Basil [Cardinal] Bessarion
Basil Bessarion (d. 1472) was, before Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499), the not so grey eminence responsible for the return of Plato in the Western world. Defending Plato’s reputation from the attacks of the arch-Aristotelian George of Trebizond—attacks which were founded in a long anti-Platonic tradition—Bessarion introduced Christianized readings of Plato’s dialogues, characterizing him as the pagan philosopher best suited to Roman theology. Bessarion’s argumentative strategy not only rescued Plato, but also opened the path to an anti-metaphysical approach to Aristotelianism, while revealing to the Latin world a wealth of knowledge from his Greek cultural heritage.
- 1. Life
- 2. Works
- 3. Reception
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Bessarion was born in Trebizond between 1399 and 1408, and baptized Basil. At a young age, he went to Byzantium, where he studied with John Cortasmenos (d. 1431/7). He changed his name to Bessarion when he became a monk in 1423. Pursuing his ecclesiastical career, Bessarion engaged in diplomatic activity in the service of the emperor John VIII Palaiologos. This put him in contact with the court of the Despot of Mistra, a city where he had the opportunity to deepen his philosophical and mathematical training under the guidance of Gemistos Pletho (d. 1454). The decisive year in the life of Bessarion was probably 1437, when he was made metropolitan of Nicea (hence the common epithet of Cardinal Nicenus) and left for Italy as member of the Greek delegation to the Council of Ferrara-Florence.
The Council was mainly devoted to an attempt at unifying the Latin and Greek Churches, which the Western European powers had made a condition for providing military support to Palaiologos as he attempted to fend off the Ottoman Turks. As a member of the Greek delegation, the young Bessarion was not eager to concede the main dogmatic point of disagreement between the two churches, which had led to their separation in the eleventh century: the problem of the place of the Holy Spirit in the Creed. According to the Greeks the Spirit proceeded only from the Father, while in the Roman formulation it also proceeded from the Son (Filioque). And yet, driven by his concern for the unstable political situation in Greece and finally convinced by the texts of the Church Fathers, Bessarion changed his mind and in April 1439 pronounced an oration (the Oratio dogmatica de unione), in which he advocated for agreement between Greek and Latin authors. In July 1439 Bessarion read the act of union between the Roman and the Greek Church in Florence. The same year, while he was in Greece for the last time, Bessarion was made Cardinal.
Bessarion would spend the rest of his life as one of the most important and influential members of the Roman Curia. He was selected for important diplomatic missions; for example, in 1450 Niccolò V sent him to Bologna as legato a latere. He took particular care of Greek rites abbeys, like those in Calabria, Messina, and Grottaferrata. He obtained a number of benefices, and in 1458 he was selected as protector of the Franciscan Order. In 1463 he also became Patriarch of Constantinople. He even came close to being elevated to the papacy at least twice, but apparently his beard—which for many symbolized his Greek origins—prevented him from garnering the necessary support. His activities as a cardinal were coupled with scholarly enterprises, which he undertook personally, and also sponsored as the patron of a circle of intellectuals who were in many cases Greek emigrés like him. Men like Theodore Gaza (d. 1476) and Niccolò Perotti (d. 1480)—and for a short period even his nemesis-to-be George of Trebizond (d. 1473)—were all part of the Cardinal’s entourage.
After the fall of Constantinople in 1453, Bessarion’s main interest was in rescuing the cultural heritage of his homeland, Greece, and he pursued this goal on both intellectual and political planes. From an intellectual point of view, Bessarion’s plan involved salvaging Greek texts which were until then unknown in Western Christendom and were generally rare (to the extent that in some cases they survive today only in the exemplars collected by the Cardinal). An avid lifelong book collector, Bessarion assembled a library in order to prevent the loss of these treasures: “without books, the tomb would cover the names of men, just as it covers their bodies”. Bessarion feared—indeed he was consumed with terror—“lest all those wonderful books, the product of so much toil and study by the greatest human minds, those very beacons of the earth, should be brought to danger and destruction in an instant”. Bessarion felt that Venice—a city with which he had entertained a long relationship and where he served as papal legate in 1463—could be a safe haven for his library and the books he donated around 1468 formed the first nucleus of the Biblioteca Marciana.
In addition to saving books from destruction, Bessarion had also a more practical political agenda for his homeland; he was among the most vocal advocates for the call for a new crusade to free Greece from Ottoman control. He was therefore engaged in several diplomatic missions, in Germany and then in Vienna, which aimed to convince Western rulers to fight the Turks. After an attempt in 1464 failed because of the death of Pope Pius II in Ancona, Bessarion worked until the end of his days to build support for a project that appeared more and more illusory with every passing year. It was on the way back from one of these diplomatic missions in 1472, this time to France, that Bessarion fell ill and died in Ravenna. He was interred in his titular Church, SS. Apostoli in Rome, where Antoniazzo Romano and Melozzo da Forlì had decorated a chapel in his name between 1464 and 1467.
Bessarion’s opera omnia include writings prepared for audiences in both the Byzantine and the Roman courts, such as orations and pieces of poetry. Of particular interest are the orations he addressed to Italian rulers, in order to convince them to join a crusade against the Turks (the Orationes ad principes Italiae contra Turcos, 1470). The De errore Paschatis, devoted to calculating the proper date of Easter, was probably composed with the assistance of Regiomontanus (1436–1476) and reflects Bessarion’s early interest in astronomy, which he had cultivated since the time of his training under Cortasmenos and Pletho. Bessarion also left behind a rich corpus of letters which he had never edited for publication. In addition to being the patron of important translations, he also himself translated Greek works into Latin, including Saint Basil’s De nativitate Domini, Xenophon’s Memorabilia, and Demosthenes’ First Olinthiac. However, Bessarion’s most important works, both as an author and as a translator, are focused on theology and philosophy.
2.1 Bessarion the Theologian
During his years in Greece, Bessarion adopted traditionalist positions, which included hostility toward the tenets of the Roman Church and Scholastic theology, which conflicted with the Hesicastic contemplative doctrines still dominant in Greece at that time. The experience of the Council of Ferrara-Florence led him to question and abandon some of his previous convictions. This is evident in the Refutationes of two writings, respectively by Maximus Planudes (13–14th c.) and Marcos Eugenikos (d. 1444, present himself at the Council), in which Bessarion defended the procession of the Spirit from the Son. In other writings, and particularly in the Encyclical letter to the Greeks, composed when he became Patriarch of Constantinople, he emphasized the primacy of the Roman Pontiff, inviting the Greeks to restore the union of the two Churches which had fallen apart after the Council. In On the Eucharist, which he translated from Greek to Latin and re-elaborated several times over more than two decades, Bessarion defended the epiclesis in the Orthodox Eucharist.
One of the most interesting theological writings by Bessarion, nonetheless, was prompted by a quarrel with George of Trebizond, which along with their disagreements over George’s translations of the Aristotelian Problemata and Ptolemy’s Almagestus, ultimately led to the deterioration of their relationship. When commenting on John 21:22 during a banquet, Bessarion had observed that the Latin text of the Vulgate Gospel was corrupted, and rather than reading “sic volo eum manere donec veniam, quid ad te?”, with reference to John, should have read “si volo eum manere donec veniam, quid ad te?”. George of Trebizond opposed the Cardinal, defending the Vulgate. Bessarion reacted with a short writing, largely based on the philological teachings of Nicholas Maniacutia (12th c.), which affirmed the necessity of verifying the Latin text of the Gospels against the original Greek. For Bessarion, rejection of George’s philological views went hand in hand with a dismissal of his millenarian beliefs: by defending the version containing “sic”, George had in fact shown that he accepted the idea that John was alive and awaiting the second coming of Christ. George’s millenarianism resurfaced—with wider and different implications—during the Plato-Aristotle controversy, which represented the crux of his dispute with Bessarion (see below).
2.2 Bessarion the Aristotelian
Bessarion’s reputation as a Platonist—mainly associated with his struggle against the arch-Aristotelian George of Trebizond—has at times obscured in modern scholarship his contribution to the Peripatetic tradition. By contrast, Bessarion’s Aristotelian expertise was widely recognized in the centuries after his death, when his translation of the Metaphysics was celebrated and reprinted several times, including in Bekker’s Corpus Aristotelicum (1831). Undertaken between 1446 and 1451 and dedicated to King Alfonso I of Naples, the translation was praised by Nicholas of Cusa for its excellence, and by Giannozzo Manetti for its clarity, which he attributed to the Cardinal’s decision to render the text ad sensum, rather than ad verbum.
In addition to his linguistic skills, Bessarion was aided in this enterprise by a deep knowledge of the Aristotelian works, cultivated since his Bildungsjahre, as a number of studies on the contents of his library have revealed. Bessarion was not only receptive to the Aristotelian tradition, but also to its recent Latin development, as represented by Scholasticism. Again, studies of Bessarion’s library have revealed this only apparently surprising aspect of his philosophical training: Thomas Aquinas in particular was a well-known author in Byzantium, mostly because of the Greek translations of the Summa contra gentiles and of the Summa theologiae made by Demetrios Kydones in the fourteenth century. Bessarion’s familiarity with these matters also influenced the In calumniatorem Platonis, where one of the Cardinal’s recurring arguments is that George of Trebizond was essentially ignorant of the traditions (Aristotelianism and Scholasticism) he claimed were superior to Platonism (see below).
Bessarion’s reputation as an expert in matters of Aristotelian and Scholastic philosophy is exemplified by his role as mediator in a quarrel over the future contingents between two theologians from Leuven, Henry of Zomeren and Peter de Rivo. From 1469 until his death, Bessarion played an important role in this controversy not only because he had once been a patron of de Zomeren himself, but also because the Cardinal had gathered around him several skilled Scholastic philosophers, including Francesco della Rovere (soon to be Pope as Sixtus IV) and Fernando de Cordoba, both of whom took part in the dispute. This was not the only circumstance in which Bessarion and members of his entourage took part in Scholastic disputes. For all these reasons, the case of Bessarion calls into question the simplistic opposition between Aristotelian Scholasticism and a purely Platonic Humanism dear to past scholarship, showing instead the blurred lines between these traditions (see, e.g., Monfasani 2016b). Even the In calumniatorem Platonis, a text consecrated even from its title to the defense of Plato, was no less the result of this ambiguous relationship between Humanism and Scholasticism, between Platonism and Aristotelianism.
2.3 The In calumniatorem Platonis
George of Trebizond’s resentment towards Bessarion was one of the driving forces behind the Comparatio philosophorum Platonis et Aristotelis (around 1458), in which George bitterly attacked Plato, a philosopher for whom the Cardinal’s preference was notorious. In three books George attacked Plato as ignorant, impious and vicious, while celebrating the perfect wisdom, piety and virtue of Aristotle. This kind of work, a comparison of the respective merits of Plato and Aristotle, especially in religious matters, was not uncommon in the Byzantine milieu, and Gemistus Pletho had composed his own comparatio at the time of the Council of Florence: Pletho’s booklet, written in Greek and therefore little read, celebrated the piety of Platonic philosophy in an attempt to expose the frail Aristotelian foundation of Scholasticism. George’s comparatio was by contrast intended to reinforce the role of Aristotle as authority of reference for Christian theology, to the extent of making the Stagirite aware of dogmas such as Trinity and occasionally placing him above even Thomas Aquinas. George’s comparatio had an apocalyptic subtext, made explicit in the final pages of the work, in which the coming of a fourth Plato—the second and the third were respectively Epicurus and Mohammed—is connected to the fall of the Byzantine empire, and characterized as a threat to the Latin West. The unnamed fourth Plato was possibly either Pletho or Bessarion himself.
George’s Comparatio was immediately perceived as dangerous by Bessarion, who needed to respond to it in order to preserve his reputation and that of Plato. If Plato was perceived as impious, so too was the Cardinal by association. With the help of several members of his circle, Bessarion produced over the course of about ten years his masterpiece: the In calumniatorem Platonis (Against the Slanderer of Plato).
The preparation of the work required several adjustments, both formal and theoretical. From a formal point of view, Bessarion realized that a work written in Greek, as the In calumniatorem initially was, would not have had the desired impact. He therefore translated the work into Latin, and in order to make it stylistically appealing engaged a skilled Latinist, his secretary Niccolò Perotti, to revise the text. Perotti’s re-elaboration made the work more accessible and elegant, though he occasionally struggled to do justice to the philosophical concepts contained within.
From a theoretical point of view, Bessarion was interested in a different kind of revision. Around 1457, when he was involved in a debate on nature and art in an epistolary exchange with Theodore Gaza, Bessarion had initially argued, like his master Pletho, that Plato and Aristotle were irreconcilably opposed. Yet, the Cardinal changed this position, after coming across a treatise—now lost—on the same topic by George of Trebizond: in his own subsequent booklet—the De natura et arte—destined to become the sixth book of the In calumniatorem Platonis, Bessarion embraced a conciliatory view modeled on the approach of late-antique commentator Simplicius. This interpretation—which is adopted throughout the In calumniatorem—cast Aristotle as a natural philosopher, and Plato as a theologian, thus explaining the apparent disagreement between the two authors as merely a question of different subject matter and of different levels of reality. This exegetical move allowed Bessarion to avoid openly attacking Aristotle, while implicitly maintaining the superiority of Plato, in particular as an external aid for Christian faith. It also allowed him to avoid contrasts with Aristotelians in the Roman curia, and to rely on Scholastic authorities such as Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas to meet his interpretative goals.
This arsenal of sources was crucial for exposing George’s scarce knowledge of Aristotelian philosophy and tradition, and therefore the unreliability of his praise of the Stagirite’s alleged piety: this problem is the subject of the third book of the In calumniatorem Platonis, which was composed at a later stage, mainly by the Dominican theologian Giovanni Gatti (d. ante 1484). Finally, by defending the agreement between Plato and Aristotle, Bessarion could also avoid any association with Gemistus Pletho, whose ambiguous religious reputation could have tainted the Cardinal.
The In calumniatorem is divided into six books: books one, two and four mirror the three books of George’s Comparatio.
Book one focuses on proving Plato’s wisdom, in spite of the elusiveness of his style and the dialogical structure of his works, against George’s claim that he was ignorant. After listing authors who praised Plato above Aristotle—mainly Cicero and Augustine, and several Fathers of the Church—Bessarion discusses the apparent absence of certain subjects in Plato’s works by invoking the Pythagorean practice of secrecy. Yet, the Cardinal also demonstrates that Plato was perfectly trained in all the disciplines, and offered an alternative encyclopedia of wisdom to the Aristotelian one.
The second book is the closest to the Byzantine tradition of the comparatio, and addresses the problem of Plato’s and Aristotle’s piety. Taking exegeses from authors like Plotinus, Proclus, the Ps.-Dionysius, Simplicius, and many others, Bessarion counter-analyzes the different subjects at the center of George’s invective, suggesting that Plato offered theorizations of decisive topics such as creation, soul and matter that were more akin to Christian dogma. Bessarion resolved embarrassing impasses in Plato’s philosophy, such as the doctrine of matter and the doctrine of the metasomatosis as presented in the Timaeus, by employing elaborate distinctions in the first case, and allegorical explanation in the second, in the process making them acceptable to Christian readers. Again, Bessarion repeatedly insists on the only apparent disagreement between Plato and Aristotle: by recovering another argument from Simplicius, he claims that the Stagirite attacked the words, and not the meaning of Plato’s doctrines, so as to preserve them from distortions and manipulations. Aristotle, Bessarion claims, did the same with Parmenides and Melissus, who spoke as theologians no less than Plato.
The third book, as indicated above, reviews a number of problematic issues in George of Trebizond’s treatment of Aristotle. Lighter topics—such as those related to sacrifices, and the reliance on poets and women—give way to more complex issues, such as Aristotle’s purported knowledge of Trinitarian dogma, his views on the immortality of the soul, and the place of providence in Peripatetic cosmology. Particularly important here are the chapters centered on the impossibility of the individual immortality of the soul in via Aristotelis, since it contrasts with the eternity of the world defended in On the Heavens. Bessarion, conversely, finds both Averroes’ and Alexander of Aphrodisias’ interpretations of the soul acceptable according to the Aristotelian tenets, despite their contrast with the Christian faith.
The fourth book deals with the problem of the virtue of Plato. Relying on Ps.-Dionysius, Bessarion offers a spiritual interpretation of love—as described in the Symposium and in the Phaedrus—in radical contrast with the sexual one postulated by George. In a different section Bessarion employs Herodotus’s comparative method to justify the common use of women advocated by Plato in the Republic. Additionally, Bessarion defuses George’s millenarian prophecy about the fourth Plato by arguing that the fall of the Greek Empire was due to an unescapable cyclical decline that the adoption of Plato’s doctrines would have forestalled. In the final chapter of the book, Bessarion rebukes George for his hypocrisy, since he praised Plato when he translated the Parmenides and the Laws.
George’s translation of the Laws is the primary target of the fifth book, which contains a list of the errors—actual and alleged—made by Trebizond in his edition. The goal of this chapter is to prove George’s incompetence in Platonic philosophy, which in turn further proves the unreliability of his accusations against Plato. Yet, a peculiar concern with the translation of Platonic works runs throughout the entire In calumniatorem: Bessarion was aware that Latin Europeans’ scarce knowledge of Plato might have inclined them to listen to George of Trebizond. Bessarion’s practice of offering in his work translations of Platonic texts, accompanied by alternative exegeses to those offered by George—was intended to correct this knowledge gap in the Western world. Bessarion also presented to his Latin readers Aristotelian authors, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias, who had until then limited circulation in the Latin world, but whose interpretations of Aristotle placed the Stagirite in contradiction with Christian dogma. These insertions were part of Bessarion’s strategy for exposing the religious limits of Aristotelian philosophy, so providing implicit support for the notion that Plato could serve as a better external aid for true faith, in the tradition of the Church Fathers, and of Greek theologians such as Eusebius of Cesarea and Theodore Metochites.
The sixth book of the In calumniatorem, the above-mentioned De natura et arte, is the exegesis of a passage from the second book of the Aristotelian Physics. Written before the other books composing the In calumniatorem, it is the only one in which Bessarion openly names George as his adversary and—as stated above—is the first work in which Bessarion expresses conciliaristic views about Plato and Aristotle. In this sense the De natura et arte represented a sort of “dress rehearsal” for the magnum opus applied to a single exegetical problem, which had nonetheless significant implications for crucial subjects (such as the doctrine of Ideas and divine causality in the world).
While George’s Comparatio appeared in print only posthumously in 1523 in a single defective edition, Bessarion took full advantage of the newly discovered technology of the printing press to reach his audience: it offered Bessarion another advantage over his opponent by ensuring wider circulation of the finished text. The In calumniatorem Platonis was printed in 1469 by Schweynheym and Pannartz. In the very the same year they also published Alcinous’s Didaskalikon, and Apuleius’s De deo Socratis and De Platone et eius dogmate, probably as part of a filo-Platonic editorial project orchestrated by the Cardinal. The In calumniatorem was subsequently reprinted twice, by the Aldine printing press, in 1503 and 1516. Both editions, which are not identical, included Bessarion’s own revisions to the 1469 version of the text.
Bessarion’s moderate Christianized reading of Plato provided authors like Marsilio Ficino and Francesco Cattani da Diacceto with powerful exegetical schemes, such as those taken from Plotinus, Proclus, and the Ps.-Dionysius (whose authenticity Bessarion defended even against members of his own circle). In the case of Ficino, these interpretive keys were magnified in an even more ambitious Christianization of Plato, in which the ancient philosopher was compared to Moses. A monumental work which included several lists of quotations and authorities, the In calumniatorem quickly became a repertory of material for sixteenth-century writers and philosophers. Sections like those on the Pythagorean secrets (I.2) enjoyed the attention of numerous readers, as did the letter of Lysis to Hipparchus. Louis le Roy (d. 1577) relied heavily on the second book of the In calumniatorem for his commentary to the Timaeus. Without citing his source, Symphorien Champier (d. 1540) recovered passages from the In calumniatorem in many of his works. Champier wanted to convince his friend Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples (d. 1536) of Plato’s utility for Christian religion and the In calumniatorem offered a wealth of material to support his efforts. Though he admired Bessarion’s translation of the Metaphysics, which he was the first to publish, Lefèvre d’Étaples—along with Guillaume Budé—nonetheless favored the position of George of Trebizond.
The composite nature of the In calumniatorem allowed for divergent interpretations of the nature of Bessarion’s work. In the In calumniatorem Bessarion himself oscillated between describing the text as an apology of Plato and as a comparison between Plato and Aristotle. Despite the fact that the In calumniatorem helped to disseminate the genre the comparatio Platonis et Aristotelis in the early modern period, the work was mostly perceived as an apology of Plato, and this made Bessarion an obvious target at the time of the anti-Platonic reaction led by the Jesuits at the end of the sixteenth century. Members of other orders, like the Franciscans and Augustinians, were nonetheless more sympathetic to the Cardinal, praising him and the In calumniatorem well into the seventeenth century. Bessarion also made an impact within the walls of the universities. His emphasis on Aristotle as a mere natural philosopher, in fact, provided Peripatetic professors with valid arguments against metaphysical interpretations of the Philosopher: for example, both Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525) and Francesco Vimercato (d. 1569), though arguing in favor of the mortality of the soul from different perspectives, were in debt to passages from the third book of the In calumniatorem Platonis.
The In calumniatorem Platonis was originally printed in 1469 in Rome (by Schweynheym and Pannartz), and then again in 1503 and 1516 in Venice (by Manutius). Both Venetian editions—which slightly differ from one another—contain revisions suggested by Bessarion himself. Ludwig Mohler’s modern edition is based on the text printed by Manutius. See
- Bessarionis In Calumniatorem Platonis Libri IV, Paderborn: Schöningh, 1927;
- Aus Bessarions Gelehrtenkreis: Abhandlungen, Reden, Briefe, Paderborn: Schöningh, 1942, pp. 92–146 (book VI),
respectively the second and the third volume of his Kardinal Bessarion als Theologe, Humanist und Staatsmann. Mohler printed the Greek original text as well, but completely omitted the fifth book of the work. A large selection of the In calumniatorem has been translated into Italian, on the basis of Manutius 1516 edition, but taking into consideration other emendations as well:
- Contro il calunniatore di Platone, Eva Del Soldato (ed.), with a bibliographical note by Ivanoe Privitera, Rome: Edizioni di Storia e Letteratura, 2014.
The sixth book of the In calumniatorem has been recently edited and translated into German:
- Über Natur und Kunst, Sergei Mariev, Monica Marchetto, and Katharina Luchner (eds.), Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 2015.
There also exists an Italian translation:
- La natura delibera—La natura e l’arte, Pier Davide Accendere and Ivanoe Privitera (eds.), Milan: Bompiani, 2015.
Giovanni Gatti’s Notata, which represents the basis for the third book of the In calumniatorem, will appear in a forthcoming critical edition by John Monfasani.
Bessarion’s theological works have been printed in the Patrologia Greca 161 (Paris 1866). The Oratio dogmatica de unione has been re-edited several times since:
- Bessarion Nicaenus, S.R.E. Cardinalis: Oratio dogmatica de unione, Emmanuel Candal (ed.), Rome: Pontificium institutum orientalium studiorum, 1958;
- Orazione dogmatica sull’unione dei Greci e dei Latini, Gianfrancesco Lusini (ed.), Naples: Vivarium, 2013.
Other works by Bessarion, including many of his letters, have been edited by Mohler in Aus Bessarions Gelehrtenkreis: Abhandlungen, Reden, Briefe.
- Bardi, Alberto, 2018, “Bessarione a lezione di astronomia da Cortasmeno”, Byzantinische Zeitschrift, 111(1): 1–38. doi: 10.1515/bz-2018-0001
- Baudry, Léon, 1950 , Querelle des futurs contingents, Paris: Vrin. Translated as The Quarrel over Future Contingents (Louvain 1465–1475), (Synthese Historical Library, 36), Rita Guerlac (trans.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic, 1989.
- Bianca, Concetta, 1999, Da Bisanzio a Roma. Studi sul cardinale Bessarione, Roma: Roma nel Rinascimento.
- Bisaha, Nancy, 2004, Creating East and West: Renaissance Humanists and the Ottoman Turks, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
- Cattaneo, Gianmario, 2015, “Note critiche all’epistolario greco del cardinal Bessarione”, Medioevo Greco. Rivista di Storia e Filologia Bizantina, 15(1): 51–61.
- –––, 2017, “Or. Chald. 88 des Places, il carteggio tra il cardinal Bessarione e Giorgio Gemisto Pletone e la philosophia perennis”, Studi Italiani di Filologia Classica, 14: 241–251.
- Charlet, Jean-Louis, 1987, “Traductions en vers latins de fragments grecs dans l’Epitome de N. Perotti et l’In calumniatorem Platonis de Bessarion”, Res Publica Litterarum, 10: 51–67.
- Coluccia, Giuseppe L., 2009, Basilio Bessarione. Lo spirito greco e l’occidente, Firenze: Olschki.
- Davies, Martin, 2013, “Some Bessarion Owners”, La Bibliofilía, 115(1): 41–52.
- De Keyser, Jeroen, 2011, “Perotti and Friends. Generating Rave Reviews for Bessarion’s In calumniatorem Platonis”, Italia Medioevale e Umanistica, 52: 103–137.
- Del Soldato, Eva, 2009 “Platone, Aristotele e il cardinale: il De natura et arte di Bessarione”, Rinascimento (Series 2), 48: 61–79.
- –––, 2011, “Sulle tracce di Bessarione: la fortuna cinquecentesca dell’In calumniatorem Platonis”, Rinascimento, series 2, 50: 321–342.
- –––, 2012, “Illa Litteris Graecis Abdita: Bessarion, Plato and the Western World”, in Marco Sgarbi (ed.), Translatio Studiorum: Ancient, Medieval, and Modern Bearers of Intellectual History, Leiden: Brill, pp. 107–122. doi:10.1163/9789004236813_009
- –––, 2017, “Exploiting Thomas: Renaissance Thinkers, Aquinas, and the Piety of Aristotle”, Divus Thomas, 120: 89–105.
- –––, forthcoming, Saving or Destroying a Philosopher: Aristotle in the Early Modern Period.
- Eleuteri, Paolo, 1994, “Una parafrasi di Bessarione alla Fisica di Aristotele”, in Θησαυρίσματα, 24: 189–202.
- Feld, M.D., 1982, “Sweynheim and Pannartz, Cardinal Bessarion, Neoplatonism: Renaissance Humanism and Two Early Printers’ Choice of Texts”, Harvard Library Bulletin, 30: 282–335.
- Fiaccadori, Gianfranco (ed.), 1994, Bessarione e l’Umanesimo, Naples: Vivarium.
- Fyrigos, Antonis, 2011, “Il cardinale Bessarione ‘traduttore’ della Summa contra gentiles di Tommaso d’Aquino”, in Rivista di studi bizantini e neoellenici, 48: 137–266.
- Garin, Eugenio, 1976, Rinascite e rivoluzioni: Movimenti culturali dal XIV al XVIII secolo, Bari: Laterza.
- Gutkowski, Andrzej and Emanuela Prinzivalli (eds.), 2012, Bessarione e la sua Accademia, Rome: Miscellanea francescana.
- Hankins, James, 1991, Plato in the Italian Renaissance, 2 vols., (Columbia studies in the classical tradition, 17), Leiden: Brill.
- Hladký, Vojtěch, 2014 The Philosophy of Gemistos Plethon: Platonism in Late Byzantium, between Hellenism and Orthodoxy, Farnham-Burlington: Ashgate.
- Karamanolis, George, 2002, “Plethon and Scholarios on Aristotle”, in Katerina Ierodiakonou (ed.), Byzantine Philosophy and its Ancient Sources, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 253–282.
- –––, 2011, “Basil Bessarion”, in Encyclopedia of Medieval Philosophy, H. Lagerlund (ed.), London: Springer, pp. 145–147. doi:10.1007/978-1-4020-9729-4_77
- Kraye, Jill and Martin Davies, 2011, “Cardinal Bessarion and Ludovico Saccano”, in Philippa Jackson and Guido Rebecchini (eds.), Mantova e il Rinascimento Italiano: Studi in onore di David S. Chambers, Mantua: Sometti, pp. 225–238.
- Labowsky, Lotte, 1967, “Bessarione”, in Dizionario biografico degli Italiani, Rome: Istituto dell’Enciclopedia Italiana, 9: 686–696. [Labowsky 1967 available online]
- –––, 1979, Bessarion’s Library and the Biblioteca Marciana: Six Early Inventories, Rome: Edizioni di Storia e Letteratura.
- Lamers, Hans, 2015, Greece Reinvented: Transformations of Byzantine Hellenism in Renaissance Italy, Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004303799
- Maier, Anneliese, 1982, On the Threshold of Exact Science: Selected Writings of Anneliese Maier on Late Medieval Natural Philosophy, Steven D. Sargent (ed. and trans.), Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
- Mariev, Sergei, 2016, “Bessarion, Cardinal”, in Encyclopedia of Renaissance Philosophy, Marco Sgarbi (ed.), Cham: Springer International Publishing, 1–10. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-02848-4_25-1
- –––, 2017, Neoplatonic Philosophy in Byzantium, in Sergei Mariev (ed.), Byzantine Perspectives on Neoplatonism, Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 1–30.
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