## Notes to Bohr’s Correspondence Principle

1.
Throughout,
‘BCW’ refers to *Niels Bohr Collected Works*, where
most of Bohr's papers can be readily found, followed by the relevant
volume number.

2. This familiar way of expressing the quantum condition does not appear in Bohr (1913). For an excellent historical review of Bohr's work on the old quantum theory, including a discussion of Bohr's quantum conditions, see Darrigol (1992), Chapters V and VI.

3.
A Fourier series,
recall, is a way of representing a function *F*(*x*) in
terms of a weighted sum of sinusoidal components (e.g., sines and
cosines).

4.
Regarding the
*statistical* asymptotic agreement Bohr notes, “As far as
the frequencies are concerned we see therefore that in the limit where
*n* is large there exists a close relation between the ordinary
theory of radiation and the theory of spectra based on [the quantum
postulates]. It may be noticed, however, that, while on the first
theory radiations of the different frequencies τω
corresponding to different values of τ are emitted or absorbed
*at the same time*, these frequencies will on the present theory
… be connected with entirely different processes …
corresponding to the transition of the system from a given state to
different neighbouring stationary states” (Bohr 1918, p.15; BCW
3, p. 81; emphasis added). And as Darrigol adds, “Considering
this distinction there could be no agreement, even asymptotically
between the spectrum of radiation emitted by a *single* atom and
the one emitted by the corresponding classical system, since a single
atom in a given state could emit only *one* line. But in the
spirit of Einstein's probabilistic treatment of radiation, one could
still compare the spectrum of a statistical ensemble of such atoms with
the classical spectrum” (Darrigol 1992, p. 126; emphasis
original).

5. From Fedak and Prentis (2002, p. 337). Although Fedak and Prentis are not concerned with the historical question of what Bohr meant by “the correspondence princple”, their presentation of the physics behind the correspondence principle is pedagogically very useful.

6.
One substitutes
the Fourier series representation of the solution
*x*(*t*) to Newton's equation into the quantum condition
to obtain a “quantized” Fourier series representation of
the solution *x*(*t,n*) of the following form:

x(t,n) =∞

∑

k= 1C_{k}(n)cos(kω(n)t)

7. A complete survey of all important reactions to Bohr's correspondence principle is outside the scope of this encyclopedia entry. In the interest of space I have just focused on these three important commentators.

8. Both this and the preceeding Sommerfeld quotations are given in Darrigol (1992, p. 140).

9. For a discussion of how Heisenberg used the correspondence principle in constructing matrix mechanics see, for example, Bokulich 2008, pp. 90–93.

10.
Although one
of Beller's central arguments here is that reduction to observables did
*not* in fact play a role in Heisenberg's discovery of matrix
mechanics, this does not come across clearly in this particular
quotation of hers; hence I have amended her quotation with
“[inaccurately]” to reflect the point she is making in the
surrounding passages. For a further argument that reduction to
observables played no role in Heisenberg's discovery see Bokulich 2008,
pp. 90–92.

11. For a discussion of Heisenberg's closed theories see, for example, Bokulich (2004; 2006).

12. One of the chief motivations for the view that the general correspondence principle does not hold for quantum and classical mechanics is the measurement problem (see entry on Measurement in Quantum Theory)