Ammonius (ca. 435/445–517/526) taught philosophy at Alexandria, where his father Hermeias had taught earlier. Known primarily for his commentaries on Aristotle, which were said to be of greater benefit than anyone else’s, he was also distinguished in geometry and astronomy. Himself a pupil of Proclus at Athens, at Alexandria Ammonius taught most of the important Platonists of the late 5th and early 6th centuries: Asclepius, Damascius and Simplicius, Eutocius, and Olympiodorus; Elias and David are considered indirect pupils of his. Damascius, who went on to head the school at Athens, heard Ammonius lecture, but attached himself rather to the mentorship of Isidore and followed him to Athens. While almost all of Ammonius’ Aristotle commentaries were published by students from his lectures, the large commentary on De Interpretatione was written up by Ammonius himself for publication. These commentaries are largely dependent on the lectures of Proclus and, to a lesser extent, Syrianus and thus indebted to their style of Iamblichean Neoplatonism. Ammonius is known for several contributions, especially for the introduction of an Alexandrian tradition of commentary on Aristotle, but also for the first preserved version of the set of questions to be answered preliminary to the study of Aristotle, the thesis that for Aristotle God is the efficient as well as final cause of the world, and the treatment of the sea battle of De Interpretatione 9 as one of three determinist arguments, along with the ‘Reaper’ and the argument from divine foreknowledge.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Ammonius as Aristotelian Commentator
- 3. Philosophical Positions
- 4. Influence
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Ammonius’ father Hermeias, after studying in Athens under Syrianus (Head of School in Athens 431/2–437), returned to Alexandria, where he established the teaching of Platonism as an additional subject in the school of Horapollo (see below), alongside the principal curriculum in rhetoric. Ammonius’ mother Aedesia had been chosen as a young girl by Syrianus, a relative of hers, to marry Proclus, who would succeed their teacher Syrianus as head on the latter’s death in 437. When Proclus was kept from marrying her by ‘some god’, Aedesia was then married to Proclus’ fellow student Hermeias. From these details, it is clear that Ammonius, second of three sons of Hermeias and Aedesia (the eldest died in childhood), must have been born after about 435, presumably not long before 445. He seems to have been dead when Damascius (ca. 460-after 532) was writing his Life of Isidore or Philosophical History in 526, but alive in 517, when his course on Aristotle’s Physics was first published by Philoponus.
Damascius, whose Life of Isidore is the source of most details about Ammonius’ life, greatly admired Aedesia for her piety and charity, and while still a young student of rhetoric he gave her eulogy at Horapollo’s school. Although the municipal stipend which had been paid to Hermeias (presumably as a teacher) continued to be given her after Hermeias’ death, from the time Ammonius and his younger brother Heliodorus were small until their maturity, Damascius says that Aedesia’s charitable giving left her sons in debt on her death in old age (ca. 475, since Damascius, still a boy and a student of rhetoric, was honored to give her eulogy, ornamented with heroic hexameters). These financial straits may have something to do with Damascius’ opinion that Ammonius was viciously greedy: with this debt, he would certainly have striven to keep teaching and collecting salary and fees; however, the preserved excerpts of Damascius do not make this connection, perhaps in order to portray Ammonius as simply greedy (see below, on Ammonius’ alleged ‘deal’ with the Christian Bishop of Alexandria). For Damascius the true offspring of this union of this exceptionally moral and holy couple was Aedesia and Hermeias’ eldest child, blessed with divine gifts, who died at age seven and receives a rather hagiographic description. Aedesia accompanied her two surviving sons to Athens, where, at her suggestion, both studied with Proclus.
Aedesia and her sons must have returned before 475 from their study in Athens under Proclus to Alexandria, where Ammonius began lecturing on philosophy at the school of Horapollon. We have reports of lectures on Plato by Ammonius from the beginning and end of his career. Sometime between 475 and 485 Damascius, who studied under Ammonius and his brother Heliodorus, heard Ammonius lecture on Platonic philosophy; about 515 Olympiodorus heard him lecture on the Gorgias (Olympiodorus, in Gorg. 199,8–10). Asclepius mentions lectures (or seminars: sunousiai, in Met. 77,4) on Plato and refers to an ‘exegesis’ (in Met. 70,31) of the Theaetetus. Nonetheless, Damascius reports that Ammonius was better versed in Aristotle, and it is his lectures on Aristotle which, for the most part, have been transmitted to us.
In Ammonius’ day, Alexandria, unlike Athens, was an important center of Christian cult and culture, the third See of Christendom. The school founded by Horapollo, where after Hermeias joined it the two main courses of study were rhetoric and philosophy, was a hub of the ‘Hellenic’ pagan learning, religion and culture. Apparently, Christian professors taught there as well, however, though the latter tended to lecture in their homes on Fridays, leaving the school largely to the pagans on that day (Zacharias, Life of Severus p. 23 Kugener); certainly, there were Christian students in the classes of both their co-religionists and the Hellenes. The atmosphere in Ammonius’ classroom is (too?) vividly portrayed in Ammonius or On the Creation of the World, written by one such Christian student, Zacharias of Maiuma (Gaza’s port-city), the later Bishop of Mytilene, who studied with Ammonius in Alexandria between 485 and 487. Zacharias’ book recounts discussions between ‘The Christian’, presumably Zacharias himself, and ‘Ammonius’ in front of the classroom; there is also (perhaps added later, after Ammonius’ death: Watts 2005) a discussion with the medical philosopher (iatrosophistēs) Gesius, said to have been Ammonius’ best student at the time. This recounting of the ‘dialogues in the Platonic manner’ (1. 7–8) should not be taken as historical: it is embellished by Zacharias with various references to Platonic dialogues and their digs at sophists; the arguments themselves largely depend upon another contemporary work, the Theophrastus by Aeneas of Gaza, which has no express connection with Ammonius. But Zacharias portrays Ammonius’ classroom as a battle over the souls of a mixture of committed pagans and Christians, and some students leaning one way or the other. Zacharias’ contempt for Ammonius and for Platonic philosophy is evident, and their discussion ends with Ammonius’ embarrassed silence. That the school could be a focus of hostile Christian attention had been made abundantly clear by the lynching of Hypatia at the hands of an Alexandrian mob in 415. Questions thus arise about the relation of the school to what Damascius in his Life of Isidore calls ‘the dominant doctrine’. How did the school manage to keep going as a largely pagan institution in a strongly Christian city? Did the philosophers in the school make any concessions, doctrinal or otherwise, to the Christian authorities? Was the school enabled to continue teaching Platonic philosophy with some pagan professors into the 530’s by a concession of Ammonius’ to the Christian authorities?
It has been speculated that Ammonius may actually have converted to Christianity. A remark in Philoponus’ edition of Ammonius’ lectures on De Anima (104,21–23) to the effect that the soul could be forced to profess tyrants’ impious dogma, but could not be forced to assent to it and believe it, might perhaps go back to Ammonius and has been taken as possible evidence that he was coerced to pay lip service to Christianity, as has the dialectically coerced admission (2.1094–1121) of Zacharias’ character ‘Ammonius’ that the Trinity really is “three in hypostasis and being, but one in number” (Westerink 1962, XI–XII and Cameron 1969,14–15). But there is no convincing evidence of a conversion (cf. Blumenthal 1986, 322–323), nor of any change in the real Ammonius’ teaching.
Ammonius’ tenure at the school saw a large-scale attack on the pagan community of Alexandria in the wake of the revolt of Illus (484–488) against the Emperor Zeno, during which harsh measures were taken against the pagans by the Patriarch Peter III Mongus (482–489), since Illus had allied himself with the corrupt pagan Pamprepius and may have promised him that pagan practice would be tolerated. It was probably during this crisis that Ammonius is represented by Damascius as making an agreement or deal: “Ammonius, who was wickedly greedy and saw everything in terms of any profit he could make, concluded an agreement (sunthēkas) with the overseer (episkopounta, i.e., bishop) of the dominant doctrine” (Photius, Bibl. cod. 242.352a 11–14=Damascius 118B Athanassiadi; cf. her Intro. 30–1 and n. 37). Scholarly attention has focused on the nature of Ammonius’ ‘deal’ with the Bishop (presumed, by connecting this persecution with the end of Illus’ revolt, to have been Peter Mongus; the appearance of the name of his successor, Athanasius II [490–497] in a doublet of the same passage from Damascius [Photius, Bibl. cod. 242.347a 20] is apparently an intrusive, mistaken gloss). The suggestions have been put forward that he agreed to continue the alleged Alexandrian Neoplatonic practice of making the gods into one by collapsing the One into the Intellect (a view congenial to Christianity); or that he agreed to lecture only on Aristotle, avoiding Plato, or not to mention in his teaching the Aristotelian doctrine of the eternity and divinity of the world; or that he betrayed the hiding places of colleagues and pupils. Scholars have adduced counterevidence against the first three suggestions, concerning the school’s doctrine. That Ammonius betrayed his fellow Hellenes is a speculation based on his ability—alone among the major figures of the school—to resume his teaching unscathed after the turmoil of 489, on Damascius’ association of Ammonius’ deal with a profit motive, and also on Damascius’ hints that Ammonius was unprincipled and given to intrigue, as evidenced by an earlier power-struggle against Erythrius (a three-time praetorian prefect) in Constantinople (Damascius 78E; Athanassiadi 1999, 30–2). Indeed, the excerpts from Damascius seem to indicate that Ammonius was a prime target of the investigation and persecution led by the imperial envoy Nicomedes, who in an attempt to get information on “the Ammonius affair” (Damascius 117A) ordered the arrest of Ammonius’ friend Harpocras, a professor of literature; he fled, but the order led to the arrest and torture of Horapollo and Heraïscus, whom they tried to make inform on Harpocras and Isidore (Damascius 117B). Thus, Damascius perhaps implies that Ammonius set the investigators on Harpocras to draw them away from himself.
Richard Sorabji (1990b, 12; see also 2005; 2016b, xiii–xiv; 2016c, 46–47) suggested that Ammonius might have agreed not to allow the school to be a center of pagan and theurgic ritual, which he would also de-emphasize in his teaching, or simply not to make trouble with Christians, as the practice of theurgy or any attempt to convert Christian students to it would do. On Sorabji’s thesis, instead of agreeing with Iamblichus’ insistence on theurgy as indispensable to reaching spiritual union with God, a doctrine largely taken over by Proclus (on Proclus’ theurgy and its three types, see Sheppard 1982), Ammonius sided with Porphyry’s refusal to accept the efficacy of theurgy in purifying the intellect and hence leading us to God. This interpretation puts Ammonius in an altogether better light than does Damascius’, which is approved by Athanassiadi. For Sorabji his financial gain was the continuation of his municipal salary, so that he could keep his school open, rather than a craven payment for services rendered to the Christian authorities; he did not betray his friends; he did not betray philosophy, since he merely preferred the noncommittal attitude of Porphyry in the matter of divine names and theurgy to that of Iamblichus and Proclus; on the contrary, he saved philosophy in Alexandria.
Sorabji’s conjecture has attained something like a consensus among scholars (e.g., Hadot 2015, 29) and is quite possibly correct. There is still room for doubt, however. It is not clear that Ammonius and his school rejected or downplayed theurgy; Olympiodorus (in Phd., Lect. 8, sec. 2) puts theurgy on the highest level of virtue: philosophy can make us Intellect, while theurgy can unite us with the intelligibles, so that we act paradeigmatically (cf. Blank 2010, 659–660). Still, as Sorabji says (2016c, 47), he apparently addressed his students as if they were all Christians, and without the volatile mix of pagans, Christians, and those who were wavering, the danger of Ammonius’ day was absent; Ammonius would have had much more reason to agree to keep theurgy out of his classroom after the riots of 486 and persecution of 489. If on the basis of its absence from his commentaries on Aristotle we say that Ammonius de-emphasized theurgy or kept it to himself, he appears to have done so consistently throughout his career, so that this cannot be used as evidence of any forced change in his teaching. Did he, then, agree to continue doing what he had been doing all along? Perhaps the mere fact of Ammonius’ willingness to approach and make an agreement with Peter was enough to justify the disdain of Damascius.
Can we ascertain Ammonius’ attitude to theurgy and ‘Egyptian’ or ‘Hellenic’ rites? Beyond the commentaries we have three quasi-historical sources for Ammonius: Damascius’ Life of Isidore and Zacharias’ Life of Severus and Ammonius. In narrating the early life of Severus (Bishop of Antioch 512–518, though he was a pagan during his student days at Alexandria in the 480’s), Zacharias recounts the story of Paralius, a student in Horapollo’s school undecided between paganism and Christianity (see Watts 2005). In 486 after taunting the philosopher Asclepiodotus for his claim to have got his hitherto infertile wife pregnant by Egyptian magic, Paralius was set upon and beaten by the Hellenic students of the school on a Friday, when the Christians were largely absent. This incident resulted in complaints to Entrechius the Prefect and to the Bishop, Peter Mongus, leading to the ransacking of the sanctuary of Isis at Menouthis and the burning of many hieratic cult objects. The professors of the school accused in this incident were Horapollon himself, along with the ‘philosophers’ Asclepiodotus, Heraïscus, Ammonius, and Isidore. Nothing further is said about Heraïscus or Ammonius; Zacharias had already ridiculed Asclepiodotus, who subsequently repaired to Aphrodisias, and he remarks that Isidore was later revealed as a magician and troublemaker. Thus, Zacharias associates Ammonius with colleagues whom he generally labels philosophers and adherents of the Egyptian mysteries, but gives us no particulars about him. In his Life of Severus, Zacharias focused on the conflicts between Alexandrian pagans and Christians, showing the winning and salvific force of Christianity. In the Ammonius he portrayed the superiority of Christian doctrine, especially that the world was created, and the dialectical victories of a Christian student over the more philosophically experienced pagans Ammonius and Gesios. Therefore, that book avoids the cultic conflict altogether and tells us nothing about Ammonius relating to theurgic belief or ritual.
Damascius and his hero Isidore, on the other hand, were fervent adherents of theurgy and practitioners of hieratic ritual, and Damascius’ cast of characters are divided into those who practiced such ritual (good), those who were especially divinely gifted (better), and those whose participation was nil or is passed over in silence (bad guys); Ammonius is among the latter. The same was not true of his family, however, as Damascius saw them. Hadot (2015, 1–14) argues for the importance of religiosity and theurgy in the Alexandrian, as well as in the Athenian, school. Plutarch, who introduced Iamblichean Platonism into Athens, had three famous students: Hierocles, Syrianus, and Proclus. Of the first two, Alexandrians by birth, Hierocles, author of a book on the Pythagorean Golden Verses, returned to teach in his native city, while Syrianus was chosen by Plutarch to succeed him. Proclus was younger than these. Born in Byzantium and raised in Lycian Xanthos, convinced that his Alexandrian teachers did not read Plato in the true spirit of the philosopher and mindful of the divine vision and calling he had received in Xanthos (Marinus, Life of Proclus 10)—not the last gift he would receive from the gods—he left Alexandria for Athens. Hermeias studied with Syrianus; his commentary on the Phaedrus cites the Chaldaean Oracles and Orphic Hymns frequently. Hermeias’ wife Aedesia not only shared her husband’s virtuous character, she was “so pious toward God and holy and, to tell the whole of it, beloved of the gods that she was accorded many epiphanies” (Damascius, Life of Isidore 56). Indeed, the first child born to the couple was a boy of such wondrous qualities and virtue that he departed this life at age seven, “unable to bear his embodied existence” (Life of Isidore 57A). As for Ammonius himself, we have seen him listed (Zacharias, Life of Severus 16 and 22) as one of the four philosophy teachers associated with the philologist (grammatikos) Horapollon and mocked for their adherence to the pagan gods. Of these, Asclepiodotus and Isidore were explicitly connected by Zacharias with Egyptian religion and magic. Damascius (Life of Isidore 81) describes how Asclepiodotus was saved from drowning by divine intervention, “such was his divine power, even while he was still embodied”. Heraïscus he describes as having a divine nature and living in such a way that his soul dwelt as much as possible among shrines and places of initiation (Life of Isidore 72A, B). Of the four, then, only about Ammonius does Damascius report nothing regarding theurgy, mysteries, or holiness. Is this an accurate picture, or is Damascius’ silence as malicious as his words?
Ammonius’ ‘deal’ with the Bishop is attested only by Damascius, who despises Ammonius. Although he could have connected Ammonius’ agreement with his debts, Damascius chose instead to emphasize his greed, blackening his character with a trait (aischrokerdēs) which Plato had said (Republic 408c3–4) would be incompatible with the demigod Asclepius’ divinity, if shown in his medical practice; it must be equally bad for Ammonius in his profession. As Photius already reports, Damascius always mixed praise for some traits with blame for others in each person he reports on. He also plays characters one against the other (cf. O’Meara 2006). Damascius prepared his claim about Ammonius’ greed by his idealization of Hermeias, who even told merchants that their wares were priced too low (Damascius 54), and of Aedesia, whose continuation of her husband’s charitable giving put the family into debt, and of the couple’s saintly eldest son (Damascius 56). The respect and love which Ammonius’ parents earned from both philosophers and the masses form an implicit contrast to the conflict surrounding Ammonius and his greed. The rhetorical structure of Damascius’ narrative thus casts doubt on any ‘deal’ between Ammonius and the Bishop, which may have been the result of pure speculation on Damascius’ part, combined with his animus toward Ammonius (see Blank 2010, 657–660). Damascius actually admits (120B) making such an inference in the case of Horapollon, who he says deserted to ‘the others’, a conversion that “he apparently chose on his own, not compelled by any misfortune, perhaps too from the demands of an insatiable greed; for it is not easy to propose any other reason to excuse his conversion”.
Is a deal with the Bishop necessary to explain Ammonius’ continued ability to teach in Alexandria? The other professors of philosophy appear to have fled or died during Nicomedes’ investigation in 489, while Ammonius, initially a focus of that investigation, remained in Alexandria. We are not told that it became impossible for pagans other than Ammonius to teach after 489, and there were evidently Christian students in Ammonius’ school after that date, just as there were earlier. Since Damascius connects Ammonius’ deal with his avarice, we should like to know more about his income. In major cities, the role of teacher was associated with payment by the city, and in Constantinople there were chairs paid by the Emperor; a law of Justinian in 529, the extension of an order of his father (Justin I, 518–527), decrees (Codex Justinianus 188.8.131.52) that only those of orthodox faith may teach and receive a public stipend (sitēsis dēmosia). Damascius reports that Hermeias had received a municipal stipend, presumably for teaching, which his widow managed to have continued until her sons could do philosophy (hōs ephilosophēsan, where hōs is used in the sense of heōs). Scholars mostly think this makes it likely that Ammonius took up his father’s position on his return from Athens, or even that his father’s position in the school was held vacant for him and was paid in the meanwhile. But there were at least four philosophers teaching together with Horapollon in the 480s, so it is difficult to assert that Ammonius held ‘the chair’ of philosophy; perhaps there were a number of ‘chairs’—difficult, but not impossible, since Ammonius was undoubtedly the most important and influential of the four. How long did Aedesia continue to receive her dead husband’s salary for her sons, “until they began to do philosophy” (hōs ephilosophēsan): was it until they could receive it in their own right? Damascius uses the aorist tense of philosopheō to mean ‘studied philosophy’ (54 Hermeias studied philosophy under Syrianus; 57B Ammonius and Heliodorus studied philosophy under Proclus; 71B Isidore studied philosophy under the brothers Heraïscus and Asclepiades; cf. 63B while Hierios was studying [philosophounta] philosophy). On that likely reading, Aedesia will have arranged for her sons to be supported by the city until she could take them to Athens to study philosophy, where they would, as members of the Academy community, have been supported. When they returned to Alexandria, they will have made their own way, with the support of their mother and of family friends; whether with financial support from students, from the city, or both, is unclear.
Hadot (2015, 23–25) thinks that Zacharias’ account proves that Horapollon’s school was a private institution when Ammonius taught there and that it is highly unlikely that a pagan philosopher could have received a municipal salary in Alexandria in Ammonius’ day, due to Christian hostility. She argues Ammonius and his colleagues will have relied on students’ fees for their income and therefore been more vulnerable than their Athenian colleagues, who lived communally, supported by the wealth of the Academy, which stemmed from bequests of the pious and learned (Life of Isidore 102). Support for this may come from Olympiodorus, who says (in Gorg. 43.2, 224.20–24; 43.4, 225.19–21; 43.6, 226.24–26) that philosophers will receive the merited thanks of their students for their help and must therefore not ask them for fees (misthous); but this is a hoary philosophical cliché (cf. Xenophon, Mem. 1.2.6–8). In his article on the complex of lecture rooms excavated in Alexandria, Sorabji (2014, 36–37) points to the size of the establishment and its rebuilding and expansion after the earthquake of 535 as indications of generous municipal support. It may well be that Christian Alexandria continued to support the teaching of pagan philosophers because they had an audience of students. There were still pagan students and those leaning toward paganism in the city. But Christians too will have been drawn to the high reputation of pagan Greek literature and philosophy. Christian students will also have sought the kind of dialectical skills taught by pagan philosophers and rhetoricians, along with their advanced logical and metaphysical teachings, the better to argue against them and the better to understand the philosophical basis of their own Christian faith (cf. Wildberg 2005, 234–236). After all, Zacharias stayed in Alexandria a year after Severus left to study law at Berytus because he needed further study of the rhetoricians and philosophers, so as to fight the pagans, who were so proud of them, with their own weapons (Life of Severus 46; cf. Champion 2014, 31–32).
One work of Ammonius clearly survives in the written form he gave it, his ‘commentary’ (hupomnēma) on Aristotle’s De Interpretatione. His commentary on Porphyry’s Introduction (in Isag.), is described in the manuscripts variously as ‘Ammonius the Philosopher’s Exegesis (or Prolegomena or Commentary) of the Five Sayings’ and is perhaps another work given its final form by Ammonius; but its present Prooemium is, in any case, considered inauthentic, and other passages are also interpolations (Busse, CAG IV.3 p. vi).
We hear of other works published by Ammonius, but these are mostly single book-rolls, monographs on particular points:
- On Phaedo 69d4–6, in which he defended Plato against the charge that in the Phaedo he was ambivalent about the immortality of the soul (Olympiodorus, in Phd. 8 §17,6–7).
- On hypothetical syllogisms (fragment at Ammonius, in An. Pr. 67,32–69,28).
- On the fact that Aristotle made God not only the final but also the efficient cause of the whole world (Simplicius, in Cael. 271,13–21, in Phys. 1363,8–12).
- On the Astrolabe. That Ammonius wrote on this topic is mentioned by Philoponus at the start of his own book on the use, construction, and inscriptions of the astrolabe. A work entitled “Explanation of the use of the astrolabe”, said in the manuscripts to be by one ‘Aegyptius’, is thought rather to be the work of Ammonius, perhaps an epitome of a lost work of his (cf. Hase 1839, 158–171 and Pingree 1973, 33 n. 7). Ammonius taught Damascius Ptolemy’s Syntaxis and was known, along with his brother Heliodorus, for his work on astronomy (cf. the observations—one said to have been made by the brothers together, on 22 Feb. 503—recorded by Heliodorus in his copy of Ptolemy: Heiberg 1907, xxxv-xxxvii).
In addition, the commentary by an Ammonius on Aristotle’s Topics mentioned in Syriac and Arabic authors was perhaps written by our Ammonius (cf. Stump 1978, 212 and Militello 2014, 92).
The other works of Ammonius which survive are all derived, directly or indirectly, from his lectures, taken down by his students and hence mostly described as being ‘from the voice (apo tēs phōnēs, or: the lectures [skholōn]) of Ammonius’. Two of these are transmitted under the name of Ammonius himself, but are thought to come from the notes of anonymous students from Ammonius’ lectures:
- On Aristotle’s Categories (in Cat.): ‘Prolegomena to the Ten Categories from the Voice of Ammonius the Philosopher’.
- On Aristotle’s Prior Analytics I (in An. Pr.): ‘Notes (skholia) on the first book of the Prior Analytics from the Voice of Ammonius’.
Two courses bear the name of Asclepius (ca. 465- ?):
- On Aristotle’s Metaphysics 1–7 (in Metaph.); the title of the first book of this commentary is: ‘Notes on the greater first book of the Metaphysics of Aristotle coming from Asclepius from the Voice of Ammonius’.
- On Nicomachus’ Introduction to Arithmetic (in Nicomachi Intro. Arith.): ‘Asclepius the Philosopher of Tralles’ Notes on the first book of the Arithmetical Introduction of Nicomachus’.
Four courses are transmitted under the name of John Philoponus (ca. 490-ca. 570):
- On Aristotle’s Prior Analytics (in An. Pr.): ‘John the Grammarian of Alexandria’s school annotations (skholikai aposēmeiōseis) on the first book of the Prior Analytics from the seminars of Ammonius son of Hermeias’.
- On Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (in An. Post.): ‘John of Alexandria’s school annotations from the seminars of Ammonius son of Hermeias with some of his own observations (epistaseis) on the first book of the Posterior Analytics’ (what is transmitted as the commentary on Book II is perhaps spurious).
- On Aristotle’s On Generation and Corruption (in GC): ‘John the Grammarian of Alexandria’s school annotations from the seminars of Ammonius son of Hermeias with some of his own observations on the first of the books On Generation and Corruption of Aristotle’.
- On Aristotle’s On the Soul (in DA; authorship of the commentary on Book III is disputed): ‘John of Alexandria’s school annotations from the seminars of Ammonius son of Hermeias with some of his own observations on Aristotle’s On the Soul’.
The titles of three of Philoponus’ Aristotle courses do not mention Ammonius, and these were probably perceived as representing rather the lectures of Philoponus than those of Ammonius. These are:
- On Aristotle’s Categories (in Cat.); but this might have been based on the notes published under Ammonius’ own name.
- On Aristotle’s Physics (in Phys.): ‘John Philoponus on the first book of Aristotle’s Lecture on Physics’; this mentions the date of 10 May 517, when Ammonius was still alive, but shows signs of later revision.
- On Aristotle’s Meteorology (in Meteor.).
However, On Nicomachus’ Introduction to Arithmetic (in Nicomachi Intro. Arith.) is thought to be lectures by Philoponus based on Asclepius’ publication (see above) of his own notes on Ammonius’ lectures (cf. Tarán 1969, 10–13).
Ammonius established the tradition of Aristotelian commentary in Alexandria. He was followed in this by his students Asclepius, Philoponus (ca. 490–570), Simplicius (writing after 529 after moving to the Athenian school and moving with it from Athens to Persia after the school’s closure under Justinian), and Olympiodorus (495/505-after 565). The tradition continues through the Christian commentators Elias (probably a pupil of Olympiodorus), David, Ps.-Elias and Stephanus (fl. ca. 610).
Damascius commented that Ammonius, who explicated works of both Plato and Aristotle, was more practiced in the latter (Life of Isidore 57C). The Christian character in Zacharias’ dialogue (562–565) accuses Ammonius’ star pupil Gesius and his comrades, presumably including Ammonius, of being accustomed to refute Plato’s doctrines, while claiming to be his pupils and wanting to be called ‘Platonists’; he also uses a literal interpretation of the cosmogony in Plato’s Timaeus to counter the Aristotelian doctrine of the world’s co-eternity with God espoused by the dialogue’s ‘Ammonius’ character. Still, Ammonius did lecture on Platonic texts. He is cited by name nine times in his student Olympiodorus’ commentary on the Gorgias, three times on the Phaedo, and not at all on Alcibiades I; the differences probably reflect the fact that for the Gorgias Olympiodorus could rely less on a previous tradition of Neoplatonic interpretation. In all cases, he is cited with the greatest respect.
The most substantive comment cited by Olympiodorus from Ammonius’ lectures on the Gorgias (§32,2–3) is a defense of the four democratic politicians Socrates declines to call statesmen (499b–503c); Ammonius says they are practitioners of the ‘intermediate’ rhetoric, rather than of the false kind. He draws his explanation from the Republic (425c-427a), where he distinguishes three kinds of physician: the false kind that gives prescriptions aimed at flattery and pleasing the patient, the true kind that insists the patient do what is best for him, and the intermediate kind that gives the patient a true prescription but does not insist that he follow it. In this explanation, Ammonius follows the lead of his father Hermeias, who cited (in Phdr. p. 231,26–232,14 Lucarini-Moreschini) this passage of the Gorgias in his explanation of Phaedrus 260d as referring to true, popular, and intermediate rhetoric and the different kinds of therapy of the masses they apply. Ammonius’ lectures on Plato seem to have been enlivened by wit and personal remarks, some apparently cited as apophthegms from the great teacher. Socrates (Gorgias 513a) warns Callicles against assimilating himself to the current Athenian dēmos, thereby attaining power but perhaps losing all he holds dear. Such assimilation, Olympiodorus says, destroys one’s soul utterly; the proper object to which one should assimilate one’s soul is the cosmos, that is, God. Like the Thessalian witches mentioned by Socrates, nowadays too the Egyptian magicians claim to have the power to ‘draw down the moon’ and run such risk of destruction, if they fail. Olympiodorus notes that we must not believe these mythical stories, though most people are deceived by them: this is simply an eclipse; similarly, even now they say that there are magicians in Egypt who can change men into crocodiles, asses, or any shape they like—but one must not believe it. Indeed, Ammonius told them, in his exegesis, “this experience overpowered me too, and when I was a boy I used to believe these things were true” (in Gorg. §39,2). Known for astronomical expertise, Ammonius was chiding his credulous audience. Another remark of Ammonius’ is cited in Olympiodorus’ argument that the myth at the end of the Gorgias that emphasizes the judgement of our souls in the underworld over that of judges in our present life shows that our actions derive from our own souls’ autonomy. Olympiodorus notes (§48,5) that it is up to us to choose virtue or vice and that there is no place for astrology, which would nullify foresight, law, and justice: “Ammonius the philosopher says ‘I know some men who have the astrological horoscope of adulterers, yet are temperate, since the self-moving nature of the soul dominates’”. Again, Ammonius does not deny the influence of the stars in our lives, but insists that our individual choice plays an overriding role. Explaining that aristocracy is the best government, Olympiodorus (§42,1–2) likens the city to the cosmos, ruled best by God, citing the Homeric line so favored by Aristotle (Metaphysics 12.10, 1076a4) and his Neoplatonic exegetes: “Rule of many is not good: let there be one chief!”. If someone objects that this is rather monarchy than aristocracy, respond with Ammonius: “Keep silent; let him have your fist”!
In his lectures on Aristotle, Ammonius was heavily indebted to his teacher Proclus, even if he disagreed with him on some important points. The introduction to his in Int. makes Ammonius’ great debt to Proclus clear: “Now, we have recorded the interpretations of our divine teacher Proclus, successor to the chair of Plato and a man who attained the limits of human capacity both in the ability to interpret the opinions of the ancients and in the scientific judgment of the nature of reality. If, having done that, we too are able to add anything to the clarification of the book, we owe great thanks to the god of eloquence” (1,6–11; cf. in An. Pr. 43,30, with a citation of Proclus’ School Commentary [skholikon hupomnēma]). Proclus, in turn, often used Iamblichus (see, e.g., in An. Pr. 40,16). In addition, Ammonius used other commentators. For example in his in Int., most of his material comes from Proclus’ lectures, but Ammonius has polished up what he had in his notes of those lectures, then added material of his own or from other sources. In this case, Ammonius’ main source for supplementing Proclus’ lectures was apparently the now lost voluminous commentary (see Stephanus in Int. 63,9) of Porphyry, which was also the major source of Boethius’ commentary on De Int. and probably also of Ammonius’ citations of earlier authors, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias (active late 2nd to early 3rd century), Aspasius (first half of 2nd century), Herminus’ (2nd C.), and the Stoics. Both Porphyry and Proclus held Int. c. 14 to be spurious (252,10 ff.). Although Ammonius agreed, unlike them he decided to include commentary on the chapter, which he repeats ‘verbatim’ from Syrianus, having nothing of his own to add (254,22–31; cf. 253,12).
The sources on which Ammonius drew and his mode of using them will likely have varied according to the nature of the previous commentaries he could work with for each text. In Asclepius’ published version of Ammonius’ lectures, for example, we see a very different procedure from the one Ammonius followed in writing out his own commentary on De Interpretatione and basing it on Proclus’ lectures. It is difficult to say to what extent Asclepius’ commentary on Metaphysics A–Z is either a reflection or a more thorough reworking of Ammonius’ lectures. Still, this work is reasonably thought to give the best representation we have of the lectures themselves, copied down by Ammonius’ student ‘from the voice’ of the master. Indications of the commentary’s origin in the lectures abound (cf. Luna 2001, 100–103): the explanation of a passage often begins by referring to “what was said yesterday” (e.g., 3,13; 433,18–19); we are told that “the teacher of medicine Asclepius, who studied with us at these lessons” raised a question, and “our professor of philosophy” answered him (143,31 ff.). That faithful transcription of lectures was practiced and thus could have formed the basis of a later reworking for publication is implied by Damascius’ story (45A) about Theosebius, who compared his own transcripts of lectures on the Gorgias given at two different times by his master Hierocles and found nothing repeated between the two versions, “each of which, however improbable it is to hear, hewed as much as possible to the intention of Plato”.
In Asclepius of Tralles’ commentary on Metaphysics A-Z there are two voices: the Peripatetic voice of Aristotle and Alexander of Aphrodisias and the Neoplatonic voice of Syrianus and Ammonius. Asclepius begins with a lemma taken from Aristotle, sometimes paraphrases it, and explains its philosophical significance; then, if necessary, he explains why Aristotle was wrong, saying that “we, on the other hand, say” or “against this we say” or “our teacher of philosophy Ammonius says”, or else why Aristotle appears wrong but really agrees with Plato. Next, he explains the Aristotelian text itself, usually taking the explanation from Alexander, either word-for-word or in paraphrase; occasionally, he appears to have drawn his paraphrase of Alexander from Syrianus. Asclepius’ commentary and, presumably, Ammonius’ lectures, then, combine the inheritance of Alexander and of Syrianus, a move in keeping with the opinion of Syrianus himself, who introduced his commentary on Metaphysics Γ saying (54,11–15): “[Aristotle] will attempt to teach [these things] in this book, which, since it has been made sufficiently clear by the very hardworking Alexander, we will not interpret in its entirety. But if he seems to us to say something that is troublesome [and requiring] scrutiny, that part we will try to examine, summarizing all the rest for the sake of the treatise’s coherence.” The commentary on Metaphysics A, closely studied by Cardullo (2012), provides numerous clear examples of Asclepius’—i.e., Ammonius’—procedures. Thus, in explaining the famous declaration of all men’s desire for knowledge in the opening sentence of the Metaphysics, Ammonius goes through a number of different types of knowledge, following Aristotle, ending with art, which is superior to experience, since it knows the ‘why’ and not just the ‘that’: “Hence Plato says of the divine mind ‘I do not call art that which is an irrational thing’”. With this reference to Gorgias 465a6, Asclepius-Ammonius cites (28,3–6 on Metaph. 984b1) a Platonic argument in explanation of an Aristotelian one to show their close relation. Later, Asclepius attributes Aristotle’s argument that wisdom is chosen for itself, not for the sake of something else, to Plato (20,15–16; cf. Cardullo 2012, 266 n. 391). In another instance of this kind of association, Asclepius comments that “it is good that sensible things exist: even pitch is necessary for the perfection of the cosmos, and ‘it is unjust to leave such a great matter to chance or luck’, but only to God, who has created everything because of his own goodness”. That the reference is to the Demiurge of the Timaeus (29e) is evident from the emphasis on the creator’s goodness, and the producing cause is here connected with the Unmoved Mover, which is a final cause due to its goodness (Cardullo 2012, 294 n. 488).
From Ammonius’ version of the list of ten preliminary topics recommended by Proclus for those beginning to study Aristotle (cf. Elias, in Cat. 107,24–27), we know that the study of Aristotle in Ammonius’ school began with logic, then moved on to ethics, physics, mathematics, and theology (Ammonius, in Cat. 5,31–6,8). Ammonius also introduced as a new set a sequence of lessons introductory to the study of Aristotle consisting of: an introduction to philosophy; an introduction to Porphyry’s Eisagōgē or Introduction to Aristotle’s logic; a commentary on Porphyry’s Introduction; the reading of Porphyry’s Introduction itself; an introduction to the philosophy of Aristotle; an introduction to the Categories (cf. Sorabji 2016c, 48–50; Hadot, 1988, 44–45). The introduction to philosophy was particularly congenial and influential, giving a number of definitions of philosophy and, particularly, two definitions ‘from the goal’: Plato’s ‘assimilation to God as far as possible’ (Theaetetus 176b) and ‘practice of death’ (Phaedo 64a; Ammonius, in Isag. 3,7 ff. and 4,15 ff.). Lectures on the works of Plato and Aristotle presumably lasted about an hour. In Proclus we see signs of such hour-long divisions, as well as a division of the lecture on an individual passage into discussion of its doctrine (theōria), sometimes quite wide-ranging, followed by its wording (lexis); signs of this division are still present in Ammonius’ in Int. Students evidently took copious notes, which they might then publish, under their own names or that of Ammonius himself.
The lectures of Ammonius and his students gave a very detailed exegesis of their text and an indication of its philosophical importance, including how it related to other texts of Aristotle and Plato. These two philosophers were each taken to be substantially self-consistent and uniform in opinion throughout his own writings, and in agreement with one another and with the truth (see, e.g., Simplicius, in DA 1,3–21). According to Elias (in Cat. 107,24–7), Proclus put together a list of ten questions to be answered preliminary to the study of Aristotle, and it is Ammonius who gives us the first preserved version of these. One of the preliminary questions concerns the role of the interpreter. Elias (in Cat. 122,25–123,5) says that the exegete is also a knower, in the one capacity explaining what is unclear in his text and in the other judging its truth and falsity. He ought not to insist that his author is always correct, but he ought rather to value the truth more than the man; he ought not to become an exclusive partisan of his philosopher, as Iamblichus was for Plato. Further, he ought to know all of Aristotle, so that he can show on the basis of Aristotle’s works that he agrees with himself; he ought to know all of Plato, so that he can show that Plato agrees with himself, while making the works of Aristotle an introduction to those of Plato. These requirements are associated with Ammonius by Olympiodorus in his commentary on the Gorgias (cf. Tarrant in Jackson et al. 1998, 11 and notes on 32.1 and 42.2), and one can see the insistence on knowing and judging the truth over loyalty to Aristotle in Ammonius’ own introductory precepts (in Cat. 7,34 ff.).
The later Alexandrian commentators tend to emphasize that it is the commentator’s duty not to interpret apparent disagreements of Aristotle with Plato literally, but to look to the sense and discover the fundamental agreement or ‘harmony’ (sumphōnia) of the two philosophers (e.g., Simplicius, in Cat. 7,31). Ammonius’ own statement of the qualities of an exegete (in Cat. 7,34 ff.) does not say this, but in practice he does point out the agreement of Plato and Aristotle (in Int. 39,11). Syrianus and Proclus criticized, at times harshly, Aristotle’s disagreement with Plato’s views on, e.g., the existence of Forms and the demiurgic role of God as crafting and creating the physical world. In contrast, Ammonius points out (Asclepius, in Metaph. 69,17–27; cf. Sorabji 2005, vol. 3 sect. 5(d), and Cardullo 2012, 78–81) that, while Aristotle ‘seems’ to be attacking Plato on the Forms in Metaph. 990b3, he actually agrees with Plato, since he praises (De An. 429a28) those who say that the soul is the place of Forms. Ammonius also makes God the efficient cause of all things, in addition to being the final cause (see below, sect. 3.2). This appears to be a characteristic difference of approach between Syrianus-Proclus and Ammonius and his pupils: the latter outdo the former in their concern to ‘harmonize’ Aristotle’s and Plato’s views and their willingness to interpret Aristotle as not disagreeing with Plato in any fundamental way.
For four reasons it is difficult to pinpoint Ammonius’ own philosophical positions and contributions to philosophy or to the interpretation of Aristotle: (1) Our evidence is confined to commentaries on Aristotle, whose interpretation did not leave as much scope for expounding Neoplatonic ideas as did that of Plato. (2) He depends in these works on Proclus, whose Aristotle lectures or commentaries do not survive, so that we cannot be sure what in them is really his own. (3) Some of Ammonius’ works failed to reach us. (4) We have to depend to a significant degree on his pupils’ writings for our information about him and his contributions, and their own stance may be difficult to separate from that of Ammonius himself. The best approach at present attempts to piece together Ammonius’ views from his commentary on De Interpretatione, from statements attributed to him by later commentators, and from those lectures of Ammonius which were either published by students under Ammonius’ name or which, while published under students’ names, seem to show little sign of having altered his teachings—namely, Asclepius on the Metaphysics and the early commentaries of Philoponus (or their early versions, in the case of commentaries, such as that on the Physics, which were revised). The use of Philoponus to recover Ammonius’ positions was much advanced by Verrycken 1990a; his chronology of the commentaries by Philoponus—and hence, the degree to which they may represent the thought of Ammonius, before Philoponus departed from it in important ways—has recently been revisited by Golitsis 2008 and Sorabji 2016d. (see above, sect. 1.2).
It was claimed by K. Praechter (1910) that the Alexandrian Neoplatonic school of Ammonius and his followers differed substantially from that of Athens both before and after Ammonius’ time, particularly by downplaying the Iamblichean theurgic or magical and religious elements and the complex Iamblichean and Proclan hierarchies and triadic groupings at the different levels of reality recognized in Neoplatonist metaphysics (on these, see, e.g., Wallis 1972, 100–110, 123–34, 146–54). In contrast to these wild and woolly Athenian doctrines and practices, Praechter saw the Alexandrian school, in whose commentaries such doctrines do not figure prominently, as more restrained, rational, respectable; they were sober interpreters of Aristotle and had a doctrine much more easily reconcilable with the strong Christian cult of Alexandria. Scholars like P. Merlan (1968) went further, making Ammonius the purveyor of a strongly Christianized philosophy which featured a creative, personal God.
Recent studies of the Alexandrians (especially Hadot 1978 on Hierocles and Simplicius, Verrycken 1990a on Ammonius, Tempelis 1999, Luna 2001, Cardullo 2009 and 2012, Hadot 2015, Sorabji 2016a and c) have largely resulted in the abandonment of Praechter’s claims. Overlapping personal histories already cast doubt on the hypothesis of a gulf between the two schools. As noted above, Plutarch’s chosen successor Syrianus came from Alexandria together with Hermeias, who brought Plutarch’s and Syrianus’ teachings back from Athens to his native city Alexandria. Ammonius studied with and was evidently greatly influenced by Proclus in Athens. Furthermore, references and allusions to various important pieces of Proclan doctrine can be adduced from various places in the commentaries of Ammonius and his students. The relative paucity, however, of such references and their lack of centrality to the works in which they are found makes it difficult to assess their significance in this regard. The interpretation of certain statements which might be interpreted as telling against Ammonius’ espousal of, say, the transcendent One, is also a complex matter. Ammonius’ interpreters now rightly rely to a great extent on context in understanding his works. They ask, for example, whenever Ammonius does not mention a particular Neoplatonic doctrine or mentions it in a simplified form, whether the doctrine was necessary to an understanding of the passage on which Ammonius was commenting. As noted above, Ammonius comments mostly on Aristotle, especially his logical works. This was the first part of the Neoplatonic curriculum: Marinus (Life of Proclus 13) says that Syrianus taught Proclus all of Aristotle’s works in less than two years and “having led him through these, as it were, preliminary initiatory rites and little mysteries, brought him to the mystagogy of Plato”. Ammonius apparently held a similar view of the Aristotelian portion of the Neoplatonic curriculum, and in commentary on such works may have felt no need to go into many of the details of a complex Neoplatonic theology and metaphysics;, even if he held such views. Even the Metaphysics, which according to Ammonius dealt with things ‘entirely unmoved’, that is, ‘theology’ (Asclepius, in Metaph. 1,3 and 17–18) may not have been thought to require an explanation of the highest levels of reality. In a second statement, explaining the first line of the book, Asclepius says Aristotle aimed to speak about “beings and how they are beings and, to reason about absolutely all beings, insofar as they are beings” (2,9–11), which Hadot (2015, 27) takes to exclude “the entire divine hierarchy beyond being”. The second statement, however, probably derives from Alexander, who thinks that the Metaphysics is theological in the sense that God is one of the causes of reality and thus a subject of ‘first philosophy’ (cf. Cardullo 2012, 225 n. 230). Ammonius here elides the reasoning needed to get from the study of being qua being to theology, and there is some ambiguity as to the extent to which he thinks the role of theology in Aristotle is the same as in Plato (Hadot 2015, 27 n. 83). In some contexts a discussion of certain metaphysical doctrines might even have been inappropriate, especially if the work under discussion was meant to be studied by less advanced students. Thus, the fact that Ammonius does not avail himself of certain opportunities to discuss certain tenets of Neoplatonic metaphysics does not mean that he would not espouse such tenets in other circumstances. Still, the very fact that Ammonius was, as emphasized above, especially known for his commentaries on Aristotle, could reflect a tendency on his part not to have taught a full-blown Neoplatonic metaphysical system. Hadot 2015 gives a lengthy account of the similarities and differences in the ways Aristotle and Plato were ‘harmonized’ by various Platonists since Porphyry (cf. the account of various issues on which harmonization was needed, as seen in Themistius and then in Ammonius, in Sorabji 2016c, 18–20 and 53–55). In agreement with Cardullo (e.g., 2009, 245) that one finds in Ammonius an “absolute allegiance to Neoplatonism”, Hadot interprets differences between, say, Syrianus-Proclus and Ammonius as resulting from the greater determination of the latter to minimize their possible disagreements and Ammonius’ consequently greater willingness to bend Aristotle in Plato’s direction. There may be debate over whether this involved more ‘Aristotelizing Plato’ or ‘Platonizing Aristotle’ (cf. Sorabji 2016a, xxvii–xxxi for a discussion of Hadot’s objections to Verrycken’s  view of Ammonius’ simplification of the metaphysics of the Athenian Neoplatonists). One may also wonder whether Ammonius would have thought that his philosophy differed in any important way from that of his Athenian teacher.
On the most general level, Ammonius says that the purpose and utility of studying Aristotle’s philosophy is “to ascend to the common principle (arkhē) of all things and to be aware that this is the one goodness itself, incorporeal, indivisible, uncircumscribed, unbounded and of infinite potentiality” (in Cat. 6,9–12). Thus, his stance, in this early work, is that of a Neoplatonist, as has been clearly shown by Verrycken (1990a, 212–15). Thus he says that Aristotle’s distinction of spoken sound, affection of the soul, and thing in the world (De Int. 16a3–8) corresponds to the Neoplatonic hypostases of Soul, Intellect and God (in Int. 24,24–9). He also places ‘not-being’ above the Intellect at the highest plane of reality and occasionally writes in a manner reminiscent of Proclus’ divine henads. So there seems no doubt of his genuine commitment to a Neoplatonic stance in metaphysics, even if, as Verrycken would hold, he may not have espoused a system as complex as that of Proclus.
Perhaps, though, Ammonius set different emphases and cited different ultimate authorities than the Athenians. Following Iamblichus, Syrianus and Proclus held that Plato taught the true philosophy that originated with Pythagoras and various of his followers, including Parmenides. They also thought the highest expression of this ancient wisdom was found in the Orphic Hymns and in the Chaldaean Oracles, and these two works were the final course Syrianus was willing to teach, but only to Proclus and Domninus, though disagreement over which one to study caused the two students to be taught separately, and Proclus’ study of the Oracles was interrupted by Syrianus’ death (Marinus, Life of Proclus 26). Proclus later worked intensively on both texts, along with those of Porphyry and Iamblichus, and taught them. In fact, “he attained the highest degree of theurgic virtue” (Life of Proclus 27–28). Ammonius was certainly concerned, in Asclepius’ commentary on Metaphysics A, to point out on numerous occasions that Aristotle—who criticized the Pythagoreans and, according to Ammonius, also the line of reasoning that led from them to Plato—had got them wrong, since he did not understand that they expressed themselves ‘symbolically’ (cf. Cardullo 2009, 258–259). Again, some argue that Ammonius and his students did not see the importance of the ‘divine poetry’ of Orpheus and the Chaldaean Oracles. Hadot 2015, 13–14 counters that citation of these poetic works is also infrequent in Aristotelian commentaries of the Athenian school, while both Olympiodorus and Damascius cite the Oracles in their commentaries on Plato’s Phaedo. In any event, it is important to note that we have no record that Ammonius or his pupils lectured or commented on the four great ‘theological’ dialogues in the Neoplatonic curriculum: Phaedrus, Symposium, Philebus, Parmenides (cf. Tarrant, in Jackson, et al. 1998, 3).
Aristotle’s intellectual God seems not to be a good fit for the role of craftsman and creator which God plays in Plato’s Timaeus. Proclus (in Tim. 1.266.28–268.24) says as much: while “the Peripatetics say there is something separate [from the physical world], it is not creative (poiētikē), but final (telikon); hence they both removed the exemplars (paradeigmata) and set a non-plural intelligence over all things.” Indeed, Proclus says, Aristotle’s own principles ought to have made him admit that God was a creator. According to Simplicius, Peripatetic interpreters, including Alexander of Aphrodisias, accepted that God was a final cause of the entire world, that God’s moving the heavens made him indirectly the efficient cause of sublunar motion, and that he was also the efficient cause of the heavens’ motion, but not of their existence as a substance (in Cael. 271,13–21; in Phys. 1360,24–1363,24). Simplicius goes on to say that Ammonius devoted an entire book to arguing that, contrary to these Peripatetics, God was both final and efficient cause of both the movement and existence of the whole world, sublunar and supralunar. This interpretation, according to Simplicius, allowed Ammonius to harmonize Aristotle with Plato; it should not, therefore, be taken as a concession to Christian doctrine. Instead of criticizing Aristotle, as Proclus had done, Ammonius took five Aristotelian passages and interpreted them as indicating that Aristotle did in fact reason along the lines Proclus had indicated in his criticism. Thus, for example, Ammonius argued, according to Simplicius, that in Physics 2.3, 194b29–32, that from which comes the origin of motion (i.e., God, the unmoved mover) is itself a productive cause. Ammonius also argued that “if, according to Aristotle, the power of any finite body is itself finite, clearly whether it be a power of moving or a power that produces being, then, just as it gets its eternal motion from the unmoved cause, so it must receive its eternal being as a body from the non-bodily cause” (trs. of this and other relevant texts in Sorabji 2005, vol. 2, sect. 8(c)1). Ammonius’ harmonization of Aristotle with Plato on this point would prove essential to both Arabic Aristotelians and, eventually, to Aquinas’ ability to enlist Aristotle’s God for Christianity. Verrycken (1990, 218) interprets Ammonius’ conception of the relation of God and the world as based on the Neoplatonic ‘procession’ (God’s production of the world) and ‘reversion’ (its direction toward God as final cause), with God conceived as the divine Intellect. Verrycken (1990, 222) argues further that Ammonius and his school also conceived of Aristotle’s God as consisting of two Neoplatonic hypostases, the Good and the Intellect, and that he/it could be viewed as either one, depending on one’s point of view: in metaphysics, as we see in Asclepius’ commentary, Aristotle’s God is mostly understood as the Good, “the first origin and final cause of all reality”; in natural philosophy, as we see in Simplicius, God is primarily the demiurgic Intellect, which is itself the final cause of the world’s movement.
3.3 Aristotle and anti-determinism
In his commentary on On Interpretation chapter 9, Ammonius added two other determinist arguments to the famous ‘there will be a sea-battle tomorrow’ argument, making his commentary into a small treatise on determinism. The first of these was the ‘Reaper’ (131,20 ff.), an argument which Ammonius considered more ‘verbal’, which perhaps goes back to Diodorus Cronus and which greatly interested Zeno the Stoic: “if you will [that is, you are going to] reap, it is not the case that perhaps (takha) you will reap and perhaps you will not reap, but you will reap, whatever happens (pantōs); and if you will not reap, in the same way it is not that perhaps you will reap and perhaps you will not reap, but, whatever happens, you will not reap. But in fact, of necessity, either you will reap or you will not reap.” In consequence, Ammonius says, “the ‘perhaps’ is destroyed,” and with it the contingent. Against this, Ammonius argues that if the determinist intends ‘you will reap’ to be contingent, he has already lost his point, but if he intends it as necessary, he is taking for granted what he intends to prove; further, in that case, ‘will reap, whatever happens’ will be true, but the determinist cannot say ‘but in fact either you will reap or you will not reap’, since if one of these is necessary, the other is impossible. Sorabji (1998, 4–5) argues that ‘perhaps’ is ambiguous, marking either a hesitant statement about the future or a statement about present possibilities, and that the determinist argument plays on this ambiguity, something which he thinks Ammonius did not see.
The second determinist argument, said by Ammonius to be ‘more related to the nature of things’, is from divine knowledge (132,8 ff.): “the gods either know in a definite manner the outcome of contingent things or they have absolutely no notion of them or they have an indefinite knowledge of them, just as we do.” Ammonius shows that the gods must have definite knowledge of their creations. Is the future definite, then, and not contingent, since the gods know future facts in a definite manner? Ammonius’ reply to this question is based on the idea (from Iamblichus, originally) that the type of knowledge depends on the type of knower, not on the type of thing known. Therefore (136,1–17), due to their own nature, the gods, and only they, can have definite (hōrismenē) knowledge of future contingent facts, though those facts are indefinite, in themselves, and not determined. Indeed, with the gods nothing is past or future (133,20), for they are outside of time.
Only after discussing these two additional arguments for the abolition of contingency does Ammonius consider the sea-battle argument from Aristotle’s discussion (De Int.18b17–25, 19a30–32): if every affirmation must be true or false and if there is a sea-battle today, it was always true to say that there would be a sea-battle on this day and, hence, it was not possible for this not to happen or not to be going to happen, so that it is necessary for it to happen. Ultimately, all things which are going to happen happen necessarily and none by chance. There has been, since the Stoics, controversy over Aristotle’s answers to this argument. What has been called the ‘standard interpretation’ holds that Aristotle thought that, unlike such sentences about the past or present, sentences asserting future singular contingent facts are neither true nor false, exempting them from the principle of bivalence and avoiding the alleged deterministic consequence that contingency and chance are destroyed. There has likewise been a substantial debate over whether Ammonius was an adherent of the ‘standard interpretation’ of Aristotle’s answer (cf. Sorabji 1998, Kretzmann 1998, Mignucci 1998, Seel 2000ab).
Ammonius, like Boethius, whose answer is somewhat more complicated, attacks the problem by means of his interpretation of Aristotle’s opening remark in the chapter (18a28 ff.) that, while the rule that, of every contradictory pair of sentences, one is true and one false holds among sentences about what is or has happened, as well as sentences about universals taken universally and for singulars in the present or past tense, for universals not said universally it is not necessary, as he has explained in the preceding; “but in the case of future singulars it is not the same.” Ammonius interprets “it is not the same” as indicating a doctrine that sentences about future singular contingent events ‘divide the true and false’ (i.e., obey the principle of bivalence) but do so in an indefinite, ‘not in a definite manner’ (ouk aphōrismenōs): either there will be a sea-battle tomorrow or there will not be one, and certainly there will not both be one and not, but whichever of these two will turn out to be the case, the sentence correctly predicting that outcome is true (and the other false) only in an indefinite, not a definite way. Thus it is not “possible in a definite manner to say which of them will be true and which will be false, since the thing has not already occurred but can both occur and not occur” (130,23 ff.).
The idea of being true ‘in a definite’ or ‘in an indefinite manner’ does not occur in De Int. The interpretation of Aristotle’s response to the sea-battle argument by this distinction probably goes back to Alexander of Aphrodisias (cf. Alexander, Quaestiones 1.4 with Sharples 1992, esp. 32–6). The distinction itself is probably taken over from the discussion of one of two contrary properties belonging to a subject ‘in a definite manner’ in Cat. 10, 12b38–40, which may have been suggested to the commentators by Aristotle’s remark at De Int. 19a33 that “sentences are true in the way things are.” What precisely is meant by the distinction between being true in a definite or in an indefinite manner is obscure, controversial and much debated in the literature: is it the distinction between necessary or causally deterministic truth and mere truth, or that between being already true and going to be, while not yet being, true (cf. Nicostratus’ characterization of ‘the Peripatetics’ in Simplicius, in Cat. 406,13–407,15)?
At the end of his discussion (154,3 ff., interpreting 19a23 ff.), Ammonius brings together necessary and definite truth, but not clearly enough to resolve all questions about the latter. He uses Aristotle’s idea that sentences can be necessarily true in two ways, either absolutely, no matter whether they are said of perishable, existing or non-existent things, or for as long as the predicate holds of the subject. The whole of a disjunction of contradictory assertions, such as ‘either there will be a sea-battle tomorrow or there will not be a sea-battle tomorrow’ or ‘either Socrates is walking or Socrates is not walking’, is necessarily true in the absolute sense. Ammonius says that this is still the case when, due to the nature of the thing in question, one of the disjuncts is true in a definite manner, as in ‘either fire is hot or fire is not hot’ (154,11). It appears, then, that Ammonius treats only the contradictory disjunctions as necessarily true in the absolute sense, while their disjoined parts may be necessarily true in the other sense, that is, only as long as the predicate holds of the subject. In the case of certain facts, such as fire being hot, this is always the case, and of two contradictory disjuncts the one which asserts this fact is always true in a definite manner. In the case of contingent facts, then, one disjunct will only be true in a definite manner when the subject exists and the predicate is true of it. For Ammonius, when Aristotle restricts the discussion to future contingent facts, this makes it necessary that neither member of a contradiction said about them be true in a definite manner, ‘whatever happens’, since each, being contingent, must be susceptible of both truth and falsity ‘however it chances’ or ‘for the most part’ or ‘for the lesser part’. Thus, Ammonius’ explanation of Aristotle’s reply to the determinist has an affinity with his answers to the determinist’s claims about the ‘Reaper’ (there, the determinist is said to have illegitimately assumed that ‘you will reap’ is necessary, not contingent; here, to have ignored Aristotle’s assumption that the disjuncts are contingent) and about divine foreknowledge (there, the gods are said to know things definitely, because these things are not future for the gods, although they are both future and indefinite for us; here, the future disjuncts are each contingent and, thus, not definitely true, it being open for each to be true or false in the event). Ammonius’ approach may not be very satisfying to us, in that it does not answer the question of what kind of truth-value Aristotle or Ammonius assigned to future contingent propositions, but it keeps to the project of De Int., exploring the application of and the exceptions to the rule that every contradictory pair of sentences has one member true and one member false (cf. Whitaker 1996). Boethius (in De Int. II 106,30–107,16, 208,1–18) also uses the distinction between being true in a definite and in an indefinite manner, but there is debate among scholars as to whether he understands this distinction and its role in Aristotle’s argument in just the same way as Ammonius (cf. Sorabji 1998, Kretzmann 1998, Mignucci 1998).
Ammonius was chiefly influential as the founder of the school of Aristotle-interpretation in Alexandria. Nearly all the principal commentators who came after him were his pupils or his pupils’ pupils. He gave a model for the method of exegesis of Aristotle and Plato and his lecturing style made an impression on students. His commentary on De Interpretatione was particularly important and served as a source for Stephanus and other commentators. In its translation by William of Moerbeke, this work was influential on Aquinas and thus on medieval and later Aristotelian philosopy and semantics (cf., e.g., Fortier 2012). Ammonius’ new set of introductions to philosophy and the study of Aristotle, once adopted and adapted by his Alexandrian students—Olympiodorus, Elias, David, Pseudo-Elias, and Philoponus, were also transferred to other languages and cultures. Importantly, a number of his and his students’ works were studied and translated into Persian, Arabic and Syriac, where Ammonius’ influence was carried forward (cf. the brief overview of the diffusion of Ammonius’ new curriculum and its introductions in Sorabji 2016c, 49–53, also with further literature on the translations of works from Ammonius’ school). As an example of this diffusion, take the larger commentary on the Categories by Sergius of Reshaina (d. 536), who studied with Ammonius at Alexandria and later became a physician in his home city (see Hugonnard-Roche 2004 and Watt 2010, both with further literature).
A. Works of Ammonius in Greek and in Translation
- Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca (= CAG), H. Diels (ed.), Berlin, 1882–1909.
- CAG IV 3, Ammonius in Porphyrii Isagogen sive V Voces, A. Busse (ed.), Berlin, 1891.
- CAG IV 4, Ammonius in Aristotelis Categorias, A. Busse (ed.), Berlin, 1895. On Aristotle Categories, S. M. Cohen and G. B. Matthews (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1992.
- CAG IV 5, Ammonius in Aristotelis De Interpretatione Commentarius, A. Busse (ed.), Berlin, 1897. Latin translations: Commentaire sur le Peri Hermeneias d’Aristote, traduction de Guillaume de Moerbeke, G. Verbeke (ed.), Louvain and Paris, 1961. Ammonius Hermeae, Commentaria in Peri hermeneias Aristotelis Übersetzt von Bartholomaeus Sylvanus, Neudruck der Ausgabe Venedig 1549, mit einer Einleitung von Rainer Thiel, Gyburg Radke und Charles Lohr (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca: versiones Latinae temporis resuscitatarum litterarum), Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt, 2005. English translations: Aristotle’s Theory of Language and its Tradition: Texts from 500–1750. Selection, Translation and Commentary, H. Arens (trans.), Amsterdam 1984; On Aristotle’s On Interpretation 1–8, D. Blank (trans.), London and Ithaca 1996; Ammonius. On Aristotle’s On Interpretation 9: with Boethius. On Aristotle’s On Interpretation 9, D. Blank (trans.) (Ammonius) and N. Kretzmann (trans.) (Boethius). London and Ithaca, 1998; Blank’s translation (slightly revised by G. Seel and J.-P. Schneider) is also found in Seel 2000. Ammonius and the Seabattle: texts, commentary and essays (Peripatoi, Bd. 18), Berlin and New York, 2000.
- CAG IV 6, Ammonii in Aristotelis Analyticorum Priorum Librum I Commentarium, M. Wallies (ed.), Berlin, 1899.
- CAG VI 2, Asclepii in Aristotelis Metaphysicorum Libros A-Z Commentaria, M. Hayduck (ed.), Berlin, 1888.
- L. Tarán, 1969. Asclepius of Tralles, Commentary to Nicomachus’ Introduction to Arithmetic, Transactions of the American Philosophical Society (n.s.), 59: 4. Philadelphia.
- CAG XIII 1, Philoponi (olim Ammonii) in Aristotelis Categorias Commentarium, A. Busse (ed.), Berlin, 1898. [For further details on the commentaries of Philoponus, see the entry on Philoponus.]
- CAG XIII 2, Ioannis Philoponi in Aristotelis Analytica Priora Commentaria, M. Wallies (ed.), Berlin, 1905.
- CAG XIII 3, Ioannis Philoponi in Aristotelis Analytica Posteriora Commentaria cum Anonymo in Librum II, M. Wallies (ed.), Berlin, 1909.
- CAG XIV 1, Ioannis Philoponi in Aristotelis Meteorologicorum Librum Primum Commentaria, M. Hayduck (ed.), Berlin, 1901.
- CAG XIV 2, Ioannis Philoponi in Aristotelis Libros De Generatione et Corruptione Commentaria, H. Vitelli (ed.), Berlin, 1897. On Aristotle On Coming-to-be and Perishing 1.1-5, C. J. F. Williams (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1999; On Aristotle On Coming-to-be and Perishing 1.6-2.4, C. J. F. Williams (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1999.
- CAG XV, Ioannis Philoponi in Aristotelis De Anima Libros Commentaria, M. Hayduck (ed.), Berlin, 1897. On Aristotle On the Soul 2.1–6, W. Charlton (trans.), London and Ithaca, 2005; On Aristotle On the soul 2.7–12, W. Charlton (trans.), London and Ithaca, 2005; On Aristotle On the Soul 3.1–8, W. Charlton (trans.), London and Ithaca, 2000; On Aristotle On the Intellect (de Anima 3.4–8), W. Charlton (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1991.
- CAG XVI-XVII, Ioannis Philoponi in Aristotelis Physicorum Libros I-III et V-VIII Commentaria, H. Vitelli (ed.), Berlin, 1887–8. On Aristotle Physics 2, A. R. Lacey (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1993; On Aristotle Physics 3, M. J. Edwards (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1994; On Aristotle Physics 5–8 with Simplicius, On Aristotle on the Void, P. Lettinck and J. O. Urmson (trans.), London and Ithaca, 1994.
B. Historical Sources
- Aeneas of Gaza, Theophrastus, M.E. Colonna (ed.), Naples 1958.
- Damascius, The Philosophical History, text with translation and notes by P. Athanassiadi, Athens, 1999. [Athanassiadi’s Introduction is the best place to start.]
- Zacharias of Mytilene (Scholasticus), Ammonius, M. Minniti Colonna (ed.), Naples, 1973.
- Zacharias of Mytilene, Life of Severus, M.A. Kugener (ed. and trans.), Patrologia Orientalis II, 1904.
- Aeneas of Gaza, Theophrastus, trs. J. Dillon and D. Russell. Zacharias of Mytilene, Ammonius, trs. S. Gertz (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle, London, 2012).
C. Secondary Literature
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- Blank, D. L., 2010. “Ammonius Hermeiou and his School,” in Gerson 2010, 654–666.
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- Griffin, M., 2016. “Ammonius and His School” in A. Falcon, ed., Brill’s Companion to the Reception of Aristotle (Leiden), 394–414. [A good, summary discussion of Ammonius and his pupils.]
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- Heiberg, J. L., 1907. Claudii Ptolemaei Opera Quae Exstant Omnia, Vol. II Opera Astronomica Minora, Lipsiae.
- Hoffmann, P. and I. Hadot, eds., 1990. Simplicius. Commentaire sur les Catégories. I: Introduction, première partie (p. 1–9,3 Kalbfleisch), Leiden.
- Hugonnard-Roche, H., 2004. La logique d’Aristote du grec au syriaque, Paris. [Collected articles 1987–2004.]
- Jackson, R., K. Lycos, H. Tarrant, trs. and eds., Olympiodorus Commentary on Plato’s Gorgias, Leiden.
- Karamanolis, G.E., 2006. Aristotle and Plato in Agreement? Platonists on Aristotle from Antiochus to Porphyry, Oxford. [This book does not treat Ammonius, ending as it does with Porphyry, but it does introduce the issues which arose concerning whether Aristotle and Plato were in accord, a fundamental principle of interpretation for Ammonius.]
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- –––, 1990c. “Infinite Power Impressed, the transformation of Aristotle’s physics and theology,” in Sorabji 1990a, 181–198; a longer version is in Sorabji’s Matter, Space and Motion, London and Ithaca 1988.
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