (implicit) cp-clauses, they claim that these sentences lack a clear meaning, cannot be tested, and therefore do not qualify as laws. Moreover, the complaint continues, on most accounts of reconstructing non-strict generalization as cp-statements the latter fall short of capturing those generalizations that people antecedently took to be paradigmatic cases while classifying generalizations as cp-laws that appear to be clear counterexamples.
However, if there are cp-laws further questions arise:
- In what disciplines do we find cp-laws? (see sections 6–7) Are the cp-laws confined to the special sciences or are there cp-laws all the way down to physics?
- What different kinds of cp-laws are used in the sciences? It seems that in the literature two very different kinds of situations are envisaged. On the one hand several authors (comprising Mill, Marshall, Cartwright, Pietroski and Rey, Hüttemann, Lipton) stress that cp-laws describe the behavior of systems under ideal or abstract conditions. Such conditions are—if at all —only rarely realized (see section 7). On the other hand there are authors who claim that, at least in certain disciplines, cp-conditions are nothing but normal conditions, or cp-laws are laws expressing normality hypotheses (see section 8).
- What are the truth conditions of cp-law statements? Philosophers have attempted to determine the meaning of cp-clauses in different ways. The question of meaning is connected to the problem of empirical content, i.e., the question whether ceteris paribus laws have non-trivial and empirically testable content. Since many philosophers have argued that cp-laws lack empirically testable content (i.e., those philosophers deny that law statements are contingent), this problem constitutes a major challenge to a theory of ceteris paribus laws. Formally independent but methodologically related is the question under what conditions it is epistemically legitimate to accept cp-laws. (see sections 3–5).
Having distinguished these issues, it should have become obvious that the debate on cp-clauses and cp-laws does not exist. Instead, theories of “cp” engage in different and often separable enterprises.
Section 2 gives on the one hand an account of the explicit use of cp-clauses (mainly) in the literature on economic issues from scholasticism to modern economics (Section 2.1.). On the other hand we sketch two problems in philosophy of science and philosophy of mind that explain why the issue of cp-laws became an intensely discussed issue since the 1980s (Section 2.2,).
Section 3 distinguishes different readings of the cp-clause and a fortiori different kinds of cp-laws. In Section 3.1, most importantly, exclusive cp-laws (factors not mentioned in the antecedent of the law are assumed to be absent) are distinguished from comparative cp-laws (factors not mentioned in the antecedent of the law are assumed to be constant). In line with most of the literature we focus on exclusive cp-laws. In Section 3.2, a distinction between definite and indefinite cp-laws is presented.
Section 4 presents the main challenge to cp-laws. It appears that many laws, e.g., of the special sciences, if taken as strict laws, turn out to be false; however, if they are hedged by a cp-clause they appear to lack a clear meaning and appear to be empirically untestable. All of the major accounts of cp-laws discussed in section 5 to 8 are reactions to this challenge.
Section 5 deals with the most influential early accounts of cp-laws. They take cp-laws to be incomplete laws that can be completed. Whereas Fodor and others (see Section 5.1) focus on special science cp-laws that can be completed by adding factors to the antecedent of the law that are dealt with in more fundamental sciences, Pietroski and Rey take cp-laws to contain (implicit) promises: that is, when asserting a cp-law, one promises to be able to be able to cite factors that complete the law on a case by case basis if the consequent of the cp-law does not obtain (although the antecedent does). In section 5.2, we present several objections against completer accounts.
Section 6 presents two brands of stability theories of laws in the special sciences (i.e., Lange's stability theory in Section 6.1, and Woodward and Hitchcock's invariance theory in Section 6.2). The common general idea of invariance or stability theories of laws consists in the claim that a cp-law statement is an ‘if-then’ assertion which holds true for different if-conditions which are also called antecedent conditions or initial conditions (according to this view, ceteris paribus or non-universal laws differ from universal laws in degree, not in kind: universal laws hold for all if-conditions while ceteris paribus or non-universal merely hold for a limited range of if-conditions).
Section 7 deals with the dispositional account of cp-laws. According to this account a law is true provided the type of system in question has the disposition that the law statement attributes to the system. Reconstructing law-statements as statements about dispositions, tendencies, capacities, etc. rather than about overt behavior turns cp-laws into strict laws.
Section 8 deals with normality theories of laws. The common general idea of normality theories consists in saying that “cp, all As are Bs” means that normally As are Bs. The various normality accounts differ in their explication of the notion of normality (e.g., Schurz interprets normality as a high conditional, objective probability of the consequent of the law statement given the antecedent, see Section 8.1; alternatively, Spohn suggests to explicate the normality conditions in terms of degrees of belief and ranking functions over possible worlds, see Section 8.2)
Section 9 sketches the relevance of cp-laws in other areas of philosophy (such as epistemology and ethics).
Section 10 is a survey to recent work on cp-laws in metaphysics, philosophy of language and linguistics as well as in other sciences.
Section 11 presents a short conclusion and an outlook for future research.
The Latin phrase “ceteris paribus” or “caeteris paribus”—literally meaning “other things being equal”— was used in a non-technical sense by Cicero. However, most of the early uses of the ceteris paribus-clause are found in economics. In economic contexts the use of ceteris paribus clauses can be traced back to Petrus Olivi in 1295. In the 16th century, Juan de Medina and Luis de Molina used “ceteris paribus” while discussing economic issues.
In 1662, William Petty was probably the first to use the term in an English language publication. In his Treatise of Taxes and Contributions, Petty qualifies his labor theory of value by a “caeteris paribus” clause:
If a man can bring to London an ounce of Silver out of the Earth in Peru, in the same time that he can produce a bushel of Corn, then one is the natural price of the other; now if by reason of new and more easier Mines a man can get two ounces of Silver as easily as formerly he did one, then Corn will be as cheap at ten shillings the bushel, as it was before at five shillings caeteris paribus. (Petty 1662, 50, our emphasis)
John Stuart Mill used the explicit phrase “ceteris paribus” only occasionally but it had an important impact because he characterized economy by its way of coping with disturbing factors:
Political economy considers mankind as solely occupied in acquiring and consuming wealth […] not that any political economist was ever so absurd as to suppose that mankind is really thus constituted […] when a concurrence of causes produces an effect, these causes have to be studied one at a time, and their laws separately investigated […] since the law of the effect is compounded of the laws of all the causes which determine it. (Mill 1843, VI.9.3)
Since economy is thus concerned with one cause only, its laws describe what would happen provided there are no other causal factors.
The view of cp-laws promoted by Mill is the absence-of-disturbing-factors view (see Section 7). Another view is the normal-tendency view of cp-laws (see Section 8). The historical roots of the view are, for example, found in John Elliot Cairnes's description of the methodology of economics in his Character and Logical Method of Political Economy:
The doctrines of political economy are to be understood as asserting, not what will take place, but what would or what tends to take place, in this sense only they are true. (Cairnes 1888, 69)
Cairnes uses the expression “ceteris paribus” in order to refer to “what would or what tends to take place” if normal conditions obtained (Cairnes 1888, 103).
The use of ceteris paribus clauses was advocated and popularized by Alfred Marshall in the late 19th century. It was Marshall's genuine contribution to economics to advocate partial equilibrium analysis. Marshall claimed that an analysis of this kind holds merely ‘ceteris paribus’. In his influential Principles of Economics, Marshall defines the task of economists in terms of the phrase ‘ceteris paribus’:
[Economists answer] a complex question, studying one bit at a time, and at last combining his partial solutions into a more or less complete solution of the whole riddle. In breaking it up, he segregates those disturbing causes, whose wanderings happen to be inconvenient, for the time in a pound called Caeteris Paribus. (Marshall 1890, 366)
In the introduction to the same work, Marshall explains why economics is interested in the isolation of causes by assuming that other things are equal:
The forces to be dealt with (in economics) are, however so numerous, that it is best to take a few at a time; and to work out a number of partial solutions as auxiliaries to our main study. Thus we begin by isolating the primary relations of supply, demand and price in regard to a particular commodity. We reduce to inaction all other forces by the phrase ‘other things being equal’: We do not suppose that they are inert, but for the time we ignore their activity. This scientific device is a great deal older than science: it is the method by which, consciously or unconsciously, sensible men have dealt immemorial with every difficult problem of ordinary life. (Marshall 1890, xiii, our emphasis)
In a similar vein, Lionel Robbins claims in his classic paper An Essay on the Nature and Significance of Economic Science that economic laws and antecedent facts deductively imply economic predictions, but only if other things remain unchanged.
The use “ceteris paribus” in economics and in philosophy of economics is not of merely historiographical interest. In current philosophy of economics and economics, the use of and the debate on “ceteris paribus” is a vital issue:
- Philosophy of Economics. In the debate on philosophy of economics it is widely recognized that generalizations in economics are qualified by a ceteris paribus clause—yet, its interpretation is controversial. (Cf. Hutchison 1938, 40–46; Blaug 1997, 335, 696; Blaug 1992, 59–62; Cartwright 1989, 161–164; Cartwright 1999, 137–139, 147f; Hausman 1992, chapter 8; Rosenberg 1992, 113f; Kincaid 1996, 63–83; Kincaid 2004; Kincaid & Ross 2009, 5–8; Roberts 2004; Schlicht 1985; cf. also the contributions by Rosenberg and Hausman in Kincaid & Ross 2009; cf. also Weber 1906, 128f; Marx 1867, 12, 1894, 839).
- Economics. Economists themselves use the ceteris paribus clause. Expression such as “ceteris paribus” and “other things being equal” are commonly used in textbooks—often they are explicated in a special section (Cf. Friedman 1953/2008, 154–159; Kaufer 1997; Keynes 1891, 218, 233, a case study is to be found on pp. 235f; Krugman & Wells 2009, 21, 271f; Mankiw 1998, 66; Mas-Colell, Whinston & Green 1995; Persky 1990; Samuelson 1955, 9f; Samuelson 1958, 8; Samuelson & Nordhaus 1958, 7f, 67f; Schumpeter 1954, 34f; Varian 1992; Whitaker 2008; Woolridge 2009, 12f).
Outside the economics literature the use of theceteris paribus phrase became a central and also controversial issue in some areas of philosophy of science and in philosophy of mind in the 1980s.
The fact that test procedures for scientific theories or hypotheses are reliable only if disturbing factors are excluded or at least controlled for had already been noted by Carnap (1956, 69). In their paper of (1961) Canfield and Lehrer have pointed out that in order to figure as premises of deductive-nomological explanations, the laws of physics have to be furnished with cp-clauses. They provide the following example for their claim:
Letting ‘Tx’ mean ‘x is a thread’; ‘Wx’ mean the complex statement ‘x is loaded with a weight exceeding that which characterizes its tensile strength’; and ‘Bx’ mean ‘x breaks’ we write the inference schema:
(I) a) L(Tx&Wx, Bx) b) Tx&Wx c) Bx
where the function L(Tx&Wx, Bx) indicates that there is a lawlike connection between the conjunction ‘Tx&Wx’ and ‘Bx’ but leaves the nature of the connection unspecified. (Canfield & Lehrer 1961, 205)
The envisaged prediction (‘Bx’) no longer holds if a magnet neutralizes the effect of the weight (‘Mx’). This can be taken account of if the absence of the magnet is explicitly mentioned in the law. The problem is that the law must be complete with respect to all such factors that might prevent the breaking of the thread. The completeness condition requires that there are no further disturbing factors—i.e., it requires an exclusive cp-clause (see section 3) Canfield and Lehrer also present an argument for why these cp-clauses cannot be defined away (any such attempt leads to an infinite regress of further cp-clauses).
The issue of disturbing factors was taken up in 1970 by Lakatos who raised it as a problem for the falsificationist methodology:
Some scientific theories forbid an event occurring […] only on the condition that no other factor […] has any influence on it. […] Another way of putting this is to say that some scientific theories are normally interpreted as containing a ceteris paribus clause (Lakatos 1970, 101).
Popper only briefly commented on this claim in a footnote (Popper 1974, 1186f), while other authors discussed it explicitly as a problem for falsificationism (for instance, Johansen 1980).
Hempel argues in his 1988 paper “On Provisos” that every inferential construal of scientific theory testing is confronted with the problem that a proviso always has to be added:
A proviso has to be conceived as a clause which pertains to some particular application of a given theory and which asserts that in the case at hand, no effective factors are present other than those explicitly taken into account. (Hempel 1988, 154)
In fact, Hempel dismisses the phrase “ceteris paribus” as not particularly helpful.
Carnap, Lakatos and Hempel all argue that in theory testing we usually implicitly assume an additional premise that states that there are no disturbing factors. Even though in the later literature Hempel's paper has been taken to be evidence for the existence of cp-laws even in fundamental physics, the issue of whether a cp-clause has to be added as an extra premise in theory testing has to be distinguished from the claim that the laws themselves should be read as containing an implict cp-clause (for a criticism of this conflation cf. Earman and Roberts 1999, 442ff.; Schrenk 2007a, 25–36; Eliot 2011).
Two further developments lead to the explicit discussion of cp-laws.
First, in her paper “The Truth doesn't explain much” (reprinted in Cartwright 1983), Nancy Cartwright criticizes the DN-model of explanation on the grounds that the alleged laws on which the explanation relies (according to the DN-model) are not true, but rather generalizations that hold under special, typically ideal, conditions. These cp-laws, she claims, will not do the work required:
Ceteris paribus generalizations, read literally without the ‘ceteris paribus’ modifier, are false. They are not only false, but held by us to be false; and there is no ground in the covering law picture for false laws to explain anything. On the other hand, with the modifier the ceteris paribus generalizations may be true, but they cover only those few cases where the conditions are right. (Cartwright 1983, 45)
Cartwright illustrates her claim by Snell's law:
At the interface between dielectric media, there is (also) a refracted ray in the second medium lying in the plane of incidence, making an angle qt, with the normal and obeying Snell's law:sin q/sin qt = n2/n1
where n1 and n2 are the velocities of propagation in the two media and n1=(n1/c), n2=(n2/c) are the indices of refraction. (Cartwright 1983, 47)
Snell's law is false if read as a universal generalization because, among other things, it is true only with respect to isotropic media.
Cartwright explicitly calls Snell's law a cp-law. Many laws we take to be strict universal laws are in fact cp-laws that hold for special circumstances. According to Cartwright the problem arises that these laws cover only special or ideal conditions (most media are anisotropic), whereas in scientific practice they are used to explain phenomena in non-ideal situations as well. Cp-laws seem to play an essential role in explanations but there is no account available of how cp-laws can do this work.
Secondly and somewhat independently, the issue of cp-laws achieved some importance in the philosophy of mind as well. Davidson argued for his anomalous monism on the basis of a stark contrast between homonomic and heteronomic generalizations. Homonomic generalizations are those that can be improved in the same vocabulary, in which they are stated. This requires, as Davidson puts it, a comprehensive closed system that is only provided by physics. Outside physics we have only heteronomic generalizations, i.e., generalizations that can be made precise only by drawing on the vocabulary of another science. As a consequence, Davidson assumes that only physics has laws, whereas there cannot be psycho-physical or psychological laws. More generally Davidson's argument implies that there are no special science laws (Davidson 1963, 219).
This claim provoked discussions about whether there are genuine psychological laws (Fodor 1973, Fodor 1987, Fodor 1991, Kim 1985, LePore and Loewer 1987, LePore & Loewer 1989, Carrier 1998). Some authors, for example Schiffer (1991) and Earman, Roberts and Smith (2002), have even argued that no special science (from biology upwards) has genuine laws of its own. In contrast, most authors have supported only the weaker claim that there are no strict special science laws, but have argued that special science laws should be construed as laws that contain implicit cp-clauses.
Fodor (1987) observes that we do use psychological generalizations (in later papers (e.g., Fodor 1991) he uses ‘law’ instead of ‘generalization’) for predicting and explaining human behavior. These generalizations or laws, says Fodor, are non-strict—they are hedged by a cp-clause. Nevertheless, these claims, he insisted are neither false nor uninformative.
It is, I expect, a long story, how the generalizations of the special sciences manage to be both hedged and informative […]. Telling that story is part of making clear why we have the special sciences at all; why we don't just have basic physics. (Fodor 1987, 5)
So, by the end of the 1980s cp-laws had moved into the focus of two important debates: first, the structure of scientific explanations in general and, second, the status of the special sciences as autonomous scientific disciplines.
3. A Framework for the Discussion: Distinguishing exclusive/ comparative and definite/indefinite ceteris paribus laws
It has been argued that “ceteris paribus” is an ambiguous notion. Two distinctions will help to disambiguate the notion: the distinction between comparative and exclusive cp-laws (section 2.1), and the distinction between definite and indefinite cp-laws (section 2.2).
Schurz (2002) suggests distinguishing between two conceptions of cp-law: comparative versus exclusive. Comparative cp-laws require that factors not mentioned in the antecedent or the consequent the law remain unchanged. In contrast, exclusive cp laws assert the connection between antecedent and consequent only under the condition that certain factors are excluded.
The comparative sense of cp-clauses derives from the literal meaning of “ceteris paribus” as “the others being equal”. A comparative cp-law asserts that the increase (or decrease) of the value of a ‘variable’ X leads to an increase (or decrease) of the value of another variable, say Y, provided that all other (possibly unknown) X-independent variables Z1,…,Zn that describe the states of the considered system (or at least those X-independent variables that are potentially interfering) remain at same values. Thereby, a variable (Zi) is called X-independent iff it is not causally (or nomologically) influenced by X. So, to repeat, that a variable Z is X-independent means (by the above definition) only that it is not caused by X; though it may well be a cause of X (see Schurz 2014 for a novel distinction between ceteris paribus and ceteris rectis laws).
The reason why cp-laws of this type are called “comparative” in Schurz (2002) is that the requirement that the other X-independent variables Z1,…,Zn ‘are equal’, or remain at the same values, makes only sense if the law compares two states of a described (kind of) system. These two system differ in the value of the antecedent variable X, but agree in their values of the X-independent variables Z1,…,Zn. If the latter condition holds for all possible values of the Z1,…,Zn,, the comparative cp-law is called unrestricted; otherwise it is called restricted (see below). Another plausible name for this kind of cp-law would be to call them ‘equality cp’ laws (this was suggested by the referee), because they merely require that the remainder factors are ‘equal’ in the two compared states of the described system, rather than that some of them have to be excluded (as in exclusive cp laws).
A terminological note: With a “variable” X (in the mathematical sense) we mean a functional property of individuals d∈D of a domain D, i.e., a function X: D→ran(X) from D into ran(X). The set ran(X) (for “range of X”) is the set of possible values x∈ran(X) of the variable X; if X is quantitative, ran(X) = ℜ, i.e., the set of real numbers. (If ran(X) = ℜ and the values of X are distributed according to a given probability distribution, then X is what is called a ‘random variable’ in probability theory; cf. Hays and Winkler 1975). In what follows, “d(i)” denotes proper individual variables (in the logical sense) and “x(i)” denotes possible values of functional variables X(i). An important subcase of comparative cp-laws are probabilistic comparative cp-laws, in which the quantitative variables X express the probabilities P(F) of some qualitative properties expressed by predicates F (for instance, F might be the increased probability of a car accident in example (2) below).
Here are two examples of comparative cp-laws:
(1) Ceteris paribus, an increase of gas temperature leads to a (proportional) increase of gas volume (Gay-Lussac's gas law).
(2) Ceteris paribus, an increase of the blood alcohol level of a driver leads to an increased probability of a car accident.
While in (1) a quantitative relation between the increases is known, only an ordinal relation between the increases is predicted in (2).
Comparative cp-laws are connected with the invariance approach of Hitchcock and Woodward (see §6.2 below). In this account a cp-generalization expresses what would happen if an intervention on X would occur. In causal graph theory, an intervention is defined as an operation which changes the value of X and decouples X from all causal parents of X (cf. Pearl 2000, 23f, Woodward 2003, 98). This notion of an intervention has the effect that a change of X's value (as the result of an intervention) will not change the value of any other X-independent variable—which is exactly what is required by a comparative cp-law.
In the philosophical debate, cp-laws have often been understood in the different exclusive sense. An exclusive cp-law asserts that a certain state or event-type A leads to another state or event-type B, provided disturbing factors or influences are absent.
Terminological note: ‘A’ is called the antecedent and ‘B’ the consequent ‘predicate’. In terms of quantitative variables X, the predicate formula A(d) may express, for example, that d has a certain X-value x, or has changed its X-value from x1 to x2.
Thus, an exclusive cp-clause does not merely require keeping all other X-independent and potentially disturbing factors constant; it rather excludes the presence of disturbing factors. More generally, it restricts the possible values of the remainder variables Z1,…,Zn to those value ranges where they cannot disturb the cp-law. Therefore, the exclusion-clause of exclusive cp-laws may always be equivalently reformulated as a clause which requires that certain truth conditions for the exclusive cp-law hold, namely those conditions which exclude disturbing factors. In this sense, Cartwright has remarked that “the literal translation is ‘other things being equal’, yet it would be more apt to read ‘ceteris paribus’ as ‘other things being right’” (1983, p. 45). Joseph (1980, 777) talked about “ceteris absentibus” clauses, and Hempel (1988, 29) calls exclusive cp-clauses “Provisos” (“… provided disturbing factors are absent”).
Here are two examples of exclusive cp-laws—(3) comes from physics and (4) from psychology:
(3) Ceteris paribus, planets have elliptical orbits (Lakatos 1970).
(4) Ceteris paribus, people's actions are goal-oriented, in the sense that if person x wants A and believes B to be an optimal means for achieving A, then x will attempt to do B (Fodor 1987; Dray 1957, 132ff).
In (3), the cp-clause requires that other (non-negligible) forces on the planet except that of the sun are—not merely constant but—absent. Likewise, the cp-clause of (4) requires that any factors causing irrational behavior be absent.
The distinction between comparative and exclusive cp-laws is not disjoint: some cp-laws are both comparative and exclusive, as for example in the following example from theoretical economy:
(5) Ceteris paribus, an increase of demand leads to an increase of prices.
Not only must the compared economies agree in remainder factors such as the supply of the good (this is the comparative aspect); various interferers, such as political regulations which prevent an increase of prices, must be excluded (that is the exclusive aspect).
Comparative cp-laws which are not restricted by an exclusive cp-clause are also called unrestricted comparative cp-laws. They assert an invariant connection between an X-increase and an Y-increase for all possible values of X and of the X-independent remainder variables Z1,…,Zn. Unrestricted probabilistic comparative cp-laws have been suggested as an explication of generic causal relations (Cartwright 1989, 145f; Eells 1991, 85f): they assert that a variable X is a probabilistic cause of some other variable Y in all possible circumstances, where these circumstances are expressed in terms of the values of X and the X-independent remainder variables Zi (1≤i≤n).
Unfortunately, unrestricted invariance claims are rarely true. One example mentioned by Cartwright (1989, §5.2) in which they do indeed hold is the force law of classical physics, f := Si∈I fi = m∙a, which equates the total force f with the sum of all component forces. In that case, an increase of a component force fi will produce an increase of acceleration for all possible values of m and the remainder forces fi (i∈I). In Schurz (2002, §2, theorem 1) it is proved that Xi is connected with Y by an unrestricted comparative cp-law, where Y is a function of independent variables X1,…,Xn, iff the X1,…,Xn are non-interacting causes of Y in a certain (technically defined) sense.
In moderately complex systems the composition of causes is usually interactive. Therefore, these systems will only obey restricted comparative cp-laws (Cartwright 1983, 64ff; Dupré 1984). Restricted comparative cp-laws are nothing but comparative cp-laws in the scope of an exclusive cp-clause, which assert the comparative cp-relation only for a restricted class of circumstances, expressed in terms of allowed values of the independent variable X and the X-independent variables Zi. In this sense, examples (1) and (2) above are exclusive-comparative cp-laws because in (1), the cp-connection between temperature and volume holds only for approximately ideal gases, and in (2) the cp-connection holds only under psychologically normal conditions.
Although the definiens of a comparative cp-law relating X with Y refers to “all X-independent variables”, comparative cp-laws are nevertheless empirically testable by the method of randomized experiments (cf. Fisher 1951). In this method one randomly splits a sample into two subgroups, an “experimental group” and a “control group”, then enforces an increase of the value of X on the experimental but not on the control group, and finally compares the two samples concerning the value of Y. Since the split of the original sample was random, experimental and control group will agree in their distribution of all X-independent remainder variables, apart from random errors. Thus, one can apply this method without knowing which X-independent variables are causally relevant for Y and which are not. If there is a significant change of the value of Y in the experimental group compared with the control group, the cp-law “X-increase leads to an Y-change” is confirmed (strictly speaking only the restriction of this law to the population from which the sample has been taken is strongly confirmed, while confirmation of the unrestricted cp-law requires tests for a variety of different “populations”, i.e., distributions of X-independent remainder variables). On the other hand, if there is no significant change of Y's value, the cp-law is strongly disconfirmed, even in its unrestricted form. This does not mean that the method of randomized controlled experiment is free from error possibilities. In particular, the experimentally induced change of X's value may have smuggled in unrecognized X-dependent variables (i.e., unrecognized side-effects) which are partly responsible for the resulting change of Y. For example, in a teaching experiment comparing two teaching methods (e.g., the new method and the old method), the new teaching method may come out as more successful than the old one—yet not because of intrinsic properties of the new method, but just because the fact that the teaching method was new has increased the motivation of its teachers.
An important distinction concerning only exclusive cp-laws is that between definite and indefinite exclusive cp-laws. A definite exclusive cp-law specifies the disturbing factors which are excluded (or the validity conditions which are required) in the antecedent of the law. In other words, a definite exclusive cp-law “exclusively cp, if A(d), then B(d)” has a strict completion of the form “For all d: if A(d) and C(d), then B(d)”, where the completing condition “C(d)” excludes the presence of the specified disturbing factors in application d. Earman, Roberts and Smith (2002, 283f) call definite exclusive cp-law lazy cp-laws.
However, in most cases such a strict completion is impossible. This is especially clear for our non-physical example (2), as well as for the following example (6) from biology:
(6) exclusively cp, birds can fly.
The number of possible factors which may disturb a bird's flying capability is potentially infinite. In other words, for every condition C which excludes a finite list of such factors the completed law “All birds satisfying C can fly” will still have to face further exceptions—hence, a strict completion of this law is impossible. Exclusive cp-laws of this sort are called indefinite exclusive cp-laws, or in the terminology of Earman, Roberts and Smith (2002), non-lazy cp-laws.
It is a widely agreed in philosophy that the real significance of exclusive cp-laws lies in situations where strict completion is impossible (for example, cf. Rescher 1994, 14; Pietroski & Rey 1995, 84, 102; Horgan & Tienson 1996, 119f). In that case, the exclusive cp-law is indefinite, which means that its exclusive cp-clause consists in a universal second order condition which excludes all kinds of disturbing factors to the law, whatever they are. Formally, also an indefinite exclusive cp-law may be written as a strictly completed law of the form “if disturbing factors are excluded, then As will always be Cs”—only that the meaning of “all disturbing factors” is now unclear and opens the doorway to various sorts of deficiencies, which are discussed in the next section.
Exclusive cp-laws of the form “exclusively cp, As are Bs” admit exceptions, i.e., instantiations of As which are not-Bs (Pietroski and Rey speak of “abnormal” instances; 1995, 88). A philosophical reconstruction of exclusive cp-laws—which includes restricted comparative cp-laws and, thus, the majority of all cp-laws—faces a severe problem. This problem can be articulated in the form of a dilemma. This dilemma has been formulated by Lange (1993, 235), who attributes the formulation of the dilemma to Hempel (1988).
First horn: if exclusive cp-laws are reconstructed as some sort of strict law, then they will tend to be false: typically it will not be the case that all As satisfying a completer condition C are Bs, since the range of potentially disturbing factors is typically indefinable. For instance, the relationship between supply and price is not always as the law of supply says (or, as it seems to say prima facie), because an interfering factor might occur. In other words, special science laws that instantiate perfect regularities are—mildly put—“scarce” (Cartwright 1983, 45). Yet, if one supposes that the law is to be formalized as a universally quantified conditional sentence, then one counter-instance (due to a disturbing factor) to the universally quantified sentence means that it is false.
Second horn: If we instead suppose that an indefinite exclusive ceteris paribus clause is attached to the law so that it means “All As are Bs, if nothing interferes”, then the cp-law in question is in danger of lacking empirical content. It lacks empirical content because it seems to say nothing more than “All As are Bs or not-(All As are Bs)”. If this is true, then exclusive cp-laws are analytically true sentences and, therefore, trivially true. This, however, is an unwelcome consequence because laws of the special sciences should be reconstructed as empirical statements—not as sentences being true in virtue of meaning.
Both horns are quite unpleasant results for any philosopher who seeks a theory of non-strict laws. To deal with this dilemma is a central challenge for every theory of ceteris paribus laws (Lange 1993; Earman & Roberts 1999; Earman, Roberts & Smith 2002). In the following section, several attempts to cope with this dilemma are presented and tenacious problems of them are discussed.
The general idea behind completer approaches is that the best way to explicate exclusive cp-laws is to add the missing conditions for a strict implication into the antecedent of the law statement. There are two quite different possibilities to do this. One possibility is to add these conditions explicitly, by appropriate descriptions of the first order individual variables involved in the law. If this were the correct account, all correct cp-laws would turn out to be definite exclusive cp-laws (or lazy cp-laws in the terminology of Earman, Roberts and Smith 2002). The other possibility is to add these conditions by way of a second order quantification over first order predicate variables, which apply to the first order individual variables of the law. In this account, cp-laws are turned into indefinite exclusive cp-laws.
Fodor's starting point for his account of cp-laws is Davidson's distinction between homonomic and heteronomic generalizations (see section 2.2):
Exceptions to the generalizations of a special science are typically inexplicable from the point of view of (that is, in the vocabulary of) that science. That's one of the things that makes it a special science. But, of course, it may nevertheless be perfectly possible to explain the exceptions in the vocabulary of some other science. […]. On the one hand the [special sciences'] ceteris paribus clauses are ineliminable from the point of view of its propriety conceptual resources. But, on the other hand, we have—so far at least—no reason to doubt that they can be discharged in the vocabulary of some lower-level science (neurology, say, of biochemistry; at worst physics). (Fodor 1987, 6)
So Fodor's idea is that the additional factors whose existence is required by the exclusive cp-clause cannot be completely specified within the conceptual resources of the special sciences, although this could be done (at least in principle) within the vocabulary of some more fundamental science such as neurophysiology or, ultimately, fundamental physics. Fodor calls the missing factors ‘completers’. A physical microdescription of the antecedent condition A is called a realizer of A (the same A may have several different realizers).
(7) A factor C is a completer relative to a realizer R of A and a consequent predicate B iff:
- R and C is strictly sufficient for B
- R on its own is not strictly sufficient for B
- C on its own is not strictly sufficient for B.
(Fodor 1991, 23)
A first option (which Fodor conceives of as insufficient) would be to define the truth conditions of a cp-law as follows:
(8) cp(A→B) is true iff for every realizer R of A there is a completer C such that A&C→B (cf. Hausman 1992, 133–139 for a similar account).
Schiffer has objected to this account on the grounds that if A is a (mental) functional state, which can be realized by very different states Ri, it is highly unlikely that there is a completer for every realization (cf. Schiffer 1991, 5) Fodor accepts this objection and provides the following account:
(9) cp(A→B) is true iff either (i) for every realizer of A there is a completer C such that A&C→B or (ii) if there is no such completer for a realization Ri of A there must be many other laws in the network for A for which Ri has completers (Fodor 1991, 27).
While condition (9)(i) repeats the simpler definition in (8), conditions (9)(ii) expresses the idea that if A is, for instance, an intentional state and goes into the antecedent of many laws, then even if Ri does not have completers in the cp-law in question, cp(A→B) is still true, if Ri does have completers in many other cp-laws.
Mott (1992) provided the following counterexample to condition (ii) of this account of truth-conditions: cp, if a person is thirsty, then she will eat salt. This comes out as a true cp-law, because on the one hand, very likely many, maybe all, realizers of “being thirsty” lack completers (because nobody tends to eat salt when thirsty). On the other hand, ‘being thirsty’ might very well go into the antecedent of many other cp-laws for which there are such completers. Mott's counter-example can be avoided if one adds to (ii) the requirement that for sufficiently many realizers Rj of A there exist completers with respect to B (see Silverberg 1996 and Earman and Roberts (1999, section 9) for a discussion).
Although Fodor starts with the hope that the missing conditions of exclusive cp-laws could eventually be specified in the fundamental science, his definition of exclusive cp-laws involves a second order quantification over variable (unspecified) completers of independent exception-explainers. Hence, his account of exclusive cp-laws belongs to the family of indefinite exclusive cp-laws. Because of this fact Fodor's and related accounts face severe problems, as will be demonstrated in section 5.2.
Schiffer, Fodor and Mott try to explicate cp-laws by ordinary truth-conditions. In contrast, Pietroski and Rey provide stronger conditions for what they call “non-vacuous truth”, in terms of epistemic conditions such as explanation and independent confirmability. Pietroski and Rey compare cp-clauses to cheques:
These cheques represent a ‘promise’ to the effect that all [counterinstances] of the putative law can be explained by citing factors that are […] independent of that law. If the promise cannot be kept the cheque was no good to begin with.“ (Pietroski & Rey 1995, 89).
Completion is conceived here as explanatory completion and it is required only post factum. If there is a counter-instance of the law in question, we are committed to explain why the law was not instantiated.
A cp law holds in a ‘closed system’, i.e., a system considered in abstraction from other, independently existing factors. Such a systematization is non-vacuous only to the extent that deviations from the regularities that are constitutive of it can be explained by those factors.” (Pietroski & Rey 1995, 89)
For the cp-law to be acceptable in spite of the counter-instance we need independent evidence for the existence of the disturbing factor. It would not be acceptable if the only evidence for the existence of the disturbing factor were the counter-instance we started with.
Pietroski and Rey (1995, 92) take a cp-law to be non-vacuously true and hence epistemically acceptable iff (in simplified words) the following conditions are met:
(10) cp(A→B) is non-vacuously true iff
- ‘A’ and ‘B’ are otherwise nomological and
- For all x, if Ax, then (either Bx or there exists an independently confirmable factor that explains why ¬Bx), and
- cp(A→B) explains at least something as assumed in condition (ii).
Pietroski's and Rey's account involves a second order quantification over unspecified exception-explainers. Thus, as in the case of semantic completer accounts, their account explicates indefinite exclusive cp-laws and faces severe problems to be explained in the next section.
Several authors have independently shown that completer approaches are unsatisfactory. Earman and Roberts (1999, 454f) provide arguments, which show that an exclusive cp-law in the sense of Pietroski and Rey cannot escape the problem of vacuity. Their example is the alleged cp-law “cp, all spherical bodies conduct electricity”. Every failure of this law can be explained in terms of a factor, for which we have independent evidence, viz. the molecular structure of the body in question. Schurz (2001a) proves that Pietroski's and Rey's exclusive cp-laws are not vacuous but almost vacuous. More precisely, the content of “exclusively cp, As are Bs” in the sense of Pietroski's and Rey's definition (10) is equivalent with the claim that for every event of the form “d is an A and d is (or is not) a B” there exists a true strict completer C(d) such that either “All (A∧C)s are Bs” or “All (A∧C)s are ¬Bs” is a strictly true law. This means that conditional on A, every B-event or not-B-event is assumed a deterministic and independently identifiable cause, whatever this cause may be. This presupposition of determinism is both too strong and too weak: It is too weak because it does not establish a relevant nomological connection between A and B. It is too strong because in all areas involving random processes, determinism does not hold. Woodward (2002, §2) has demonstrated that a similar criticism as above applies to Fodor's account.
Connected with the almost-vacuity of indefinite exclusive cp-laws is an even more devastating problem, namely their accidentality. An exclusive cp-law may be true although its antecedent is not at all nomologically or causally relevant for its consequent. All sorts of events are connected by indefinite exclusive cp-laws, provided only that they have deterministic causes, which for Pietroski and Rey (1995) have additionally to be independently testable, and for Fodor (1991) have to be nomologically relevant (cf. Woodward 2002, 309, (ii, iii)). For example, Woodward (2002, 310) demonstrates that according to the explications of Pietroski and Rey (1995), Fodor (1991) and Hausman (1992), the exclusive cp-law “all charged particles accelerate at a rate of n meters/sec2” is a true exclusive cp-law for arbitrary values of n. Schurz (2002, 364) demonstrates that according to these accounts “if a person looks to the right, she will see a kangaroo” is a true exclusive cp-law. Also, Earman & Robert's example can be read as demonstrating the accidentality of “cp, all spherical bodies conduct electricity”, although the example was originally used to show that this statement is vacuously true.
The general idea of invariance or stability theories of laws consists in the claim that a cp-law is an ‘if-then’ assertion which holds true for different if-conditions which are also called antecedent conditions or initial conditions.
“Stability” and “invariance” are usually taken as synonyms. For the sake of clarity, we will use “stability” to refer to Lange's stability theory of laws (section 5.1) and we will use “invariance” to refer to Woodward's and Hitchcock's invariance theory of laws (section 5.2).
In stability/invariance accounts, generalizations which are qualified by a cp-clause are considered to be non-strict in the sense that they do not quantify over all possible values of the variables occurring in the generalization. A generalization is stable or invariant if it quantifies only over some limited range of possible values. Different approaches to invariance or stability theories differ in how they determine this limited range of possible values. In this sense, invariance or stability theories can be understood as an alternative to exclusive interpretations of non-strict laws and as an attempt to deal with the dilemma of triviality and falsity.
According to Lange (2000, 2002, 2005), the universal fundamental laws in physics and the cp-laws in the inexact special sciences differ only in degree (for a related account that does not focus on stability alone see (Mitchell 2000)). The lawhood of universal laws and cp-laws is due to the same property of these statements: their stability. Lange's (2000, 8f) approach consists in two steps. First, the role of laws in scientific reasoning is determined: they figure in explanations and predictions, they support counterfactuals, and they are inductively confirmed. Secondly, it is explained why law statements can play these roles; because of their property of stability. Law statements are straightforwardly conceived as inference rules, such that if “All As are Bs” is a law statement, then it permits the scientists to infer ‘Ba’ from ‘Aa’. Whether a law statement yields a reliable inference rule is spelled out in terms of the stability of the statement. So, the crucial question is: What is meant by “stability”?
Lange's basic idea is that laws are lawlike because they are true for different propositions expressing possible initial conditions. Most importantly, laws do not only hold for propositions describing (non-nomic) actual events but also for propositions describing (non-nomic) counterfactual events. Following this intuition Lange (2000, 48f; 2009, 20) proposes a preliminary definition of laws by nomic preservation:
(11) Some proposition l is a law iff its truth is preserved under all those counterfactual suppositions that are consistent with every physical necessity, i.e., under all physically possible counterfactual suppositions.
This definition raises the question: what does it mean to be physically possible? Roughly, a proposition p is a physical possibility if there is some possible world w where the same laws of nature hold as in the actual world and p obtains at w. But if this is true, then Lange's definition of lawhood seems to be circular (see Lange 2009, 25–28 for a lucid illustration of circularity). Because being consistent with the laws (of the actual world) is part of the definiens of being a law (of the actual world). Lange recognizes the problem of circularity and offers an alternative by introducing the following notion of stability of a law statement.
(12) A set of statements G is stable iff G remains true for every (non-nomic) counterfactual supposition p that is consistent with G (cf. Lange 2000, 100, 103; 2005, 420; Lange 2009, 29).
This notion of stability leads to a theory of laws:
(13) A proposition l is a law iff it is a member of a non-maximal stable set G.
According to Lange (cf. 2005, chapter 4; 2009, chapter 2) there exist several different classes of stable sets: for example, the class of logical truths (which in combination with (13) define logical necessity), the class of all physical laws (which in combination with (13) define physical necessity of lawhood), and the class of all truths (which is trivially stable). The requirement of G to be non-maximal, i.e., to be strictly smaller than the set of all true statements, is necessary to exclude the identification of G with the class of all truths.
According to Lange, definition (13) solves the circularity problem mentioned above. Consider some accidentally true universal statement as for example:
A: All fruits in my basket are red.
According to Lange, this generalization is an accidental truth because it is not a member of a (non-maximal) stable set. For assume A is member of some non-maximal set Δ (which may contain all physical laws). By non-maximality there exists some further accidental truth B, for example,
B: I want to put a green fruit into my basket.
which is not in Δ. Then, so argues Lange (2005, 421), there are at least some conversational contexts in which A does not have priority over B, whence if ¬A∨¬B were true, A could well be false (i.e., ¬A∨¬B → ¬A could hold). This means that Δ is not stable under the counterfactual supposition ¬A∨¬B.
Although Lange's argument is correct, one could object that the circularity problem has not entirely be dissolved: it reappears at the level of the semantic truth condition for counterfactuals. For Lange's condition (12) to work in the right way it is presupposed that for every accidental counterfactual proposition A and every non-actual world w which verifies the antecedent of a counterfactual conditional C → D the following holds: (a) in every conversational context w retains all laws of the actual world, although (b) there exist suitably chosen conversational contexts and antecedent formulas C (e.g., C = A∨B for accidental B) for which w throws out the accidental truth A. Assumption (a) excludes, for example, the possibility that some closest world which verifies the counterfactual proposition “if I were twice as big as I am” would falsify a law of nature (so that I would, for example, retain the same weight in this world)—if that were allowed, then the set of all laws would not be stable. Assumption (b) excludes, for example, the possibility that all closest worlds which verify a counterfactual proposition which is consistent with the set of all laws and the proposition “It rains today” would retain the proposition “It rains today”- if that were allowed, then “It rains today” would count as a law.
Lange, however, has a reply to this objection. He (2009: chapter 4) argues that subjunctive facts are ontologically primitive and the truth conditions for counterfactuals do not refer to laws. He concludes that therefore his explications (12) and (13) are not circular.
What distinguishes now cp-laws from laws in general? According to Lange's core idea, cp-laws are stable (sets of) propositions whose application is pragmatically restricted to the purposes of a scientific discipline. As Lange formulates the point with respect to the laws in the special sciences, or inexact sciences as he calls them: “A set is stable for the purpose of an inexact science if and only if it is invariant under every counterfactual supposition of interest to the science and consistent with the set.” (Lange 2002, 416). Lange tries to avoid the horns of the Falsity-or-Triviality-Dilemma by treating ‘ceteris paribus’ as a name for a set I of interfering factors. Note that I does not list all the possible interferences which prevent the occurrence of G in ‘cp, all As are Bs’, but only those factors that are relevant (for a discipline). One can understand Lange in a way that he provides two strategies to determine the members of I: (A) the strategy of non-negligibility and (B) the strategy of intended interest of a science. Both strategies try to explicate a methodology that is implicitly used by scientists in a particular discipline. (cf. Lange 2000, 170–174).
(A) The strategy of non-negligibility: Instead of providing a complete list of all interfering factors, scientists merely refer to those interfering factors “that arise sufficiently often, and can cause sufficiently great deviations from G-hood, that a policy of inferring Fs to be G […] would not be good enough for the relevant purposes” (Lange 2002, 411; Lange 2000, 170f). For instance, consider the economic law “cp, if the supply of a commodity increases then the price decreases”. According to Lange, it may happen that the increase in supply is so small that no decrease in price results. But it might as well happen that the price does not decrease although the supply increases significantly, because a gigantic comet hitting the planet Earth and destroying all life on its surface disturbs the instantiation of this law. The comet causes sufficiently great deviation from a decrease in the price of a good. Nevertheless comets are negligible for the purposes of economists because their occurrence does not arise sufficiently often to count as interfering factor that is to be explicitly listed in the cp-conditions.
(B) The strategy of intended interest of a science: A law may still count as stable if it fails to hold under those counterfactual suppositions that do not fall into the range of the laws intended purpose and application. This point is best illustrated by an example from island biogeography—the area law—provided by Lange:
It has been suggested that ceteris paribus, the equilibrium number S of a species of a given taxonomic group on an island (as far as creatures are concerned) increases [polynomially] with the islands area [A]: S = c×Az. The (positive-valued) constants c and z are specific to the taxonomic group and island group. (Lange 2002, 416f.; cf. Lange 2000, 235f)
There are counterfactual suppositions for which the area law is not true. For example, imagine an island where the animals of the species “chicken” exclusively live on chicken farms. Suppose further that on these farms chicken are bred and held under extremely crowded conditions. So, the counterfactual supposition stemming from this example is “chicken on the island in question are bred under extremely crowded, artificial conditions set up by farmers”. Obviously, the area law will drastically fail to hold for this case. Moreover, cases of this kind are not far-fetched philosophical thought experiments: they do not occur rarely in times of cultivated breeding of animals (as required by the strategy of non-negligibility). Nevertheless, scientists exclude this kind of exceptions because it conflicts with the intended purpose and application of their discipline (in this case: island biogeography) (cf. Lange 2002, 417; Lange 2000, 232f for further examples).
It is illuminating to contrast Lange's strategies of determining a set of disturbing influence I (in the light of intended applications of a law) with the use of cp-clauses that does indeed render a statement trivial. Lange illustrates this point by an example of a mere “excuse clause”:
Suppose someone says ‘I can run a four-minute mile’ but with each failure reveals a proviso that she had not stated earlier: ‘except on this track’, ‘except on sunny Tuesdays in march’ and so on. It quickly becomes apparent that this person will not acknowledge having committed herself to any claim by asserting ‘I can run a four-minute mile.’ (Lange 2000, 172; cf. also Lange 2002, 410)
According to Lange, excuse clauses of this kind differ from cp-clauses as used in the sciences, because the latter refer to strategies of determining disturbing factors. Although the relevant set of disturbing factors is not listed explicitly, it is implicit in the scientific practice (and the education and studies) in a particular field of inquiry.
Based on his stability theory of laws, Lange also proposes an argument for the autonomy and irreducibility of special science laws. Recall that arguing for the autonomy and irreducibility of the special sciences with respect to physics was one of the crucial motivations to start the debate on cp-laws (see section 1.3). Suppose that the laws of a given special science discipline D are stable with respect to the purposes of D. This pragmatic restriction is unique to D. In other words, D's laws are stable for counterfactual suppositions that violate other disciplines' laws, for example the laws of fundamental physics. For instance, Lange (2002, 420) claims that ‘the area law would still have held had there been birds equipped with organs weakening gravity's pull somewhat’. Having organs that weaken gravity's pull is understood as a violation of the law of gravitation. Thus, D's laws are stable under some counterfactual supposition for which fundamental physics is unstable. This unique range of stability makes D epistemically autonomous as a scientific discipline because D's laws can figure, for instance, in explanations answering some why-questions that no other discipline can answer as adequately as D itself (cf. Lange 2000, chapter 8; Lange 2000, 420f; also Reutlinger & Koch 2008).
Similar to Lange's stability theory, the invariance approach (most prominently advocated by Hitchcock & Woodward 2003a, 2003b; Woodward 2000, 2002, 2003) also identifies the stability or invariance of a generalization as its key feature for performing the role of a law and figuring in explanations and predictions. As in Lange's theory, to be invariant means for Hitchcock and Woodward to be true under several (not necessarily all) counterfactual suppositions. Despite these basic agreements there are important respects which clearly distinguish the invariance theory from Lange's stability theory. In what follows we focus on the distinguishing features of the invariance approach:
- The Quantitative Language of Law Statements: Although the idea might be implicit in Lange's theory, invariance theories conceive candidates for law statements explicitly and straightforwardly as quantitative statements. Thus, the predicates occurring in the statement are variables X which may attain certain values x in ran(X), as explained in section 3. One might object that there may be laws in the historical and social sciences that are not quantitative but merely qualitative. But this qualitative character of statements can nevertheless be translated into quantitative statements with binary variables, that may only take two possible values, ‘X=1’ meaning that some event type X occurs and ‘X=0’ meaning that some event type X does not occur (see Woodward & Hitchcock 2003, 10f).
- Counterfactual Suppositions Viewed Differently—Interventions: Invariance theories characterize the counterfactually supposed antecedent conditions under which a generalization remains stable differently than Lange's stability theory. Lange simply assumes these conditions, e.g., the temperature of the gas is 32º, to be the result of counterfactual suppositions. We suppose that p is true and see whether the law l remains true supposing p. So stability theory does not care how the supposed state of affairs comes about. Invariance theory is more restrictive in charactzerizing the counterfactual situations. Proponents of invariance theory adopt a different view: A counterfactual situation refers to a change in the value of a variable. For an invariance theorist, it is important to explain how the change of a variable is brought about: the change of the value of a variable must be the causal outcome of an intervention. An intervention consists in a local change that sets a variable X to a certain value and at the same time decouples X from all X-independent variables, as explained in section 3. So an intervention on X is a direct, exogenous causal influence on some variable X which (1) does only act on X itself while (2) other variables (Z) are only changed in virtue of being directly or indirectly caused by the change in X. Note that interventions need not be carried out by human beings. Instead they are conceived as hypothetical (not necessarily human) causes. (cf. Woodward 2003, 98; and Woodward 2003, 103f, 123–127 for arguments against an anthropomorphic interpretation of interventions.)
Different kinds of Variables: Invariance theories distinguish two kinds of variables: (1) Explicit variables, that figure explicitly in a generalization and (2) background variables, that describe background conditions which are not mentioned in the generalization in question. Consequently, interventions can be carried out with respect to both kinds of variables.
Similarly to Lange's theory, Hitchcock and Woodward use the intended purposes of inquiry of a certain discipline to distinguish between interventions into explicit variables and background variables (cf., e.g., Woodward 2003, 262f). According to invariance theory, only the former are of importance to laws in a specific scientific discipline. Woodward uses an example from economics to illustrate the point:
In microeconomics, individual economic agents are often assumed to conform to the behavioral generalizations constituting rational choice theory (RCT). […] Even if we assume, for the sake of the argument, that these generalizations are roughly accurate descriptions of the behavior of many participants in markets, it is clear that there are many changes and interventions over which the generalizations will fail to be invariant. For example, there are many pharmaceutical interventions and surgically produced changes in brain structure that will lead previously selfish agents to act in non-self-interested ways […]. However, economists have not generally regarded these sorts of failures of invariance as interesting or important, at least if […] they occur relatively rarely in the population.(Woodward 2003, 263)
Obviously, the reason to ignore rare but possible changes in the background variables is very similar to Lange's strategy of non-negligibility. Woodward contrasts these negligible changes of background variables with important changes of explicit variables:
For example, microeconomists often require that fundamental explanatory generalizations such as the principles of RCT [rational choice theory] be invariant under changes in information available to economic agents or under changes in their beliefs and under changes in the incentives or relative prices they face. (Woodward 2003, 263; cf. Woodward 2003, 264 for a case study from macro-economics)
Conditions of Invariance: Invariance theories differ drastically from Lange's approach in defining their key notion, i.e., stability or invariance. According to Woodward and Hitchcock (2003, 17) and Woodward (2003, 250):
(14) A statement of the form Y=f(X) is invariant iff the following so- called testing intervention condition holds: there are at least two different possible values of an explicit variable X, x1 and x2, for which Y realizes a value in the way that the function f describes, and the fact that X takes x1 or, alternatively, x2 is the result of an intervention.
The most intuitive case of a testing intervention might be the following one: X=x1 describes an actual state of affairs while X=x2 describes a possible counterfactual state of affairs. For instance, suppose that Boyle's gas law —p∙V = N∙k∙T—is true for the actual temperature of a gas g of 30°. According to the testing intervention condition, Boyle's gas law is stable if it also holds for (counterfactual) temperature of, say, 40°. One might call this kind of invariance “minimal” invariance. Contrary to Lange's theory, minimal invariance is necessary and sufficient for the statement to count as invariant. Note, however, that invariance under variations of background variables is neither necessary nor sufficient for being minimally invariant (cf. Woodward 2003, 248; Hitchcock & Woodward 2003, 7f).
- Degrees of Invariance: One can still distinguish more or less stable generalizations. So invariance is not an all or nothing matter—instead it admits of degree. Roughly, the degree of invariance of a generalization G is measured by the range of possible values of variables contained in G for which G remains invariant. This view implies two extremes of invariance: (1) A generalization that holds for all possible values of its variables is maximally invariant, (2) a generalization G that holds for merely two of the possible values of the dependent variables in G is minimally invariant. Between these extremes of invariance lie generalizations which hold only for a certain range of values. Woodward & Hitchcock (2003) illustrate the latter kind of generalization by the example of an equation that describes the growth of plant depending on the amount of water and fertilizer.
According to Hitchcock & Woodward, laws or generalizations in the special sciences do not hold under all interventions. They merely hold for a certain range of possible values (of those variable figuring in the law statement). By being non-strict the generalizations in the special sciences do not satisfy a condition that is traditionally associated with laws of nature, namely the condition of universality. Nonetheless being invariant for a limited range of values is enough for a proposition to play a lawlike role in the sciences, as Hitchcock and Woodward (2003) argue. Hitchcock & Woodward (2003, 184–189) develop further criteria and examples of determining the degree of invariance of a generalization G (e.g., comparing two generalizations G and G*, G might be more exact than G* with respect to the same range of intended application; or G might be more or less sensitive to variations in the background conditions than G* etc.).
Let us compare Lange's stability theory and Woodward's and Hitchcock's invariance theory with respect to the range of counterfactual suppositions or, alternatively, interventions to which the law is applicable. One can say that Lange's stability theory and Woodward's and Hitchcock's invariance theory start from opposed extremes of the spectrum of stability: (1) Lange starts at the maximum of stability, i.e., he starts with the claim that a law-proposition l remains true for all counterfactual suppositions that are consistent with l, where by definition an assumption counts as a counterfactual supposition if it is consistent with the laws of nature. In a second step, Lange reduces the set of all counterfactual suppositions consistent with l because of certain pragmatic goals of the discipline which uses the proposition l. (2) Woodward and Hitchcock start with minimal stability, i.e., the satisfaction of the testing intervention condition for some proposition l. In a second step, Woodward and Hitchcock add to minimal stability that l's degree of invariance increases with the number of possible interventions for which l holds (among other criteria).
- Different strategy to distinguish laws from accidentally true generalizations: Traditionally, philosophers of science believe that genuine laws differ from accidentally true generalization in kind. Invariance theorists, such as Woodward and Hitchcock, agree that such a distinction can be drawn. Accidentally true generalizations are not minimally invariant in the sense of satisfying the testing intervention condition. To take an example, Hitchcock and Woodward think that an accidentally true generalization such as “All golden spheres have a diameter of less than a mile” is not invariant under any interventions, i.e., the generalization does not remain minimally invariant under testing interventions on their explicit variables (see definition (14)). Therefore, laws and accidental generalizations differ in kind (cf. Woodward 2003, 239f). However, Hitchcock and Woodward acknowledge the fact that minimally invariant generalizations may fail to be stable because these generalizations may be true only if very specific background conditions obtain (see the preceding paragraphs about degrees of invariance).
Analogously, Lange argues for a principled distinction between laws and accidents within the framework of his stability theory (section 5.1). However Lange's different strategy to distinguish laws from accidents seems to be partly motivated by the intuition that minimal invariance in Woodward's and Hitchcock's sense is too weak to account for real life stability displayed by scientific generalizations.
John Stuart Mill objected to the claim that laws might have exceptions. The problem of exceptions disappears if laws are taken to refer to tendencies.
With regard to exceptions; in any tolerably advanced science there is properly no such thing as an exception. What is thought to be an exception to a principle is always some other and distinct principle cutting into the former: some other force which impinges against the first force, and deflects it from its direction. There are not a law and an exception to that law—the law acting in ninety-nine cases, and the exception in one. There are two laws, each possibly acting in the whole hundred cases, and bringing about a common effect by their conjunct operation. […] Thus if it were stated to be a law of nature, that all heavy bodies fall to the ground, it would probably be said that the resistance of the atmosphere, which prevents a balloon from falling, constitutes the balloon as an exception to that pretended law of nature. But the real law is that all heavy bodies tend to fall […]. (Mill 1836 quoted after Mill 2000, 56, original emphasis)
This idea was taken up by Cartwright and others. Cartwright's discussion of cp-laws focused on the question why cp-laws are of interest in non-ideal situations. If what cp-laws say is confined to special, namely ideal, circumstances it seems prima facie that these laws are irrelevant for all other, non-ideal, situations. That, however, is not the case in scientific practice. Cp-laws are used to explain phenomena outside the ideal circumstances. Cartwright argues that this practice requires the postulation of capacities or tendencies:
The logic that uses what happens in ideal circumstances to explain what happens in real ones is the logic of tendencies or capacities. What is an ideal situation for studying a particular factor? It is a situation in which all other ‘disturbing’ factors are missing. And what is special about that? When all other factors are absent, the factor manifests its power explicitly in its behaviour. […] This tells you something about what will happen in very different, mixed circumstances—but only if you assume that the factor has a fixed capacity that it carries with it from situation to situation. (Cartwright 1989, 190f).
Subsequently her suggestion has been taken up by several authors that attempt to provide a semantics for cp-laws or even of laws in general in terms of dispositions (cf. Hüttemann 1998, Hüttemann 2007, Lipton 1999, Drewery 2001, Bird 2005, and (2007, chapter 3))
The prima facie advantage of a dispositional account of laws vis-á-vis the cp-law-problem is the following: The dispositional account provides a semantics for cp-laws. According to this account a law statement is true provided the type of system in question has the disposition that the law statement attributes to the system. Reconstructing law-statements as statements about dispositions, tendencies, capacities, etc. rather than about overt behavior turns cp-laws into strict laws. The claim is—as in Mill—that certain kinds of systems have certain kinds of tendencies or dispositions. In stating the law it is no longer necessary to appeal to cp-clauses. Furthermore, the so-called problem of instantiation, “the problem that many cp-laws appear not to have any instances” (Lipton 1999, 164) can be solved. The law is no longer considered to be a description of the systems' occurrent behavior that is only manifest under very special conditions—if at all. The law concerns the underlying stable tendencies or dispositions.
Furthermore, the dispositionalist account is able to provide a rationale for why scientists are interested in cp-laws. Cp-laws describe how systems behave in the absence of disturbing factors, i.e., if the disposition, tendency etc. can manifest itself completely. This knowledge can be used to account for more complex situations, in which various systems and their dispositions are intertwined—provided laws of superposition are available.
Various kinds of concerns have been raised with respect to dispositionalist accounts.
Dispositions, tendencies etc may be present without being manifest. (cf. Earman & Roberts 1999, 451f):
Thus if what one wants explained is the actual pattern, how does citing a tendency—which for all we know may or may not be dominant and, thus, by itself may or may not produce something like the actually observed pattern—serve to explain this pattern?
As a rejoinder one can point to laws of composition. As a consequence it is not the disposition on its own that can explain the actual pattern in such cases but rather the dispositions plus the law of composition. For example, Newton's second law with (i) the gravitational force and (ii) the Coulomb-force describe two dispositions that explain the actual behavior of a particle relying on the law for the superposition of forces. The law for the superposition of forces describes how the two forces contribute to the actual behavior. (Note that the dispositions the laws of nature attribute to systems need not in general be taken to be macroscopic dispositions like fragility or solubility.) To the extent that such laws are available (as for example for physical forces) the contribution of the various tendencies or dispositions can be determined even if they fail to be (completely) manifest. It can, however, be disputed whether such laws of superposition/composition are available in general. Laws of composition may also pose a problem for dispositional monists like Bird (2007) or Mumford (2004) because, if they are taken to attribute dispositions to systems, we need a meta-law that tells us what happens if the disposition for the law of composition fails to be manifest. We need a meta-law that tells what the law of composition contributes to the actual behavior. The assumption that laws of composition attribute dispositions to physical systems thus leads to an infinite regress.
A second problem concerns the question whether the dispositional account can indeed avoid the dilemma for exclusive cp-laws (see sect. 3). Even though it is true that the laws on this construal no longer appeal explicitly to cp-clauses, the trivial false-dilemma turns up at a different place (Lipton 1999, 166: Humes's revenge). The dispositionalist has to specify the triggering conditions for the disposition in order to give the dispositions ascription a determinate content. The conditions under which the disposition will manifest itself are exactly those that require explicating the cp-clause (Lipton 1999, 166f, for an extensive discussion of this problem cf. Schrenk 2007b)
The dispositionalist reconstructs the law as follows: “cp, All As are Bs” means “All As have the disposition to B”. This is informative only to the extent that the triggering conditions for the disposition to manifest can be spelt out. That requires that something informative is said about the cp-clauses, and more generally, leads us back to the problems discussed in the previous sections (see Hüttemann 2014 for a recent defence of the dispositionalist approach to cp-laws; Ward 2009 provides a critical discussion).
The reconstructions of exclusive cp-laws in terms of strict completions do not imply anything about the probability with which undisturbed antecedent-events will produce the consequent (cf. Pietroski and Rey 1995, p. 84; Schiffer 1991, p. 8). According to the intuition of normality theories this seems to be counterintuitive, because cp-laws should be asserted only if the situation without (non-negligible) disturbing factor is a normal or at least a rather probable situation. Examples of correct exclusive cp-laws which violate this normality condition are, for example: “exclusively cp, no tire blows out”, “exclusively cp, there are no clouds in the sky”, etc. Several authors have therefore developed so-called normality accounts of cp-laws, for example Silverberg (1996), Earman and Roberts (1999, 463), Spohn (2002), Spohn (forthcoming, chapter 13), and Schurz (2001b, 2002), who argues that the normality interpretation is the preferred interpretation of exclusive cp-laws in the life sciences, from biology upwards to social sciences.
Normality theories can be understood as an alternative to the (definite and/or indefinite) exclusive interpretation of non-strict laws. The general idea of normality theories consists in saying: “cp, all As are Bs” means that normally As are Bs. They can also be combined with a comparative interpretation into normic-comparative law-statements such as “normally an increase of X leads to an increase of Y when other X-independent variable are held constant”. However, the normality accounts differ in their explication of the notion of “normally”. One possibility (suggested by Schurz, see section 7.1) is to explicate the normality condition in terms of a high probability of the consequent predicate, given the antecedent predicate, where the underlying conditional probabilities are objective statistical probabilities based on the dispositions of evolutionary systems. Another possibility (suggested by Spohn, see section 7.2) is to explicate the normality conditions in terms of degrees of belief and ranking functions over possible worlds.
Largely independently of Schurz' and Spohn's specific approaches but in agreement with the general idea of the normality approach, Hüttemann and Reutlinger (2013), Kowalenko (2014), Reutlinger (2014), Roberts (2014) and Strevens (2014) have recently explored a statistical approach to cp-laws, according to which cp-law statements are statistical claims.
Schurz (2001b; 2002, §5) analyses cp-laws in non-physical sciences as normic laws of the form “As are normally Bs”. Here are some examples (4* and 6* are the normic reconstructions of 4 and 6 above):
(4*) Birds normally can fly.
(6*) People's actions are normally goal-oriented
(15) Governments normally try to keep the economy of their country intact.
(16) Turning the ignition key normally turns on the engine of my car.
According to the statistical consequence thesis, normic laws imply numerically unspecified statistical generalizations of the form “Most As are Bs”, by which they can be empirically tested. The statistical consequence thesis has been challenged by cognitive scientists (e.g., McCarthy 1986) and by philosophers of biology (e.g., Millikan 1984). Schurz (2001b) defends the statistical consequence thesis by the following evolution theoretic argument. The argument is based on the generalized theory of evolution which does not only apply to biological evolution but also to cultural evolution (cf. Mesoudi et al. 2006 for an excellent overview on generalized evolution theory; see Strößner forthcoming for a recent discussion).
The common domain of the life sciences (which, according to Schurz, include biology, psychology as well as the social sciences and the humanities) are evolutionary systems or their products. Evolutionary systems are self-regulatory systems whose self-regulatory properties have been gradually selected gradually selected according to their contribution to reproductive success. The temporal persistence of self-regulatory systems is governed by a certain range of prototypical norm states, in which these systems constantly have to stay in order to keep alive. They manage this with the help of regulatory mechanisms which compensate for disturbing influences of the environment. Although the self-regulatory capacities of evolutionary systems are the product of a long adaptation history, they are not perfect. Dysfunctions may occur, whence their normic behaviour may have various exceptions. Yet, it must be the case that these systems are in their prototypical norm states in the high statistical majority of cases and times. For otherwise, they would not have survived in evolution.
In this way, the evolution-theoretic foundation of normic laws does not only explain why normic laws are the typical form of the laws of life sciences. It also explains why, first, normic laws are not strict but, secondly, nevertheless associated with high conditional statistical probabilities, at least for most cases and times in evolution.
According to Schurz (2002), the difference between idealization conditions in physics and normality conditions in evolutionary sciences can also be explained as follows. In physics one traditionally thinks of complexity as a source of disorder—regularities are obtained by abstracting away from complexities. In evolutionary systems, however, complexity is usually a source of order—complexity which has been selected by evolution to stabilize normic behaviour. As Wachbroit (1994, 587f) puts it, ideal planets are theoretical abstractions: mass points under the influence of a centripetal force and ‘nothing else’. They do not literally exist. In contrast, normal birds really do exist because they are what has been selected through evolution. When speaking of a normal bird, we do not abstract from its admirable complexity, but we rely on it as the cause of its normal behavior. This does not mean that abstract laws of physics (e.g., the laws of aerodynamics) play no role in the explanation of functional behaviors of evolutionary systems (e.g., that birds can fly). However, even when we explain a bird's flying ability in terms of the laws of aerodynamics, we still have to assume a ‘nomal’ bird which possesses the typical capabilities of birds which are involved in a bird's flying capability and have been selected through evolution. The idealization procedures needed for planets would not make good sense for birds: there are no disturbing parameters which, when going to zero, turn a real bird into an ideal bird which can necessarily fly and which is approximated by the real bird.
Another way to understand “ceteris paribus” as referring to normal conditions is introduced by Wolfgang Spohn (1997, section 5; 2002, section 4; 2014a, chapter 13.2; 2014b). Spohn takes the connection between ceteris paribus qualifications and normality to be straightforward: “ceteris paribus” means other things being normal. Let us call this the Normal Condition Approach. The basic idea of the Normal Conditions Approach is that a cp-law L holds when normal conditions obtain. Spohn characterizes normal conditions as “exactly those conditions that normally, usually, mostly obtain […] in the small space-time region inhabited by us” (Spohn 1997, 278). Translated in probabilistic terms, the expression “conditions that normally, usually, mostly obtain” means that the occurrence of some conditions is highly probable.
For Spohn, a condition is “normal” if it is (i) expected or (ii) at least not ruled out to obtain by a rational, epistemic agent (for formal definitions of normal and exceptional conditions cf. Spohn 2002, section 4, and Spohn forthcoming, chapter 13.4). He illustrates his Normal Conditions Approach with Hooke's Law:
Hooke's law, for instance, is about the proportionality of the force applied to a spring and its extension. It needs qualifications in many ways, as was clear form the outset, even though they could be neither fully nor precisely specified. One must not overstretch the spring, the material the spring is made off must be elastic and homogeneous, its shape regular, the thermal distribution uniform, etc. Physicists have cleared up most of the conditions—all of them?—under which Hooke's law holds and provided deeper explanation in terms of the intermolecular forces within a molecular lattice. After all, our sophisticated technology of spring balances that is (or was) used in each lab and each deli-shop depends on it. (Spohn forthcoming, 363f)
Spohn concludes that Hooke's law holds under normal conditions and draws an analogy to other law statements in the special sciences:
Hooke's law holds under normal conditions, i.e., for diligently manufactured springs handled with the usual care. The rules of thumb of folk psychology normally apply; this is why they are so tremendously useful common knowledge. Likewise, the laws of scientific psychology and of economics at best hold under the conditions explicitly specified and further unspecified normal conditions. (Spohn forthcoming, 366)
Spohn's Normal Conditions approach differs from Schurz's normic Laws approach in at least two respects.
According to Spohn (and contrary to Schurz's theory which refers to objective probabilities), the fact that normal conditions obtain is conceived epistemically and, more specifically, doxastically. An epistemic agent forms beliefs about the normality of conditions, i.e., someone strongly believes that some condition obtains (cf. Spohn 2002, 385).
Spohn describes “the epistemic functioning” of beliefs (doxastic states) about normality by modeling degrees of belief in terms of ranking functions (originally developed in Spohn 1988 under the label “ordinal conditional functions”, cf. also Spohn forthcoming; cf. Franz Huber's 2008 SEP-Entry ‘Formal Representations of Belief’, section 3.3)
Normality in Spohn's theory is explicated in terms of background conditions, not in terms of probabilistic relations between the antecedent predicate and the consequent predicate. If someone believes that the law f(X)=Y holds, then she believes that this functional relation holds under normal conditions N, which means in terms of Spohn's ranking functions that the law f(X)=Y is believed with rank zero, i.e., it is true in all normal worlds of a ranked world model. Such a ranked world model consists of a set of possible worlds together with a ranking function which attaches to each world a natural number 0, 1, …, n specifying its rank. Worlds with rank 0 are the most normal worlds, worlds with rank 1 contain exceptions from normal conditions (1st degree exceptions), worlds with rank 2 exceptions from those exceptions (2nd degree exceptions), etc.
Spohn (2014b) is the most recent and in-depth elaboration of his normal conditions based "epistemic account" of ceteris paribus laws and conditions.
Since the normal conditions “N” express the proposition that the given situation or world is normal, it would seem that the ranking-of-worlds account entails the possibility of a strict completion by adding the normality condition N to the antecedent: “if N, then Y = f(X)”. Indeed, it follows from the truth condition for the assertion “normally (or c.p.) L” in ranked world model (where L is e.g., Y = f(X)) that there exists a proposition N—namely the set of all worlds with rank 0—such that “normally L” is true in the given ranked model iff the material implication N→L is true in all worlds of this model. This does neither imply, however, that (a) the completing proposition N can be linguistically expressed, nor (b) that it can be expressed in non-trivial way, in the sense that N does not already imply L on logical reasons alone. Since one can only speak of a strict completion of “normally L” if (a) and (b) hold, it follows that the ranking-of-worlds account does in fact not entail the possibility of a strict completion. This result is adequate, because as have argued above, in most cases (especially in all non-deterministic situations) a strict completion is impossible. Thus, it has to be kept in mind that speaking of “normality conditions” does not imply that these “normality conditions” can be expressed by a any (non-trivial) proposition. For example, there is not any non-trivial proposition N which could turn the conditional “normally a Cs137 atom decays after 60 years” into a strict implication of the form “if N, then a Cs137 atom decays after 60 years”. Also note that the ranked-worlds accounts and the conditional probability accounts are equivalent as a semantics for logical axiomatizations of conditional reasoning (see section 8.3).
Reasoning from exclusive or normic cp-laws has an important logical feature: the inferences are not monotonic as in deductively valid arguments. An inference is monotonic iff adding arbitrary new premises to a valid argument does not affect its validity. But the inference from an exclusive cp-law of the form “exclusively cp, As are Bs” and a singular statement A(d) (for “d is an A”) to a conclusion B(d) is no longer correct if d is known to instantiate a disturbing factor D which blocks the nomic connection between A and B. For instance, the exclusive cp-law may state that if something is a bird (A), then it normally can fly (B), and D may assert that the given bird-instance has broken wings.
Assume the exclusive cp-law is formulated with the help of a non-strict conditional A → B. Drawing correct inferences from non-strict conditionals requires non-classical rules of valid inferences: The non-monotonicity of Default Modus Ponens means formally that although the inference from A→C and A(d) to B(d) is correct (i.e., A→B, A(d) |~ B(d) holds, where ‘|~’ stands for ‘non-monotonically correct inference’), the inference from the extended premise set A→B, H→¬B, A(d), and H(d) to B(d) is incorrect (i.e., A→B, A(d), H(d) |~ B(d)). These non-monotonic effects are reflected in non-classical rules for inferences from conditionals to conditionals. For example, take the inference from “If A, then B” to “If A∧D, then B” (monotonicity M) or from “If A, then B” and “If B, then D” to “If A, then D” (Cut C). Both inferences are valid for strict (logical or material) conditionals, but they are not generally correct for non-strict conditionals. Only the more cautious inferences from A→B and A→D to A∧D→B (cautious monotonicity CM) or from A→B and A∧B→D to A→D (Cautious Cut CC) are correct for non-strict conditionals.
Two prominent semantic criteria for the truth of a non-strict conditional and the correctness of inference from non-strict conditionals have been suggested in the literature.
- The high-probability-semantics understands normic laws in the sense of high conditional probability assertions (as in Section 7.1). This semantics considers a non-strict conditional A→B as true in a probability model if the uncertainty of the conditional, which is defined as 1 minus the conditional probability, is sufficiently low. An inference of a conclusion conditional from a set of premise conditionals is regarded as valid in this semantics iff the uncertainty of the conclusion conditional is not greater than the sum of the uncertainties of the premises. High probabilistic semantics goes back to Adams (1975) and has been extended in Schurz (1998, 2005).
- The second semantics, the normality-semantics, corresponds to the normal-condition account (see section 8.2). This semantics considers a conditional A→B as true in a ranked-world-model iff all lowest-rank A-worlds are B-worlds. An inference is considered as valid in this semantics iff all ranked-worlds-models which verify all premise conditionals verify the conclusion conditional.
Remarkably, both semantics lead to the same conditional logics. Both semantics possess the system P (“preferential entailment”) as a correct and complete axiomatization of inferences among pure conditionals, and the system R (“rational entailment”) for inferences among truth-function combinations of conditionals (for more details cf. Kraus et al. 1990, Hawthorne 1996, Adams 1975, Schurz 1998, 2004, 2005, Leitgeb 2004, or the entry on non-monotonic logic).
The use of “cp” is not restricted to philosophy of science. It is used in other areas of theoretical and practical philosophy as well.
For instance, prima facie reasons are reasons under the constraint of exclusive cp-conditions. They play an important role in ethics and epistemology.
In ethics, a prima facie norm is an obligation (e.g., “prima facie, you should not hurt anybody”) which holds as long as exceptional circumstances (e.g., defending your own life) are absent (cf. Ross 1930 and the entry on moral reasoning). Dancy (2004, 17, 35f) uses the expression “pro tanto” instead of “prima facie”, which is standardly used in the current debate. Pietroski (1993) has promoted the ceteris paribus understanding of moral obligations as a solution to paradoxes of moral obligations. Especially for the solution of moral dilemmas, the cp-reading of moral obligations has proven to be helpful, because although two conflicting cp-obligations may block each other, they do not produce a strict consistency in the sense of deductive logic (Horty 1994).
In epistemology, a prima facie reason for a belief is a reason which justifies this belief in the absence of defeaters, i.e., of exceptional information to the contrary. Prima facie reasons have been suggested in epistemology as a means of providing weak and defeasible a priori justifications for epistemologically fundamental beliefs such as the belief in the existence of an external reality, for which a strict and non-circular a priori-justification seems to be impossible. Nevertheless the inference from visual appearances to reality counts as defeasibly justified as long as there do not exist serious defeaters, i.e., reasons for serious doubt (cf. Williams 1996, 2001, or the entry on a priori justification and knowledge). An example is the defeasible inference from visual appearances to beliefs concerning external reality. My awareness of my visual appearance of a tree in front of me is a prima facie reason for my belief that there really is a tree in front of me, provided that information about exceptional circumstances is absent, for example the information that I am under the influence of drugs which cause hallucinations (cf. Pollock 1986, Moser 2002). One may object that a similar kind of possible exception to the inference from visual appearances to reality is constituted by the possibility of Cartesian demon who infuses humans with illusionary perceptions, which is one of the major skeptical counterarguments to the inference from appearances to reality. In defense of this objection several epistemologists have argued that these kinds of exceptions are not serious exceptions, and therefore, the inference from appearances to reality is defeasibly valid.
Finally, applications of cp-clauses can also be found in the form of presumptions in philosophy of language. Here it is assumed that understanding linguistic expressions requires defeasible assumptions or “presumptions”, for example presumptions concerning the rationality of the speaker (cf. Quine 1960; Davidson 1973, Scholz 2001, 149–159).
In the current literature, a number of novel trends and innovative approaches to cp-laws have emerged that cannot easily be subsumed under the already existing accounts. For this reason they deserve special mention. We believe there are at least four clearly discernable novel tendencies in the current work on cp-laws:
A reconnection to metaphysics: One of the most salient trends in the current literature is that the discussion of cp-laws (re)connects philosophy of science to analytic metaphysics in at least three respects: (i) current accounts of cp-laws make use of David Lewis’ best system account of laws; moreover, (ii) the interpretation of objective probabilities and (iii) the metaphysics of dispositions are brought into play for making progress in understanding cp-law statements.
The most vivid sign of this reconnection consists in the fact that several authors have recently defended a friendly amendment of David Lewis’ best system account of laws of nature. While Lewis' original version primarily focuses on fundamental laws, the amended versions are intended to capture non-fundamental laws of the special sciences. Schrenk (2007a, 2014), Callender and Cohen (2009, 2010), and Frisch (2014a) defend a so-called “better best system” account of special science laws (see Braddon-Mitchell 2001 and Unterhuber 2014 for closely related approaches). Reutlinger (2009) and Backmann and Reutlinger (2014) provide a critical discussion of better best system accounts. Albert (2000, 2015) and Loewer (2009) advocate a “statistical mechanical” version of the best systems approach to special science laws which is, unlike the better best system account, committed to a particular Boltzmann-inspired interpretation of statistical mechanics (including assumptions about the early history of the universe). Weslake (2014) and Frisch (2014b) provide critical responses, while Fenton-Glynn (2014) constructively uses examples by Albert and Loewer for an analysis of cp-laws. Finally, Albert and Loewer’s account also connects the debate on cp-laws with the on-going discussion on whether causation has a place in fundamental physics or whether causation is an 'emergent' phenomenon captured by the cp-law statements of the special sciences (Price and Corry 2007 and Frisch 2014b are representative of the opposing views in the debate on causation in physics).
However, other metaphysical issues besides Lewis’ account of lawhood influence the recent literature on cp-laws. The metaphysics of probabilities and disposition stand out in this respect. Taking up results from Earman and Roberts (1999) and Schurz (2002), several authors including Hüttemann and Reutlinger (2013), Kowalenko (2014), Roberts (2014), Reutlinger (2014), and Strevens (2014) discuss the prospects of a statistical approach to cp-laws (or a “softness“ approach, to use Strevens’ term), according to which cp-laws are statistical claims. (Note that the normality account presented above is but a special case of the broader statistical approach to cp-laws). A third metaphysical trend regards the metaphysics of dispositions: Hüttemann (2014) and Pemberton and Cartwright (2014) argue in favor of a dispositionalist account of cp-laws and provide responses to standard objections to the dispositionalist view (for instance, to objections voiced by Earman and Roberts 1999).
Drawing on linguistics and philosophy of language: Several recent approaches to cp-laws explicitly draw on research in linguistics and philosophy of language. Taking into account linguistic work on generics, Nickel (2010, 2014) argues that one improves our understanding of cp-law statements if one takes them to be generics and uses the formal semantics for generics to shed light of the meaning of cp-law statements (see also Unterhuber and Schurz 2013; Unterhuber 2014). Roberts (2014) makes contact with philosophy of language in analyzing cp-laws as vague and indexical statements about frequencies. Ward (2007), Karbasizadeh (2008) and Nickel (2014) explore the link between cp-laws and different accounts of natural kind terms.
Sensitivity to the sciences: Several philosophers have made an effort to draw attention to the fact that an adequate discussion of laws has to be sensitive to the differences between distinct scientific disciplines. Their motivation is to provide a theory of laws that fits generalizations (and models) in the life sciences, the social sciences and, more generally, the sciences of complex systems (for instance, see Mitchell 1997, 2002a,b; 2008, 2009; Sober 1997; Steel 2007; and Reiss 2008). In particular, Mitchell (2000), Strevens (2003, 2008), Craver (2007), Hüttemann (2007), Wimsatt (2007), Tobin (2005), Woodward (2010) and Reutlinger (2011, 2013) distinguish various dimensions characterizing how generalizations in these scientific disciplines may be non-universal or allow for exceptions. These dimensions include stability, robustness, specificity, and historical contingency (see Reutlinger and Unterhuber 2014 for an overview). In a similar vein, Schurz (2014) introduces a novel distinction between ceteris paribus and ceteris rectis laws. Fenton-Glynn (2014) holds that some higher-level laws about the macro-behavior of complex systems (his central example is the second laws of thermodynamics) are “minutis rectis“ laws and should be distinguished from cp-laws, because their non-universal character stems from a probability distribution over initial micro-conditions (see Strevens 2003 for further examples). Finally, motivated by examples from the population ecology, earth science, and statistical mechanics, Strevens (2008) and Weisberg (2013) argue for a new interpretation of laws and models involving idealized assumptions, the minimalist account of idealizations. Strevens (2012, 2014) proposes treating cp-laws and idealized laws separately. What seems to emerge from this literature is that the ceteris paribus character of generalizations is multi-faceted. There is a number of ways in which a generalization can be non-universal: due to idealizations, by expressing statistical regularities and probability distributions over initial conditions, by drawing on the notion of normality, by being sensitive to changes in initial and background conditions, and so on (see Reutlinger and Unterhuber 2014 for a more detailed analysis).
Using scientific concepts and methods: recent philosophical attempts of capturing cp-laws increasingly involve importing key concepts from the sciences and using these concepts for developing a general theory of cp-laws. Consider the following examples. Inspired by classical mechanics, Maudlin (2007) and Hüttemann (2014) analyze cp-conditions in terms of default or inertial behavior. Both authors capture a violation of cp-conditions as a deviation from inertial behavior, where deviating from inertial behavior is itself a process governed by laws of deviation (Maudlin) or laws of interaction and composition (Hüttemann). Other philosophers are influenced by the life sciences such as Nickel (2014), Pemberton and Cartwright (2014), and Strevens (2012, 2014) who rely on the concept of a mechanism in order to explicate the content of cp-conditions more generally. Kowalenko (2014) argues that cp-laws are best understood by drawing on methods from statistics, such as multivariate regression analysis (for a discussion of similar statistical approaches see Hüttemann and Reutlinger 2013, Reutlinger 2014, Roberts 2014, and Strevens 2014). Schurz (2014) uses causal Bayesian networks as a formal framework for a causal reconstruction of ceteris paribus laws and ceteris rectis laws.
Where are the debates on cp-laws leading? What are the important challenges to meet in future research? Of course, questions of this kind are hard to answer if one is not clairvoyant. There are at least four main areas of productive future research:
- The debate on cp-laws originating in the 1980s has not particularly focused on detailed case studies of laws in different scientific disciplines. But this just seems to be what good and adequate theories of cp-laws require. A possible result of detailed case studies might well be that generalizations reveal quite different features in different disciplines. In other words, the explication of cp-laws in, for instance, physics, biology and economics might differ significantly. If so, this result also raises interesting methodological questions for philosophers of science, such as “What degree of unification (with respect to laws in different scientific disciplines) do we require in order to approve of a theory of cp-laws?”.
- What is the connection between cp-laws and theories of (causal) explanation, various theories of causation and mechanisms? When applied to the special sciences, many theories of (causal) explanation (cf. Woodward 2003, Hitchcock & Woodward 2003a, b), causation (cf. Hausman 1998; Pearl 2000; Hitchcock 2001; Woodward 2003) and mechanisms (Machamer, Darden & Craver 2000; Glennan 2002; Craver 2007) seem to presuppose generalizations. Interestingly, these generalizations tend to be classified as non-strict. Consequently, these generalizations are in the domain of the debate on cp-laws. These theories of explanation, causation and mechanisms are important test cases for the adequacy of theories of cp-laws.
- What metaphysical claims do the various theories of cp-laws commit us to? Do exclusive cp-laws commit us to assume that the fundamental laws of nature are deterministic? Or are they compatible with a probabilistic metaphysics? Furthermore, do cp-laws commit us to assuming dispositions? Are they compatible with Humean metaphysics, or not? Is structural realism an adequate metaphysics for laws in the special sciences?
- What role do cp-laws play in formal philosophy? For example, it is important to answer the following questions: How are the logical principles of non-monotonic reasoning connected with cp-laws? How do cp-laws relate to Bayesian probabilities, and to the rules of Bayesian updating of these probabilities?
These areas of research are, of course, not a complete list of future research topics. Nevertheless, it seems to us that the above presented selection of research questions are deep enough to stimulate productive future research on ceteris paribus laws.
The critical article by Earman and Roberts 1999 provides an excellent introduction to the contemporary debate, because it reconstructs the most important theories of cp-laws and also points out the problems of these approaches. Earman et al. 2002 contains a representative collection of contemporary essays on the problem of cp-laws.
Persky 1990, Blaug 1996 and Kaufer 1997 are accessible surveys of the history of cp-clauses and cp-laws. Note that these articles focus on economics and the social sciences. (For a systematic discussion of laws in the social sciences, the debate between Kincaid 2004 and Roberts 2004 on whether there are laws in the social sciences is very instructive.)
The useful distinction between (a) comparative and exclusive and (b) indefinite and definite cp-laws is established and argued for in Schurz 2002.
The dilemma of triviality or falsity is discussed in Lange 1993, which is also a helpful survey of the debate until 1993.
Concerning completer accounts, Fodor 1991, Hausman (1992: chapter 8) and Pietroski & Rey (1995) are central papers. These accounts are criticized by Earman & Roberts (1999), Schurz (2001a) and Woodward (2002). A recent defense of completer accounts is Strevens (2012).
Concerning stability accounts, Marc Lange developes his stability account in book-length (cf. his 2000 and 2009, although the latter does focus on stability but no longer on cp-laws). Lange (2002) is a very accessible paper on his view of cp-laws.
Invariance accounts are best introduced in two joint papers by Christopher Hitchcock and James Woodward (cf. their 2003a, b) and in Woodward's book Making Things Happen (2003: chapter 6).
For dispositionalist approaches, Cartwright 1989 is a modern classic (cf. her recent 2002, and Elgin & Sober 2002 for a critique). Further, Smith 2002, Mumford 2004, Bird 2005 and Hüttemann 2007 should provide a representative view on the ongoing debate.
Concerning normality approaches, Schurz (2001b, 2002) argues for a normic laws approach. Spohn (2002) and Spohn (forthcoming, chapter 13) are good introductions to the normal conditions approach. See also Glymour (2002) for a formal approach to cp-laws.
There are also new approaches in the current debate that cannot easily be classified: Mitchell (1997, 2002a,b; 2008, 2009), Sober 1997, Steel (2007, chapter 6) and Reiss (2008) attempt to explicate a theory of laws that fits scientific practice in biology, the social sciences and generalization describing complex systems. Further, Mitchell (2000), Craver (2007), Tobin (2005) and Reutlinger (2011) distinguish various dimensions of non-universal laws—or “cp”-laws—in order to argue for an explication of laws in the special sciences. Braddon-Mitchell (2001) and Schrenk (2007a) are original work on the metaphysics of cp-laws, cf. Reutlinger (2009) for a critique. Hall (2007) criticizes the approach by Hitchcock and Woodward. Karbasizadeh (2008) links the debates on cp-laws and natural kinds. Ladyman and Ross (2007, chapters 4 and 5), Kincaid (2008), Ross (2008), and Ladyman (2008) argue for ontic structural realism as a metaphysics of generalizations in the social sciences (and for the special sciences in general). Callender and Cohen (2009, forthcoming) defend a best system theory of laws for the special sciences. Maudlin (2007: chapter 5) advocates an explication of laws in the special sciences that is based on the notion of quasi-Newtonian laws.
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We would like to thank Alexander Bird, Carl Craver, Matthias Hösch, Beate Krickel, Meinard Kuhlmann, Marc Lange, Chrysostomos Mantzavinos, Margaret Schabas, Markus Schrenk, Rudolf Schüssler, Wolfgang Spohn, Michael Strevens, Emma Tobin, the members of our DFG research group (Causation, Laws, Dispositions, and Explanations at the Intersection of Science and Metaphysics), and an anonymous referee for helpful comments that greatly improved our manuscript.