Ayn Rand (1905–1982) was a novelist-philosopher who outlined a comprehensive philosophy, including an epistemology and a theory of art, in her novels and essays. Early in her career she also wrote short stories, plays, and screenplays. Rand’s first and most autobiographical novel, We the Living (1936), set in the Soviet Union, was published only after many rejections, owing to widespread sympathy for the Soviet “experiment” among the intellectuals of the day. We the Living was quickly followed by the dystopian novel, Anthem (1938), written as “a kind of rest” from work on her next major novel, The Fountainhead (1943). The Fountainhead, also published after many rejections because of its individualism, and largely panned by critics, soon became a best-seller by word of mouth. The Fountainhead brought Rand international fame, and Atlas Shrugged (1957) sealed this fame. By 1958, Rand’s novels, increasingly philosophical, had won her ideas a sufficiently devoted following for her to form, in association with psychologist Nathaniel Branden (with whom she later broke), an official “Objectivist” philosophical movement, complete with journals and lecture courses. For all her popularity, however, only a few professional philosophers have taken her work seriously. As a result, most of the serious philosophical work on Rand has appeared in non-academic, non-peer-reviewed journals, or in books, and the bibliography reflects this fact. We discuss the main reasons for her rejection by most professional philosophers in the first section. Our discussion of Rand’s philosophical views, especially her moral-political views, draws from both her non-fiction and her fiction, since her views cannot be accurately interpreted or evaluated without doing so.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Ethics
- 3. Social-Political Philosophy
- 4. Aesthetics
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1.1 Ayn Rand and Philosophy
In Rand’s own words, her first and greatest love, her “life purpose”, was “the creation of the kind of world … that represents human perfection”, while her interest in philosophical knowledge was “only” for the sake of this purpose (Journal entry for 4 May 1946; in 1997: 479). Nevertheless, her interest in philosophical knowledge continued long after she had created this world in her magnum opus, Atlas Shrugged, her last work of fiction. In her non-fiction, Rand developed a conception of metaphysical realism, rationality, ethical egoism (rational self-interest), individual rights, laissez-faire capitalism, and art, and applied her philosophy to social issues. She wrote polemical, philosophical essays, often in response to questions by fans of Atlas Shrugged and The Fountainhead; lectured on college campuses; and gave radio and television interviews. In her own words, her philosophy,
in essence, is the concept of man as a heroic being, with his own happiness as the moral purpose of his life, with productive achievement as his noblest activity, and reason as his only absolute. (Rand 1957 : Afterword)
Capitalism, “the unknown ideal”, is for her the only political-economic system compatible with this philosophy because it is the only system based on respect for human beings as ends in themselves. The free-market libertarian political movement, though largely disowned by Rand, drew—and draws—great inspiration from her moral defense of the minimal state, that is, the state whose only raison d’être is protection of individual rights.
Whereas Rand’s ideas and mode of presentation make Rand popular with many non-academics, they lead to the opposite outcome with academics. She developed some of her views in response to questions from her readers, but never took the time to defend them against possible objections or to reconcile them with the views expressed in her novels. Her philosophical essays lack the self-critical, detailed style of analytic philosophy, or any serious attempt to consider possible objections to her views. Her polemical style, often contemptuous tone, and the dogmatism and cult-like behavior of many of her fans also suggest that her work is not worth taking seriously. Further, understanding her views requires reading her fiction, but her fiction is not to everyone’s taste. It does not help that she often dismisses other philosophers’ views on the basis of cursory readings and conversations with a few philosophers and with her young philosophy student acolytes. Some contemporary philosophers return the compliment by dismissing her work contemptuously on the basis of hearsay. Some who do read her work point out that her arguments too often do not support her conclusions. This estimate is shared even by many who find her conclusions and her criticisms of contemporary culture, morality, and politics original and insightful. It is not surprising, then, that she is either mentioned in passing, or not mentioned at all, in the entries that discuss current philosophical thought about virtue ethics, egoism, rights, libertarianism, or markets. (Readers may also find the entry on Nozick’s political philosophy to be of interest.) We present specific criticisms of her arguments and claims below, in the relevant sections of this entry.
1.2 Life and Work
Ayn Rand was born Alissa Zinovievna Rosenbaum, to a bourgeois Jewish family in St. Petersburg, Russia, on 2 February 1905. A witness to the Russian Revolution and civil war, Rand opposed both the Communists and the Tsarists. She majored in history, but the social science program in which she was enrolled at Petrograd State University included philosophy, law, and philology. Her teachers emphasized—as she herself later did—the importance of developing systematic connections among different areas of thought (Sciabarra 1995). Rand’s formal philosophical education included ancient philosophy (especially Plato and Aristotle), logic, philosophical psychology, Marxism-Leninism, and non-Marxist political thought. But she was evidently also exposed to Hegelian and Nietzschean ideas, which blossomed during this period (known as the Russian Silver Age), and read a great deal of Friedrich Nietzsche on her own. After graduating from Petrograd State University in 1924, an interest in screenwriting led her to enroll in the State Institute for Cinematography. On the literary side, she studied the great Russian novelists and poets, but fell in love with Victor Hugo, to whose influence she owes the “Romantic Realism” of her novels.
In 1925 Rand succeeded in obtaining permission to visit relatives in the United States; hating the Soviet system, she left with no intention of returning. After six months with relatives in Chicago, she made her way to Hollywood where, on her second day, a fortuitous encounter with Cecil B. DeMille led to a job as a script reader, and later as a screenplay writer. The next week she had another fortuitous encounter, this time with the actor Frank O’Connor, whom she married in 1929. She was married to him till his death in 1979. She adopted the pen name Ayn Rand to (it is thought) protect her family back in Russia, although she also told the New York Evening Post in 1936 that “Rand” was an abbreviation of her Russian surname.
Rand and her husband moved permanently to New York City in 1951, where she became involved with, and was influenced by, the circle of mostly New-York-based intellectuals involved in the revival of classical liberalism, such as the economic journalist Henry Hazlitt, the Austrian economist Ludwig von Mises, and the Canadian-American novelist, literary critic, and political philosopher Isabel Paterson. Rand also studied, and was a great admirer of, the Lockean philosophy of the American founding. Rand lived and worked in New York City until her death in 1982.
Rand holds that philosophy, like all forms of knowledge and achievement, is important only because it is necessary for living a good human life and creating a world conducive to living such a life. Philosophy supplies the most fundamental cognitive and normative abstractions which, respectively, identify and evaluate what is. Everyone, according to Rand, needs a philosophy and is guided by at least an implicit one (1982a: ch. 1). Her novels express her belief that if our philosophy is more or less correct, our lives will be more or less successful, if our philosophy is wildly off the mark, our lives will be disastrous. Philosophy thus has an urgent, practical importance. But unlike Marx, her philosophical and political antipode, Rand thinks that social change has to start with a moral revolution within each individual and the spread of the right ideas and ideals through rational discourse and the inspiration of art.
Rand’s ideal human being appears, in varying degrees of development, in all her novels; her ideal world appears in Atlas Shrugged. Her novels feature striking, complex plots with subtle psychological explorations of her characters’ emotions and thoughts, and philosophical reflections that rarely lose sight of the dramatic context. Like many famous Russian novelists, especially Dostoevsky, whom she recognized as a great psychologist, Rand also uses long speeches to lay out her philosophy, a device that has both its supporters and its detractors. She described Atlas Shrugged as a “stunt novel” and a murder mystery—the murder of the human soul by a collectivist culture. By “soul”, however, she meant not an immortal substance that survives the death of the body—she is not a dualist in any aspect of her philosophy—but the mind, or the human spirit that celebrates life on this earth. She took a familiar phenomenon and literary trope—a workers’ strike—and turned it on its head to show what happens when “the men of mind”—scientists, philosophers, industrialists, entrepreneurs, writers—the “prime movers” of a society—go on strike. It also purports to show how the wrong metaphysics can lead to the wrong ethics and thus to disastrous personal choices and a disastrous political and economic system, and how the right philosophy is needed for the rebirth of the soul and the rebuilding of the world. Her protagonists are not knights on white steeds rescuing damsels in distress, or swordsmen who can fight off a dozen enemies single-handed, but men and women in the mid-20th century industrial America of steel mills, skyscrapers, and glimmering highways: women who run transcontinental railroads and men who revolutionize architecture or (long before clean energy became a cause célèbre) build a motor powered by static electricity to produce limitless, clean energy. Her novels show the importance of striving to be the best we can be:
Do not let your fire go out, spark by irreplaceable spark, in the hopeless swamps of the approximate, the not-quite, the not-yet, the not-at-all. Do not let the hero in your soul perish, in lonely frustration for the life you deserved, but never have been able to reach. Check your road and the nature of your battle. The world you desired can be won, it exists, it is real, it is possible…. (Atlas Shrugged, 1957 : 983).
Her novels inspire readers because they present heroes of unbreached integrity, heroes who lead colorful and remarkable lives and succeed not in spite of, but because of, their uncompromising virtue. This estimate of their virtue is not, of course, shared by all: many readers find her characters wooden, her writing stilted, and her ethical and political views misguided.
Rand paid tribute to Aristotle, whom she considered the greatest of all philosophers, in the titles she gave to the three Parts of Atlas Shrugged (Non-Contradiction, Either-Or, A is A) and to one of the chapters (The Immovable Movers). While she differed sharply from Nietzsche on many issues, including rationality, free will, and individual rights, his influence is evident in her provocative, often aphoristic, point-counterpoint writing style, as well as in her “transvaluation” of traditional values and her powerful affirmation of life and joy and the spirit of youth. In the Introduction to the 25th Anniversary edition of The Fountainhead, she stated that the novel’s sense of life is best conveyed by a quotation from Nietzsche’s Beyond Good and Evil: “The noble soul has reverence for itself”. (For The Fountainhead’s partly sympathetic and partly critical engagement with Nietzsche’s ideas, see Hunt 2006.)
1.3 Metaphysics and Epistemology
Fundamental to Rand’s outlook—so fundamental that she derives the name of her philosophical system, “Objectivism”, from it—is a trichotomy among three categories: the intrinsic, the subjective, and the objective (ITOE: 52–54; Rand 1965: 13–23). An intrinsic phenomenon is one whose nature depends wholly on factors external to the mind; a subjective phenomenon is one whose nature depends wholly on the mind; and an objective phenomenon is defined, variously, as that which depends on the relation between a living entity’s nature (including the nature of its mind) and its environment, or as that which depends on the relation between a properly functioning (rational) mind and extramental reality. Commentators are divided over the best way to interpret Rand’s views on this issue.
Rand holds that there is a widespread tendency to ignore the third category or to assimilate it to the second, thus setting up a false dichotomy between the intrinsic and the subjective. On Rand’s view, many of the fundamental questions of philosophy, from the existence of universals to the nature of value, involve fruitless debates over the false alternative “intrinsic or subjective?” in cases where the phenomenon in question is neither intrinsic nor subjective, but rather objective.
If ethics is the branch of philosophy concerned with practice, then in a sense all of Rand’s philosophy is ethics, for Rand stresses “the supremacy of actual living over all other considerations”, and insists that philosophy needs to be “brought up to the realm of actual living”—adding “I say intentionally brought up to it, not down” (Journal entry for 15 May 1934, p. 72; in Rand 1997: 73). Consequently, Rand regularly concerns herself with the practical implications and social relevance not only of moral and political philosophy, but likewise of the seemingly more arcane strata of metaphysics and epistemology—as when she identifies errors in concept-formation as one of the roots of racism, or mind-body dualism as a root of the dichotomy between economic and personal freedom. This approach likewise reflects Rand’s emphasis on integrating each piece of information into the total context of one’s knowledge, and her consequent hostility to compartmentalization.
Rand’s conviction of the vital practical importance of abstract theory may help to explain the passionately polemical nature of her philosophical writing, which some readers find inspiring and others hyperbolic and off-putting—though Rand’s admiration for Nietzsche, as well as her having been educated in a Marxist-Leninist atmosphere, may also play a role. Rand also tended—perhaps owing in part to the same two influences—to regard philosophical errors as revelatory of the psychological flaws of their authors.
For a more in-depth presentation of Rand’s views on epistemology and metaphysics, please see the supplement on Epistemology and Metaphysics
2.1 What is Ethics, and Why do we need It?
is a code of values to guide man’s choices and actions—the choices and actions that determine the purpose and the course of his life. (1961b: 13)
Before we can decide which code of values we should accept, we need to ask why we need a code of values at all. Rand claims that no philosopher before her has provided a scientific answer to this question, and so none has provided a satisfactory ethics.
Rand starts by describing value or “the good”, in classical fashion, as the object of pursuit: “that which one acts to gain and/or keep” (1961b: 16). Thus, the concept of value presupposes the concept of “an entity capable of acting to achieve a goal in the face of an alternative”—and the basic alternative facing any living entity is life or death (1961b: 16). It is the conditional nature of life that gives rise to values, not just human values, but values as such. As she puts it:
Metaphysically, life is the only phenomenon that is an end in itself: a value gained and kept by a constant process of action. (1961b: 18)
Survival is the organism’s ultimate value, the “final goal or end to which all [its] lesser goals are the means”, and the standard of all its other values: “that which furthers its life is the good, that which threatens it is the evil” (pp. 16–17). The same, suitably modified, applies to human beings. Life is the standard and goal of all genuine human values, in the sense that all of them—from food to philosophy to fine art to ethics—must be explained and justified as requirements of human survival. “Ethics is an objective, metaphysical necessity of man’s survival” (p. 24). Thus,
[t]he standard of value of the Objectivist ethics … is man’s life, or: that which is required for man’s survival qua man, (1961b: 25)
the terms, methods, conditions and goals required for the survival of a rational being through the whole of his lifespan—in all those aspects of existence which are open to his choice. (1961b: 27)
To choose to live is to accept one’s “own life” as one’s “ethical purpose”.
Rand’s metaphysical arguments make two points central to her axiology and ethics. (1) Values are not just a human phenomenon but a phenomenon of life: life necessitates value. Thus, values are neither intrinsic properties of things, nor subjective, neither free-floating Platonic entities, nor mere matters of desire or preference, culture or time. Rather, values are relational or objective, dependent on the nature of the valuing entity and the nature of its environment. (2) An entity’s values are determined by the requirements of survival for entities of its kind, and ethics is a requirement of human survival.
Rand seeks to bolster this claim by arguing that the concept of value entails the concept of life:
epistemologically, the concept of “value” is genetically dependent upon and derived from the antecedent concept of “life”. (1961b: 18)
She supports it by asking us
to imagine an immortal, indestructible robot, an entity which moves and acts, but which cannot be affected by anything, which cannot be changed in any respect, which cannot be damaged, injured or destroyed. (1961b: 16)
Such an entity, she concludes, cannot have values.
Critics raise two objections to this argument. (i) It begs the question by assuming what is at issue, namely, that a non-living entity cannot be harmed (Nozick 1971). Unlike the robot of this example, real robots can be damaged or destroyed, not only by external events, but also by a failure to perform their functions well, that is, by their own actions or inactions. Hence they can, quite straightforwardly, be said to have values. (ii) Even if one were to accept that the concept of value entails the concept of life, one could consistently regard one’s survival as a means to a certain kind of life: a life of dedication to the greater glory of God, the common good, the environment, and so on (Mack 1984).
Rand’s naturalism, and her rejection of intrinsicism and subjectivism in favor of objectivism, anticipate recent naturalisms and echo Aristotle’s argument, against both the Platonist and the subjectivist, that “the good” must always be good-for-something. Her conception of the function of morality is notable both for its affinity to, and its difference from, Thomas Hobbes’ conception: like Hobbes, Rand sees morality as a necessary means to long-term survival, but unlike Hobbes, she does not see morality as requiring a contract or even as a fundamentally social affair. The need for morality, according to Rand, is dictated by our nature as creatures that must think and produce to survive; hence we would need morality even on a desert island. There is, however, no duty to survive; morality is based on a hypothetical imperative: if you choose to live, then you must value your own long-term survival as an ultimate end, and morality as a necessary means to it. (The much-debated question of whether the choice to live is a moral choice (Mack 1984, 2003; Long 2000; Rasmussen 2002, 2006) or a pre-moral one (Peikoff 1991; Gotthelf 1999; Smith 2000, 2006), and the implications of either position for the objectivity of Rand’s Objectivist ethics must, unfortunately, be left undiscussed.) If asked why the choice to live commits you to your own long-term survival rather than some other ultimate end (such as, for example, the greatest happiness of the greatest number (Nozick 1971), or becoming worthy of eternal life in heaven), the answer is: because any other ultimate end, if consistently adhered to, would lead to death.
Rand’s ethics is thus firmly teleological, this-worldly, and foundationalist. Virtue is “the act by which one gains/and or keeps” values in light of a recognition of certain facts (1961b: 27, 28); it “is not an end in itself … not its own reward” (1957 : 939). A fact central to a “scientific” ethics is that reason is the chief indispensable human tool of survival, and we exercise reason by choice. Hence rationality is the fundamental moral virtue, a virtue implicated in all the other virtues, including productiveness (Section 2.4 below).
Rand is widely credited by Objectivists (Peikoff 1991; Binswanger 1990, 1992; Kelley & Thomas 1999—see Other Internet Resources; Gotthelf 1999; Smith 2000, 2006) with having solved the is-ought problem by showing that morality is essential for long-term survival as a rational being, and so anyone who chooses to live ought to be moral (1961b: 19). But if the choice to live is itself a moral choice, in the sense that we ought to choose to live, then the argument proceeds from an ought to an ought, not from an is to an ought. On the other hand, if the choice to live is a non-moral choice (an idea that’s hard to reconcile with Rand’s general view that all significant choices are moral choices), then suicide can never be wrong, even if it is done for cowardly, irresponsible, or unjust reasons, a view that seems incoherent (King 1984 and Narveson 1998 criticize this and other aspects of Rand’s moral views). Even more problematically, if morality is needed only for long-term survival, and choosing suicide is not immoral, then a suicide-bomber does no wrong in killing innocent people.
Relatedly, how should we understand the idea of survival as a rational being—the life “proper to a rational being” (Rand 1961b: 27). Is a life proper to a rational being a necessary means, and only a necessary means, to literal, long-term survival? Or is such a life also, in part, the ultimate goal, something to be created and preserved for its own sake? Again, what are we to make of the many passages in which Rand states that the ultimate goal is one’s own happiness?
Rand herself thought that she had only one, consistent metaethical view: the ultimate goal is the individual’s own survival; the only way to survive long-term, i.e., over a complete life-span, is to live by the standard of man’s life as a rational being, which means: to live morally; and happiness is the psychological “result, reward and concomitant” (p. 32) of living thus. Many of Rand’s commentators follow her in holding that there is only one consistent view, while disagreeing on the right interpretation of it (Den Uyl & Rasmussen 1978; Machan 1984, 2000; Peikoff 1991; Bidinotto 1994—see Other Internet Resources; Hunt 1999; Kelley & Thomas 1999—see Other Internet Resources; Gotthelf 1999; Smith 2000, 2006). Others (Mack 1984, 2003; Badhwar 1999, 2001; Long 2000) argue that Rand’s writings actually allow of two, if not three, mutually incompatible views of the ultimate goal, and our task is to see which of these is the dominant or most plausible view. The three views are: survival, survival qua rational being, and happiness in the ancient Aristotelian sense of flourishing or eudaimonia. In the rest of Section 2, we will present the textual evidence for each of these views of the final goal, and the common objections to them, in turn.
2.2 Survival as the Ultimate Value
The survivalist view holds that just as literal survival is the ultimate value for other living entities, so it is for human beings (Kelley & Thomas 1999; Gotthelf 1999; Smith 2000). Survival is the source and final goal of all the actions of an entity, that which gives point to all its other values. For human beings, happiness, intellectual and artistic pursuits and rationality/morality are all means to survival. The vicious can “achieve their goals [only] for the range of a moment”, as evidenced by “any criminal or any dictatorship” (1961b: 26). Even those whose vice consists of imitating others rather than looting them live a precarious existence because they are likely to follow any destroyer who promises to be their savior (1961b: 25).
“Non-survivalists” make the following objections:
- The biological premise that survival is the ultimate goal of all living things is mistaken. Animals of many species risk their own death for the sake of reproduction, or for protecting their young or even their group. But even if survival were the ultimate goal of other species, it need not be ours.
- Even if our own survival needs were the source of all our values, it would not follow that survival must be the ultimate psychological and moral goal to which all our other values are merely necessary means. The genesis of x does not logically determine the ultimate goal of x. For example, the source of sexual desire is our reproductive capacity but, as Rand would agree, it doesn’t follow that we ought to satisfy our sexual desires only if we want to reproduce.
- The survivalist view that turns happiness into a mere means to survival entails, quite implausibly, that a long, unhappy life is better than a somewhat shorter but happy life, and just as good as a long and happy one.
- Many dictators, including the Pharaohs of the past and the Stalins and Maos of the 20th century, have survived by making elaborate plans to preserve their lives and their power by using a combination of terror, myth, and bribery. So have many common criminals. So even if morality enhances our chances of survival, it cannot be necessary for survival. Under some circumstances, such as in a dictatorial system, acting morally decreases our chances of survival, a point that Rand herself convincingly dramatizes in We the Living and Anthem.
- A survivalist ethics can support, at best, a bare-bones Hobbesian morality, not a virtue ethics. If Rand’s virtues were necessary for survival, the human species would have perished a long time ago, instead of expanding exponentially. Her rich and challenging picture of human life and virtue in her novels points to a richer and more challenging conception of the final end than mere survival.
- Many of Rand’s heroes, from Kira (We the Living) to Prometheus (Anthem) to John Galt (Atlas Shrugged), risk their lives for the sake of the values that make their lives worth living.
Like Hobbes, Rand rightly points out that if everyone or most people were to start preying on each other, then no one would survive for long—literally, and that generations of predators would end up destroying or driving away the producers, and thus destroying themselves (Anthem and Atlas Shrugged). But this doesn’t show that a few predators in a society of producers cannot survive by predation. Indeed, Rand herself sometimes acknowledges that evil people can survive by free-riding (“hitch-hiking”, as she calls it) on rational, productive people:
If some men attempt to survive by means of brute force or fraud … it still remains true that their survival is made possible only by their victims, only by the men who choose to think and to produce the goods which they, the looters, are seizing. (1961b: 25)
- Rand often says that the final end is survival proper to a human being (1961b: 26), or that the final end is happiness (1961b: 27, 30). Neither can be reduced to survival.
In “Man’s Rights”, Rand explains an individual’s right to his own life as
the freedom to take all the actions required by the nature of a rational being for the support, the furtherance, the fulfillment and the enjoyment of his own life. (1963b: 93 and 1967a: 321–22)
“Life” here is explicated in terms of not only continued survival but also the enjoyment proper to a human being.
For all these reasons, a more plausible interpretation of Rand’s view is that morality is required for surviving qua human being, that is, for living a life proper to a human being.
2.3 Survival Qua Man as the Ultimate Value
Just as the standard of value is survival qua human being, so the ultimate goal is one’s own survival qua human being. To accept this standard and goal is to accept (i) the three cardinal values of reason, purpose (or purposiveness) and self-esteem as not only “the means to” but also “the realization of one’s ultimate value, one’s own life” (1961b: 27), and (ii) the three “corresponding virtues” of rationality, productiveness, and pride. These values are means to one’s life insofar as they further one’s life as a rational being, and they realize it insofar as they express the value we place on our lives.
What it means to value survival qua human being turns on the relationship of the three cardinal values to the three virtues. Rand often states that virtue is only a means to value. But when she explains how the three cardinal values “correspond” to their three virtues, she does not provide a means-end analysis (Badhwar 1999, 2001). Thus, she says:
Productive work is the central purpose of a rational man’s life, the central value that integrates and determines the hierarchy of all his other values. Reason is the source, the precondition of his productive work—pride is the result. (1961b: 27)
The virtue of productiveness becomes the central example of purpose (one of the three cardinal values), reason (another cardinal value) becomes its source, and the virtue of pride becomes its result. Rand also defines rationality, which is “the basic virtue”, in terms of
the recognition and acceptance of reason as one’s only source of knowledge … and one’s only guide to action. (1961b: 28)
By this definition, being rational means valuing reason in thought, word, and deed, and realizing reason in one’s life means being rational: the virtue and the value entail each other.
This point generalizes to all the virtues and values. Further, since the (cardinal) values are both “the means to” and “the realization of one’s ultimate value” (1961b: 27), it follows that the (cardinal) virtues are also both the means to and the realization of one’s ultimate value: long-term survival qua human being. On this interpretation, to survive qua human being is none other than to lead a virtuous life in which one has realized one’s potential.
Both survivalists and eudaimonists, however, point out that this conception of the final end contradicts Rand’s oft-repeated claim that “Virtue is not an end in itself.…” In addition, eudaimonists make the following objections:
- Since even a long, virtuous life need not be a happy one, positing it as the final end contradicts Rand’s related claim that “Life is the reward of virtue—and happiness is the goal and reward of life” (1957 : 939).
- It contradicts Rand’s conception of the final end in her novels, where happiness is proclaimed as “the purpose, the sanction and the meaning of life” (1957 : 674).
Eudaimonists hold that the dominant and/or more plausible view expressed in Rand’s writings is that happiness—a happy life—is the ultimate value, where a happy life is understood as a life of emotional fulfillment in worthwhile goals and activities. Happiness in this sense necessarily involves virtue, but is not identical with virtue (Den Uyl & Rasmussen 1978; Machan 1984, 2000; Mack 1984; Badhwar 1999, 2001; Hunt 1999; Long 2000).
2.4 Happiness as the Ultimate Value
Happiness is the existentially and psychologically “successful state of life” (1961b: 27). As an emotion it is not simply a positive subjective state, as on some contemporary views, but an emotion that meets certain normative standards: “a state of non-contradictory joy—a joy without penalty or guilt”, achievable only by
the man who desires nothing but rational goals, seeks nothing but rational values and finds his joy in nothing but rational actions. (1961b: 32)
Happiness is also a form of life-affirmation:
the feeling of one’s blessing upon the whole of the earth, the feeling of being in love with the fact that one exists and in this kind of world. (1957 : 105–6)
Thus, happiness is an objectively worthwhile and emotionally positive state of life.
Rand holds that the pursuit of happiness is inseparable from the activity of maintaining one’s life through the rational pursuit of rational goals (1961b: 29, 32). A virtuous life is, thus, essential to happiness. It is also a shield against soul-wracking unhappiness. Just as even great misfortunes don’t throw Aristotle’s virtuous individual into misery, they don’t throw Rand’s heroes into misery. Even at the worst of times, the virtuous individual’s pain “only goes down to a certain point” (1943: 344), never touching the core of her being: the self-esteem that consists of the conviction that she is worthy and capable of happiness.
In keeping with their richer conception of the final end, Rand’s novels also employ a richer conception of virtue as an integrated intellectual-emotional character trait to think, feel, and act in certain ways, rather than simply as an act in light of a recognition of certain facts (Badhwar 1999, 2001). Her characters reveal their souls not only in what they say or do, notice or fail to notice, focus on or evade, on this or that occasion, but in their cognitive, emotional, and action dispositions, their style of being in the world. Their actions show not only an intellectual commitment to the right but a wholehearted “love of rectitude” (1957 : 512).
This basically Aristotelian view of virtue goes hand-in-hand with a basically Aristotelian view of emotions. Rand rejects the reason-emotion dichotomy as stemming, ultimately, from a false mind-body dichotomy. Emotions are neither raw feelings nor inherently irrational but automatized value-judgments:
estimates of that which furthers man’s values or threatens them … lightning calculators giving him the sum of his profit or loss. (1961b: 27)
Emotions provide instant guidance when circumstances do not permit reasoning everything out anew. But our emotions are only as good as our reason, because they are “programmed” by our reason. Hence they can only be corrected by conscious reasoning, and in a conflict between reason and emotions, one must always side with the former.
Eudaimonists argue that Rand’s vision of a virtuous and happy life in her novels can be understood only as a form of eudaimonism, even if she often makes statements inconsistent with this vision. The chief objection to eudaimonism is that, by defining a happy life partly in terms of virtue, it employs an unconvincing conception of happiness. The philosophical literature on happiness in this sense (usually called well-being) makes and answers many such objections (Badhwar 2014).
2.5 Virtues, Vices, and Egoism
The chief Objectivist virtues are rationality, integrity, honesty (with self and others), justice, independence, productiveness, and pride. Rationality,
one’s total commitment … to the maintenance of a full mental focus in all issues, in all choices … to the fullest perception of reality within one’s power, (1961b: 28)
is the basic virtue of which the other virtues are aspects or derivatives. The virtues are thus united or reciprocal. Each virtue is defined partly in terms of a recognition and whole-hearted commitment to some fact or facts, a commitment understood by the agent to be indispensable for gaining, maintaining, or expressing her ultimate value. For example, integrity is “the recognition of the fact that you cannot fake your consciousness” (1957 : 936), a recognition that is expressed in loyalty to one’s rational values and convictions, especially in the face of social pressures to surrender them (1961b: 28; 1964a: 52, 80); honesty is “the recognition of the fact that you cannot fake existence”, a recognition that is expressed in truthfulness in thought and speech (1957 : 936–37); and justice is
the recognition of the fact that you cannot fake the character of men as you cannot fake the character of nature, … that every man must be judged for what he is and treated accordingly…. (1957 : 937)
Conspicuous by their absence from Rand’s list of the cardinal virtues are the “virtues of benevolence”, such as kindness, charity, generosity, and forgiveness. Rand states that charity is not a major virtue or moral duty (1964b); likewise, presumably, kindness, generosity, and forgiveness. Whether, and how much, one should help others depends on their place in one’s rationally defined hierarchy of values, and on the particular circumstances (whether they are worthy of help, what the likely consequences are of helping them, and so on). The greater their value vis-à-vis one’s rational self-interest, the greater the help that one should be willing to give, ceteris paribus. What is never morally appropriate is making sacrifices, that is, surrendering something of value to oneself for the sake of something of less or no value to oneself. Thus, it can never be moral to knowingly risk one’s life for a stranger (unless, of course, one’s life is no longer worth living) or to court unhappiness for the happiness of another, whether stranger or friend. It is appropriate to help a stranger only in an emergency, and only when the risk to our own life or well-being is minimal (1963c: 43–45). This should not be taken to imply that helping a stranger is morally optional, regardless of the stranger’s plight. Indeed, people who are “totally indifferent to anything living and would not lift a finger to help a man or a dog left mangled by a hit-and-run driver” are “psychopaths” (1963c: 43–45) Rand makes even more concessions to “common sense morality” when she states that it’s good to help a neighbor going through a hard time till he can get back on his own feet, if we can afford to and if we have no reason to think that he is undeserving. Charity understood thus is a virtue because it is an expression of the generalized good will and respect that all normal people have towards others as creatures who share with them the capacity to value (1963c: 46–47). Nathaniel Branden tries to reconcile charity with a narrow act-egoism by declaring that the former stems from a species-identification with another, such that, in revering others, people “are revering their own life”. By acting charitably, people actualize this sense of kinship, without sacrificing their own well-being.
This last is true, but the desire to reduce all motivations to act-egoistic motivations leads Branden (and Rand and many Objectivists) to ignore the fact that charity is first and foremost profoundly other-regarding, prompted by another’s plight rather than concern for one’s own self-actualization. The same is true of trying to rescue a dog mangled by a hit-and-run driver, where the egoistic motivation is even weaker, since here there is no species-identification, but rather only a “genus-identification” with another sufferer.
At any rate, the argument from identification can also be used to justify charity towards strangers in non-emergency situations, for example, for those who are permanently disabled and unable to care for themselves (Badhwar forthcoming-b). Rand concedes as much in “What is Capitalism?” (1965) where she argues that people who are unable to work must rely on voluntary charity, thus implying that it is proper for those who can afford it to support strangers in non-emergency situations. And indeed, as recent scholarship has revealed, in her own life Rand was often extremely generous, not only towards friends and acquaintances, but also strangers.
The question arises why Rand thinks that charity, kindness etc. are not major virtues when they meet all the conditions of appropriateness: the recipient is worthy of help, one can afford to help, it is in one’s rational self-interest (or not contrary to it) to help, and so on. Perhaps Rand thinks that they are “minor” virtues because we are not obligated to act on them at all times, the way we are obligated to act justly and honestly at all times. A deeper reason, however, might be her conception of people as essentially agents rather than patients, doers rather than receivers, self-sufficient rather than dependent. Nevertheless, Rand’s view of the unity of the virtues dictates that, even if we are not obligated to act on charity, kindness etc. at all times, they are just as important to possess as the other virtues. Moreover, in keeping with her emphasis on the importance of goodwill towards others and “the benevolent universe premise”, Rand’s heroes are often extraordinarily (and almost always appropriately) kind and generous, not only to those they love but also to mere acquaintances, and even sometimes adversaries (Badhwar 1993b—see Other Internet Resources). Striking examples include, from The Fountainhead, Howard Roark’s unsought-for attempt to give hope and courage to Steven Mallory, the gifted young sculptor whose failure to get work has driven him to the verge of a spiritual and physical collapse; Roark’s unreproachful help to his erstwhile adversary, Peter Keating, when Keating falls on hard times; and from Atlas Shrugged, Dagny’s support to a heart-broken and despairing Cheryl Taggart who, in the past, has treated Dagny with scorn; and Hank Rearden’s generosity towards his exploitative family before he realizes their exploitativeness. By contrast, Rand’s villains lack genuine goodwill towards others and, thus, lack true kindness or generosity.
Just as rationality, a focus on reality, is at the heart of every virtue, so irrationality, evasion of reality (including self-deception), is at the heart of every vice. Rand’s villains are all master evaders motivated by a desire for power, social status, fame, or unearned wealth, and resentment of the good. They are “second-handers”—people whose primary relationship is to other people rather than to reality. Between the virtuous and the vicious are the “innocently wrong”, people who adopt wrong moral principles or make wrong choices, not through evasion but through an error of judgment (Rand does not explicitly recognize any moral category other than virtue, vice, and moral error, although her novels portray characters that do not easily fit into any of these categories). Hank Rearden, in Atlas Shrugged, is the great innocent living under a burden of unearned guilt because of his mistaken sense of honor and his charity towards a family interested only in manipulating and using him. Cheryl Taggart is killed by the too-sudden revelation that the man she loved and admired as the embodiment of her ideals is a fraud—and that the world is full of such frauds.
As already indicated, Rand justifies virtue in both instrumental and non-instrumental terms, though without distinguishing between them. The instrumental arguments show the existential and psychological rewards of virtue and costs of vice. Virtue creates a sense of inner harmony and enables mutually beneficial interactions with others. Evasiveness, by contrast, traps one in a “tangled web” of rationalizations and pretenses. The evader who deceives others is either eventually caught, or lives in fear of being caught, becoming dependent on others’ unconsciousness. He is “a fool”, says a character in Atlas Shrugged, “whose source of values is the fools he succeeds in fooling” (1957 : 945). Further, like Sartre, Rand holds that no evasion is completely successful, because the truth constantly threatens to resurface. Hence, the evader’s “diseased soul” is in a state of constant inner conflict and anxiety as he tries to suppress his awareness of uncomfortable truths while maintaining his hold on others. His lack of integrity and of esteem for reality results in a lack of self-love or self-esteem and, indeed, of a solid self. (It is noteworthy, however, that her portrayal of Gail Wynand in The Fountainhead is closer to Aristotle’s portrayal of the vicious man in Book III of the Nicomachean Ethics as someone who is “unconscious of his vice”, than to her own stated view of the evader.)
These views are familiar from the history of philosophy, but many readers find their expression in Rand’s novels to be of unusual psychological depth and conviction. Nevertheless, the views are subject to the well-known objection that the complexity and variability of human psychology and society allow only “for the most part” generalizations about the existential and psychological benefits of virtue or costs of vice. Thus, it is possible for a small injustice to lead to great rewards, especially since others are willing to shrug off or forgive occasional transgressions. It is also possible for poor introspection, forgetfulness, or self-acceptance to allow one to evade something without any need for supporting evasions or damage to one’s self-esteem. Again, even if every wrongdoing carries psychological costs, these might sometimes be outweighed by the long-term costs of doing the right thing (as Rand herself suggests in her portrayal of the embittered Henry Cameron and Stephen Mallory in The Fountainhead).
The non-instrumentalist justification of virtue in Rand’s novels is largely immune to these objections (though subject to the objections noted in 2.4 above). To compromise morally is, necessarily, to compromise one’s own (objectively conceived) happiness, because no existential loss can compare to the loss of moral integrity. Rectitude is partly constitutive of genuine happiness because it expresses the right relationship to reality: to existence, to oneself, and to others. For the same reason, it is partly constitutive of a self worth loving, an ideally human or rational self. Like Plato and Aristotle, Rand argues that virtue necessarily creates inner harmony and certitude. Any value gained at the price of rectitude is only the simulacrum of genuine value. In a variety of conceptually interconnected ways, then, virtuous individuals are necessarily better off than those willing to take moral short-cuts. In its structure and much of its content, Rand’s ethical egoism is thus of a piece with the egoism of ancient eudaimonistic theories.
An objection often levied against egoistic theories is that they give the wrong reason for acting in other-regarding ways: justly, kindly, etc. My act is not really just if I give you your due because it is good for me rather than because you deserve it; it is not really charitable if I help you for my own benefit rather than yours. A common reply is that the egoist’s justification is egoistic but not her motivation, a reply that itself invites the charge of moral “schizophrenia”. Rand does not address the “wrong-reason” objection, but it’s unlikely that she would accept this dichotomy between justification and motivation. So insofar as her view is instrumentalist and act-egoistic, the problem remains. The non-instrumentalist strand in her theory, however, implies that the objection itself is mistaken, because giving you what you deserve/merit is partly constitutive of my rational interests; there is no conflict between your rational interests and mine (cf. 1964a: 57–65).
Rand regards goodwill towards others, or a generalized benevolence, as an offshoot of proper self-love, with no independent source in human nature. There is only one alternative to being rationally self-interested: sacrificing one’s proper interests, either for the sake of other people (which she equates with altruism) or for the sake of the supernatural (which she calls mysticism) (1982a: ch. 7). Kant’s ethics is a secularized mysticism insofar as it rests on categorical commands and duty for duty’s sake, which is to say: regardless of any earthly desire or interest (1970). An altruistic ethics equates right action with self-sacrifice for the sake of others’ good and immorality with “selfishness”, while saying nothing about the standard of the good (“Introduction”, 1964a: iii; 1974). It thus fails to answer the prior question of what code of values we should follow and why, and provides no motivation to be moral other than guilt over “selfishness”. When taken to its logical conclusion, altruism does not simply tell us that it is “selfish” to pursue our own desires, but also that it is “selfish to uphold… [our own] convictions, … [that we] must sacrifice them to the convictions of others” (Rand 1957 : 943; Galt’s Speech, Rand 1961a: 142). In foreign policy, altruism is used to justify and gain support for America’s intervention in other countries (1966a). Altruism is also the reason why so many sympathize with, or even praise, bloody dictatorships that proudly proclaim that the sacrifice of the individual is a necessary and noble means to the goal of the collective good (Rand 1966a).
As a moral code, altruism is impractical, because its requirements are contrary to the requirements of life and happiness, both the agent’s and other people’s. As such, it is also profoundly immoral. Altruism leaves us without any moral guidance in our everyday lives and gives morality a bad name.
What, then, is the psychological explanation for the widespread equation of altruism with morality? Rand suggests various explanations reminiscent of Nietzsche’s analysis of the psychology of altruism. The theorists and preachers of altruism are motivated largely by a desire to control and manipulate others by playing on their guilt. Those who accept their teachings typically do so either because of guilt over their own superior achievements, or because, lacking any “intellectual integrity, love of truth…or a passionate dedication to an idea”, they have nothing much worth saving, and so do not mind sacrificing themselves (“Selfishness Without a Self”, 1973b; 1982a). Some altruists are altruists because their mentalities are still frozen in a tribal past when survival required the sacrifice of some for the sake of others (1973b). Rand herself rejects a zero-sum picture of human relationships, so long as everyone in the relationship acts rationally.
Rand’s defense of “selfishness” and rejection of altruism are part of the reason both for her popularity with the general reader, and her unpopularity with philosophers and other intellectuals, although some would no doubt agree with her rejection of abject self-sacrifice and her recognition of proper concern with the self as moral (Falk 1963; Gilligan 1982; Hampton 1993; Badhwar 1993a). The general reader who responds positively to Rand’s work finds, for the first time, a moral justification for pursuing a life of her or his own and a liberation from “unearned guilt”. The philosopher who responds negatively to her work finds many biased and simplistic interpretations of philosophers and philosophical doctrines, including her claim that she is the first to consistently defend a morality of rational self-interest, all other philosophers having defended either altruism or mysticism (Pojman 1995). Her critics also challenge her equation of altruism with abject self-sacrifice (Rachels 2000, Flew 1984), and her claim (explained below) that there is no conflict between people’s rational interests (Flew 1984). An adequate interpretation of her views, however, requires attention both to the fact that, in the absence of special obligations created by bonds of love, contract, or family, she regards others’ needs as making no claim on us, and to the fact that she is an uncompromising defender of justice, honesty, and respect for others as ends in themselves.
3. Social-Political Philosophy
3.1 Rights, Capitalism, and the Trader Principle
Rand’s moral society is a society of independent individuals who respect each other’s natural rights to life, liberty, and property, and who trade value for value, materially and spiritually. They live, in her words, by “the trader principle”. Individual (natural) rights and the trader principle are both dictated by the fact that, as rational, independent beings, we need to think and act for our “proper survival” (1961b: 31). Both are required by respect for individuals as ends in themselves, not mere means to others’ ends.
“Rights” are a moral concept—the concept that provides a logical transition from the principles guiding an individual’s actions to the principles guiding his relationship with others—the concept that preserves and protects individual morality in a social context—the link between the moral code of a man and the legal code of a society, between ethics and politics. Individual rights are the means of subordinating society to moral law. (1963b: 92).
These natural rights are basically rights to actions, not to things or outcomes, and they can be violated only through the initiation of force or fraud. Hence, all natural rights are negative, that is, claims on others’ non-interference, and not claims on them to provide one with certain goods or outcomes. The fundamental right is the right to life: the right to take the actions necessary for sustaining the life proper to a human being.
The right to life means…the freedom to take all the actions required by the nature of a rational being for the support, the furtherance, the fulfillment and the enjoyment of his own life. (Such is the meaning of the right to life, liberty and the pursuit of happiness.). (1963b: 93)
The right to liberty is the right to act (including to write and speak) on one’s judgment; the right to the pursuit of happiness is the right to pursue goals for one’s own fulfillment; the right to property is “the right to gain, to keep, to use and to dispose of material values” (1963b: 94). Like the mind-body dichotomy, the common dichotomy between “human rights” and the right to property is a false one, because to own one’s life is to own one’s actions and their fruits (1962b: 91). Just as there is a causal and logical connection between the virtues, so there is between these rights: a government that violates human rights also violates property rights. Thus, for example, in violating the right to freedom of expression by banning “obscene” speech on TV, the government violates the property right of the owners of the TV station to use their property as they see fit. Like other libertarians, both right (market) and left (egalitarian), Rand opposes state regulation of morality, as well as forced service to the state, whether military or civilian. She criticizes both conservatives and liberals (as these terms are understood in American politics) for wanting government to control the realm they regard as important: the spiritual or moral realm in the case of conservatives, and the material or economic realm in the case of liberals (1981b). Both sides thus betray a lack of understanding of the fact that human beings need to be free in both realms to be free in either.
There is much that is of great value here, especially Rand’s insight that we would not have rights if we did not need them for our survival and happiness (Miller & Mossoff forthcoming; Badhwar forthcoming-a). But critics point out that grounding all rights in the right to take the actions necessary for “proper survival” entails that one has no right to take actions that are contrary to proper survival: blindly following a guru instead of thinking for oneself, living off others because one prefers the life of a couch potato to fending for oneself, wasting one’s property instead of using it wisely, or, most obviously, committing suicide (Mack 1984; Zwolinski forthcoming; Badhwar forthcoming-a). Yet the freedom to do only that which is morally good or rational is not a freedom at all. But this is not Rand’s consistent position. For example, she also says that, as fallible creatures, human beings
must be free to agree or disagree, to cooperate or to pursue their own independent course, each according to his own rational judgment. (1965: 17)
Some commentators rely on this statement to argue that Rand is not restricting rights to actions that are necessary for proper survival (Miller & Mossoff forthcoming). But it would be more accurate to say that, while this position is the one that is compatible with her deep-seated commitment to liberty and a minimal government, she also often makes statements that entail the opposite.
Rand argues that the only just social-political system, the only system compatible with our rational nature and with the right of individuals to live for their own sakes, is capitalism (1965, 1967b), that is,
laissez-faire capitalism—with a separation of state and economics, in the same way and for the same reasons as the separation of state and church. (1961b, 1964a)
State regulation of the market, she argues, is responsible for corrupting both state and market institutions, just as political regulation of religion (or religious regulation of politics), wherever it exists, corrupts both state and religious institutions. Regulation creates the opportunity for the trading of favors between politicians and religious leaders, and politicians and businesses. Atlas Shrugged offers a complex and compelling depiction of the economic, political, and moral corruption spawned by “cronyism” between government and business. Laissez-faire capitalism is “the only [social] system that bans force from social relationships” domestically and abroad, because the trader and the warrior are antagonists (Rand 1966a). Rand’s conception of capitalism is, thus, more radical than the mainstream conception, and her defense of it significantly different both from the utilitarian defenses given by most economists, and the religious defenses given by many conservatives (see Den Uyl & Rasmussen 1984b; Machan 1984). She does, of course, praise capitalism (or semi-capitalism) for creating widespread prosperity, but this feature is itself explained only by the fact that it leaves individuals free to produce in peace. In Atlas Shrugged, Rand distinguishes between the few business people who earn their money through honest effort, without seeking favors from the government, and the vast majority who are members of “the aristocracy of pull” (“crony capitalists”, in contemporary terminology) and get rich only through such favors, a situation that she thinks prevails, and has always prevailed, in the real world (Rand 1964c). She holds that for a short period in the nineteenth-century America came closer to a laissez-faire system than any other society before or since, but that capitalism remains an unknown ideal. Some critics complain, however, that in her non-fiction (1961c) Rand does not always recognize the aristocrats of pull in the real world—business leaders who lobby politicians for subsidies for themselves and restrictions on their competitors (Rothbard 1968; Johnson 2006).
Rand rejects the criticism that unregulated, laissez-faire capitalism would lead to a concentration of power in a few hands and undermine equality of opportunity because laissez-faire capitalism requires the rule of law, a well-defined system of property rights, freedom of contract, and, as a corollary, a government that abstains from all favoritism.
Rand holds that there is no conflict between one person’s rational interests and another’s, hence that respecting other people’s rights is perfectly compatible with advancing or preserving one’s own interests. Is it true, however, that rational interests cannot conflict? It seems that whenever two people have an interest in one good, for example, a job, and are equally qualified to have it, their rational interests conflict, Perhaps what Rand has in mind is that rational interests don’t necessarily conflict, that is, that it is not in their nature to conflict. Their conflict is due to external factors, such as only one job for two qualified people. But is such conflict compatible with rights in an egoistic framework? And can rights be defended within an egoistic framework? Critics object that respect for others’ rights cannot be justified only as a means to one’s ultimate value, whether this be survival or happiness (Mack 1984; Flew 1984). For under perfectly realistic scenarios, one’s ultimate value can require one to violate another’s right to life or property. In her justification of rights we see the same unresolved tension between the instrumentalist strand and the deontic strand that we do in her justification of morality in general (Mack 1984, 2003). The eudaimonist strand in Rand’s justification, however, allows her to respond that respect for others’ rights expresses our recognition of the fact that others are ends in themselves, a recognition that is required by justice, and that justice, along with the other virtues, is necessary for leading a happy life.
Rand defines government as
an institution that holds the exclusive power to enforce certain rules of social conduct in a given geographical area. (1963a: 125)
A proper government is
the means of placing the retaliatory use of physical force under objective control—i.e., under objectively defined law. (1963b: 128)
Such a government is minimal, limited to protecting us from criminals and foreign aggressors, and enforcing individual rights and contracts, with the help of the armed forces, police, and objectively defined civil and criminal laws and courts. Someone who violates his contracts, or engages in fraud, is guilty of the “indirect” use of force, in that he obtains a value from another without that person’s consent (1963a: 111). Accordingly, the government may use or threaten force only in retaliation against those who initiate or threaten force directly or indirectly. A government that tries to enforce the brother’s keeper principle—“from each according to his ability, to each according to his need”; or that drafts citizens into the armed services or “public service”; or that tries to make them more virtuous, educated, well-mannered, healthy, or wealthy, violates rights. Statism in all its forms, from unlimited democracy to a mixed economy to dictatorship, is at odds with our status as independent, rational beings, as ends in ourselves. Statism also destroys ability and fails to fulfill anyone’s needs for long, because “[t]o deal with men by force is as impractical as to deal with nature by persuasion” (1973a: 32). The fountainhead of all progress is the human mind, and the mind does not function well when forced.
In Atlas Shrugged Rand depicts her utopia, Galt’s Gulch, as a “voluntary association of men held together by nothing but every man’s self-interest”, without any formal organization (1957 : 690). There is a judge to arbitrate disagreements, but there has never been any need for arbitration. Galt’s Gulch is, thus, an anarchist society, although Rand never calls it that. In “The Nature of Government”, however, Rand rejects anarchism as irrational and unworkable because, she says, it is incompatible with a single, objective system of law and, thus, with rights and peaceful cooperation (1963a). Anarchist critics, such as Roy Childs (1969 ) and Murray Rothbard (1978), have argued that a territorial monopoly on law and force (government) is not necessary, because people can establish a just and effective legal system in a competitive market of security providers (see Long and Machan 2009). The Law Merchant, a body of law established and enforced in private courts by the merchants of various countries, illustrates the possibility of an effective voluntary legal system. Further, a government is incompatible with Rand’s own principle of the non-initiation of force, a principle she regards as the linchpin of a moral society (Long 2013; cf. Cox 2013a and 2013b).
The trader principle states that a voluntary, mutually beneficial exchange between independent equals is the only basis for a mutually respectful and rational relationship (1961b: 31). It is also the only basis for a peaceful relationship among countries: “the trader and the warrior have been fundamental antagonists throughout history” (1966a: 38).
The trader principle applies to emotional relationships as well. To love or admire someone is to “pay” him for the pleasure one derives from his virtues (1961b: 31)—or, Rand might say in the case of love for a small child, from his personality. It would seem, however, that the trade between parent and child is unequal, given that the child receives both pleasure and material support from the parent. And it is unclear how the trader principle applies at all when a severe disability renders a beloved child or spouse a source of pain rather than pleasure.
If feminism is the view that women are, and ought to be recognized as, men’s intellectual, moral, sexual, and political equals, then the Objectivist philosophy of human nature is inherently feminist, since it applies equally to all human beings, regardless of gender (or race) (N. Branden 1999). Decades before it was considered acceptable for women to lack “maternal instincts” or pursue careers, Rand created heroines who lack the first and pursue the second, free of guilt or self-doubt. Kira (We the Living) wants to be an engineer, and Dagny (Atlas Shrugged) runs Taggart Transcontinental, the largest and most successful transcontinental railroad in the country. None of Rand’s heroines sacrifices her interests, intellect, or principles for the man or men in her life. One literary critic argues that Dagny is the first, and perhaps only, epic heroine in Western literature because of the grandness of her vision, her courage and integrity, her unusual abilities, and her national importance (Michalson 1999). Rand’s depiction of her heroines’ enjoyment of sex and their freedom from all merely conventional norms about sex anticipates the sexual liberation movement of the 20th century by at least 30 years. In all three novels, it is the heroine who has the power to choose which of the men who love, admire, and desire her (and only her) she will have. Rand was also an ardent champion of a woman’s right to control her own reproductive choices (1968a, 1981).
Her relationship to the feminist movement, however, was more complex. Although she praised Betty Friedan’s The Feminine Mystique, mainstream feminism’s collectivism and emphasis on women as victims later led her to reject feminism as such. Many theorists argue that Rand’s work, especially Atlas Shrugged, upholds important feminist ideals, even as it succumbs to some anti-feminist tendencies that contradict her individualistic ethics (e.g., Gladstein 1978, 1999; B. Branden 1999; Presley 1999; Sheaffer 1999; Taylor 1999). Many others regard her and her work as plainly anti-feminist, with Susan Brownmiller even calling her “a traitor to her own sex” (Brownmiller 1975). One criticism takes aim at the individualism of Rand’s ethics and politics, which rejects any special government help for women or discrimination against men (e.g., Harrison 1978). Another objects that Rand has internalized a masculine conception of human nature and virtue, and then created her ideal woman in light of this conception (Brownmiller 1975; Glennon 1979). This may be responsible for Rand’s puzzling (and offensive) view that the essence of femininity is to hero-worship (not men, but) masculinity, while insisting (as her novels depict) that women and men are inherently equal and that the ideal romantic relationship is between moral and intellectual equals (1968b; cf. Brown 1999). At least as offensive to many are the violent sex scenes in her novels, especially the infamous scene in The Fountainhead that many regard as rape, where Howard Roark has sex with Dominique in spite of her resistance.
Those who reject the charge of rape argue that in the 1940s and 50s, when Rand wrote her novels, it would have been seen as rough sex rather than non-consensual sex (McElroy 1999; Sheaffer 1999). That Rand herself thought of this scene as consensual is shown a few pages later, when she writes: “They had been united in an understanding beyond the violence, beyond the deliberate obscenity of his action” (1943: 218). And in letters to disturbed readers in 1946 and 1965, Rand denied that the scene is “actual rape” which, she stated, is “a dreadful crime”, a “vicious action and a violation of a woman’s rights” (Rand 1995a). On the other hand, she also depicts Dominique exultantly telling herself that she’s been raped. McElroy wonders if having her heroine call it rape is just another instance of Rand’s desire to provoke and shock the reader (McElroy 1999), as when she uses “selfishness” to mean “rational self-interest”.
Rand holds that our actions need guidance by a vision of the fundamental nature of the universe and of the efficacy of human thought and activity—a vision that can be grasped directly rather than requiring the conscious repetition of long chains of abstract reasoning. The chief function of art is to meet this psychological need by expressing abstract conceptual values and metaphysical truths in concrete perceptible form. Art, according to Rand, constitutes a selective, stylized re-creation of reality, with the principle of selection being the artist’s “sense of life”, a set of implicit “metaphysical value-judgments”, i.e., judgments about what is fundamentally significant about the world and our place in it. (There is controversy among Rand scholars as to whether what is re-created in art is certain elements of reality or reality as a whole, i.e., a “microcosm”, as well as how and whether the concept of re-creation applies to apparently non-representational forms of art: Torres and Kamhi 2000; Bissell 2004.) Both the artist’s creative work and the audience’s emotional responses to it are driven by their senses of life, that is, the worldviews they have “formed by a process of emotional generalization … a subconscious counterpart of a process of abstraction” (1966b: 27). The role of art in sustaining us psychologically by providing a concretization of our most fundamental values is a frequent theme in Rand’s fiction as well, especially The Fountainhead.
While art can be used to convey information or to advocate a position, such functions are secondary to its chief task: providing an object whose mere contemplation brings spiritual fulfillment. Hence Rand does not regard her own novels primarily as vehicles for her philosophy, though of course they are that inter alia. Given her own worldview, Rand favors literature with a strong plot as a way of expressing purposeful human action in a world of causal regularity, and stories involving value-conflicts as a way of expressing the importance of free choice; hence her preference for romantic (as opposed to, e.g., naturalistic) literature. But Rand holds that it is possible to evaluate an artwork’s aesthetic value simply in terms of its success in conveying a concretization of the artist’s sense of life, whether or not one shares the values and judgments so conveyed.
Works by Rand
- 1943, The Fountainhead, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
- 1953, Anthem, (1st ed. 1938), Caldwell, Idaho: Caxton Printers.
- 1957 , Atlas Shrugged, New York: Random House; 1992, 35th Anniversary edition, New York: Penguin Books USA Inc.
- 1959, We the Living, (1st ed. 1936), New York: Macmillan.
- 1961a, For the New Intellectual: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand, New York: New American Library.
- 1961b, “The Objectivist Ethics”, in Rand 1964a: 13–39. [Rand 1961b available online]
- 1961c, “America’s Persecuted Minority: Big Business”, in Rand 1967a: 44–62.
- 1962a, “The ‘Conflicts’ of Men’s Interests”, Objectivist Newsletter (August), Rand 1982b, reprinted in Rand 1964a: 57–65.
- 1962b, “The Monument Builders”, Objectivist Newsletter (December), Rand 1982b, reprinted in Rand 1964a: 100–107.
- 1963a, “The Nature of Government”, Objectivist Newsletter (December), Rand 1982b, reprinted in Rand 1964a: 125–134, and Rand 1967a: 329–337.
- 1963b, “Man’s Rights”, Objectivist Newsletter (April), Rand 1982b, reprinted in Rand 1964a: 92–100, and Rand 1967a: 320–328. [Rand 1963b available online]
- 1963c, “The Ethics of Emergencies”, Objectivist Newsletter (February), reprinted in Rand 1964a: 43–49.
- 1963d, “Collectivized ‘Rights’”, Objectivist Newsletter (June), reprinted in Rand 1982b, reprinted in Rand 1964a: 118–124.
- 1964a, The Virtue of Selfishness: A New Concept of Egoism, New York: New American Library. Contains Rand’s main statement of her ethics originally delivered as a lecture, and essays by Rand and Nathaniel Branden published in The Objectivist Newsletter (Rand 1982b) between 1961 and 1964.
- 1964b, “Playboy Interview: Ayn Rand”, by Alvin Toffler, Playboy (March), 35–43.
- 1964c, “Is Atlas Shrugging?” Originally delivered as a lecture, published in 1967a: 150–66.
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Other Internet Resources
- Bidinotto, R., 1994, “Survive or Flourish?—A Reconciliation”, Full Context, Parts I & II, February & April 1994.
- Kelley, D. and W. Thomas, 1999, The Logical Structure of Objectivism.
For helpful comments, thanks to Eric Mack, Gregory Salmieri, and the editors of SEP. For helpful references, thanks to Chris Sciabarra.
Editors Note: The revisions to this entry published since 2012 were contributed by Neera Badhwar.