Louis Althusser

First published Fri Oct 16, 2009; substantive revision Tue Feb 13, 2018

Louis Pierre Althusser (1918–1990) was one of the most influential Marxist philosophers of the 20th Century. As they seemed to offer a renewal of Marxist thought as well as to render Marxism philosophically respectable, the claims he advanced in the 1960s about Marxist philosophy were discussed and debated worldwide. Due to apparent reversals in his theoretical positions, to the ill-fated facts of his life, and to the historical fortunes of Marxism in the late twentieth century, this intense interest in Althusser’s reading of Marx did not survive the 1970s. Despite the comparative indifference shown to his work as a whole after these events, the theory of ideology Althusser developed within it has been broadly deployed in the social sciences and humanities and has provided a foundation for much “post-Marxist” philosophy. In addition, aspects of Althusser’s project have served as inspiration for Analytic Marxism as well as for Critical Realism and Philosophy of Language. Though this influence is not always explicit, Althusser’s work and that of his students continues to inform the research programs of literary studies, political philosophy, history, economics, and sociology. In addition, his autobiography has been subject to much critical attention over the last decade. At present, Althusser’s philosophy as a whole is undergoing a critical reevaluation by scholars who have benefited from the anthologization of hard-to-find and previously unpublished texts and who have begun to engage with the great mass of writings that remain in his archives. His concepts are also being increasingly employed by philosophers, political theorists, and activists who have returned to Marx and to Marxian analyses in order to explain and to envision alternatives to our present socio-economic conjuncture.

1. Life

Louis Althusser was born on October 16th, 1918 in Birmandreis, a suburb of Algiers. Hailing from Alsace on his father’s side of the family, his grandparents were pieds noirs, or French citizens who had chosen to settle in Algeria. At the time of his birth, Althusser’s father was a lieutenant in the French Military. After this service was up, his father returned to Algiers and to his work as a banker. By all accounts save for the retrospective ones contained in his autobiographies, Althusser’s early childhood in North Africa was a contented one. There he enjoyed the comforts of the Mediterranean environment as well as those provided by an extended and stable petit-bourgeois family.

In 1930, his father’s work moved the family to Marseille. Always a good pupil, Althusser excelled in his studies and became active in the Scouts. In 1936, the family moved again, this time to Lyon. There, Althusser was enrolled in the prestigious Lycée du Parc. At the Lycée, he began taking classes in order to prepare for the competitive entrance exams to France’s grandes écoles. Raised in an observant family, Althusser was particularly influenced by professors of a distinctly Catholic tendency. These included the philosophers Jean Guitton and Jean Lacroix as well as the historian Joseph Hours. In 1937, while still at the Lycée, Althusser joined the Catholic youth group Jeunesse étudiantes chrétiennes. This interest in Catholicism and his participation in Catholic organizations would continue even after Althusser joined the Communist Party in 1948. The simultaneous enthusiasm that Althusser showed in Lyon for Royalist politics did not last the war.

In 1939, Althusser performed well enough on the national entrance examinations to be admitted to the École Normale Supérieure (ENS) in Paris. However, before the school year began, he was mobilized into the army. Soon thereafter, he was captured in Vannes along with the rest of his artillery regiment. He spent the remainder of the war as a prisoner of war at a camp in Northern Germany. In his autobiographical writings, Althusser credits the experiences of solidarity, political action, and community that he found in the camp as opening him up to the idea of communism. Indeed, his prison writings collected as Journal de captivité, Stalag XA 1940–1945 evidence these experiences. They also provide evidence of the cycles of deep depression that began for Althusser in 1938 and that would mark him for the rest of his life.

At the end of the war and following his release from the P.O.W. camp in 1945, Althusser took his place at the ENS. Now 27 years old, he began the program of study that was to prepare him for the agrégation, the competitive examination which qualifies one to teach philosophy in French secondary schools and that is often the gateway to doctoral study and university employment. Perhaps not surprisingly for a young man who had just spent half a decade in a prison camp, much happened during the three years he spent preparing for the exam and working on his Master’s thesis. Though still involved in Catholic groups and still seeing himself as a Christian, the movements that Althusser associated with after the war were leftist in their politics and, intellectually, he made a move to embrace and synthesize Christian and Marxist thought. This synthesis and his first published works were informed by a reading of 19th Century German idealist philosophy, especially Hegel and Marx, as well as by progressive Christian thinkers associated with the group Jeunesse de l’Église. Indeed, it was 19th Century German Idealism with which he was most engaged during his period of study at the ENS. In line with this interest (one shared with many other French intellectuals at the time), Althusser obtained his diplôme d’études supérieures in 1947 for a work directed by Gaston Bachelard and titled “On Content in the Thought of G.W.F. Hegel.” In 1948, he passed his agrégation, coming in first on the written portion of the exam and second on the oral. After this showing, Althusser was offered and accepted the post of agrégé répétiteur (director of studies) at the ENS whose responsibility it was to help students prepare for their own agrégations. In this capacity, he began offering courses and tutorials on particular topics in philosophy and on particular figures from the history of philosophy. As he retained this responsibility for more than thirty years and worked with some of the brightest thinkers that France produced during this time (including Alain Badiou, Pierre Bourdieu, and Michel Foucault), through his teaching Althusser left a deep and lasting impression on a generation of French philosophers and on French philosophy.

In addition to inaugurating his extended association with the ENS, the first few years spent in Paris after the war saw Althusser begin three other long-lasting relationships. The first of these was with the French Communist Party, the second with his companion and eventual wife, Hélène Rytman, and the third with French psychiatry. Begun to treat recurrent bouts of depression, this last affiliation continued for the rest of his life and included frequent hospitalization as well as the most aggressive treatments post-war French psychiatry had to offer such as electroconvulsive therapy, narco-analysis, and psychoanalysis.

The second relationship begun by Althusser was little happier and no less dependent than the first. At its outset, Althusser’s bond with Hélène Rytman was complicated by his almost total inexperience with women and by her being eight years older than him. It was also made difficult by the vast differences in their experience of the world and by her relationship with the Communist Party. Whereas Althusser had known only home, school, and P.O.W. camp, Rytman had traveled widely and had long been active in literary and radical circles. At the time the two met, she was also embroiled in a dispute with the Party over her role in the resistance during World War II.

Though Althusser was not yet a Party member, like many of his generation, he emerged from the War deeply sympathetic to its moral aims. His interest in Party politics and involvement with Party members grew during his time as a student at the ENS. However, the ENS’ suspicion of communists as well as Hélène Rytman’s troubles with the Party complicated Althusser’s relationship with each of these institutions. Nonetheless, shortly after being offered the post of agrégé répétiteur (and thus safe from being bypassed for the position due to his membership), Althusser joined the Communist Party. For the next few years, Althusser tried to advance the aims of the Communist Party as well as the goal of getting Rytman accepted back into it. He did so by being a good militant (going to cell meetings, distributing tracts, etc), by re-starting a Marxist study group at the ENS (the Cercle Politzer), and by making inquiries into Rytman’s wartime activities in the hopes of clearing her name. By his own account, he made a terrible activist and he also failed to rehabilitate Rytman’s reputation. Nonetheless, his relationship with the Party and with Rytman deepened during this period.

During the 1950s, Althusser lived two lives that were only somewhat inter-related: one was that of a successful, if somewhat obscure academic philosopher and pedagogue and the other that of a loyal Communist Party Member. This is not to say that Althusser was politically inactive at the school or that his communism did not influence his philosophical work. On the contrary, Althusser recruited colleagues and students to the Party and worked closely with the communist cell based at the ENS. In addition, at mid-decade, he published a few introductions to Marxist philosophy. However, in his teaching and advising, he mostly avoided bringing in Marxist philosophy and Communist politics. Instead, he catered to student interest and to the demands of each new agrégation by engaging closely with classic philosophical texts and with contemporary philosophy and social science. Further, the bulk of his scholarship was on 18th Century political philosophy. Indeed, the only book-length study Althusser published during his lifetime was a work on Montesquieu, which appeared at the end of the decade. At the ENS, Althusser’s professionalism as well as his ability to think institutionally was rewarded in 1954 with a promotion to secrétaire de l’école littéraire, a post where he had some responsibility for the management and direction of the school.

It would have surprised no one if Althusser had continued to influence French political and philosophical life subtly, through the students that he mentored, through his scholarship on the history of political philosophy, through the colloquia among philosophers, scientists, and historians that he organized, and through his routine work as a Party member. However, in 1961, with an essay titled “On the Young Marx,” Althusser aggressively entered into a heated debate about the continuity of Marx’s oeuvre and about what constitutes the core of Marxist philosophy. Appearing at a time of crisis in the French Communist Party’s direction and seeming to offer a “scientific” alternative to Stalinism and to the humanist revisions of Marxism then being proffered, the theoretical viewpoint offered by Althusser gained adherents. Invigorated by this recognition and by the possibility that theoretical work might actually change Communist Party practice, Althusser began to publish regularly on Marxist philosophy. These essays occasioned much public discussion and philosophical activity both in France and abroad. At the same time as these essays began creating a stir, Althusser changed his teaching style at the ENS and began to offer collaborative seminars where he and his students attempted a “return to Marx” and to Marx’s original texts. In 1965, the fruit of one of these seminars was published as Reading Capital. That same year, the essays on Marxist theory that had made such a sensation were collected and published in the volume For Marx. Amplifying these books’ collective impact well beyond the realm of intra-party discussion was the general trend in literary and social scientific theory labeled “structuralism” and with which Althusser’s re-reading of Marx was identified.

At mid-decade, Althusser seized on these works’ popularity and the fact that his arguments had created a faction within the French Communist Party composed mostly of young intelligentsia to try and force change within the Party. This gambit to have the Party directed by theorists rather than by a Central Committee whose Stalinism remained entrenched and who believed in the organic wisdom of the worker met with little success. At the most, he succeeded in carving out some autonomy for theoretical reflection within the Party. Even though it is his most well known intervention, this was not the first attempt by Althusser to try and influence the Party (he had tried once before during the mid 1950s from his position as cell leader at the ENS) and it would not be his last. While he lost much of the student support that his work had created when he remained silent during the “revolutionary” events of May 1968 (he was in a psychiatric hospital at the time), he campaigned once more to influence the Party during the mid 1970s. This intervention occurred in response to the French Communist Party’s decision to abandon traditional Marxist-Leninist aspects of its platform so as to better ally itself with the Socialist Party. Though Althusser’s position was well publicized and found its supporters, in the end, his arguments were unable to motivate the Party’s rank-and-file such that its leadership would reconsider its decision.

During the decades in which he became internationally known for his re-thinking of Marxist philosophy, Althusser continued in his post at the ENS. There he took on increasing institutional responsibility while continuing to edit and, with François Maspero, to publish his own work and that of others in the series Théorie. In 1975, Althusser acquired the right to direct research on the basis of his previously published work. Shortly after this recognition, he married his longtime companion, Hélène Rytman.

Following the French Left’s and the Communist Party’s electoral defeats in the 1978 elections, Althusser’s bouts of depression became more severe and more frequent. In November 1980, after a painful surgery and another bout of mental illness, which saw him hospitalized for most of the summer and whose symptoms continued after his return to the ENS in the fall, Althusser strangled his wife. Before he could be arrested for the murder, he was sent to a mental hospital. Later, when an examining magistrate came to inform him of the crime of which he was accused, Althusser was in so fragile a mental state that he could not understand the charges or the process to which he was to be submitted and he was left at the hospital. After an examination, a panel of psychiatrists concluded that Althusser was suffering at the time of the murder from severe depression and iatrogenic hallucinations. Citing a French law (since changed), which states that “there is neither crime nor delict where the suspect was in a state of dementia at the time of the action,” the magistrate in charge of Althusser’s case decided that there were no grounds on which to pursue prosecution.

The last ten years of Althusser’s life were spent in and out of mental hospitals and at the apartment in Paris’ 20th arrondissement where he had planned to retire. During this period, he was visited by a few loyal friends and kept up some correspondences. Given his mental state, his frequent institutionalizations, his anomie, and the drugs he was prescribed, these were not very productive years. However, at mid-decade, he did find the energy to re-visit some of his old work and to attempt to construct from it an explicit metaphysics. He also managed to write an autobiography, a text he averred was intended to provide the explanation for the murder of his wife that he was never able to provide in court. Both texts only appeared posthumously. When his mental and physical health deteriorated again in 1987, Althusser went to live at a psychiatric hospital in La Verrière, a village to the west of Paris. There, on the 22nd of October, 1990, he died of a heart attack

2. Early Work (1946–60)

Despite its being anthologized and translated during the mid 1990s, there has until recently been relatively little critical attention paid to Althusser’s writings prior to 1961. Certainly, in terms of method, style, and inspiration, the Althusser found in these works differs significantly from the Althusser of For Marx and Reading Capital. In his writings from the 1940s, for instance, his method and conclusions resemble those of the Marxist Humanists of whom he would later be so critical, while texts from the 1950s deploy without irony the Stalinist shibboleths he would later subject to such castigation. Nonetheless, as these texts announce many of Althusser’s perennial themes and because some of the contradictions these works possess are shared with his classic texts and are repeated again in his late work, these early essays, books, and translations are worthy of examination

2.1 Christianity and Marxism

Althusser’s philosophical output between 1946 and 1961 can roughly be divided into four categories. The first category includes those essays, mostly written between 1946 and 1951, where Althusser explores possible rapports between Christianity and Marxism. In the first of these essays “The International of Decent Feelings,” Althusser argues from what he takes to be “the truth of Christianity” against the popular post-war view that the misery, guilt, and alienation of the human condition in the atomic age is equally experienced by all subjects. For him, this existentialist diagnosis is a type of idolatry: it replaces recognition of our equality before God with our equality before the fear of death. In that it does so, it is twice anti-Christian. For, in addition to the sin of idolatry (death equals God), it fails to acknowledge the existence of a particular class, the proletariat, for whom anguish is not its lot and who is actually capable of delivering the emancipation from fear by re-appropriating the products of human production, including the atomic bomb. A subsequent essay from 1947, “A Matter of Fact,” continues in this vein, suggesting the necessity of socialist means for realizing Christian ends. It also includes a Hegelian critique of the existing Catholic Church which suggests that the church is incapable of such an alliance without a theological revolution. Each of these essays includes the suggestion that critique and reform will occasion a better church and a truer Christianity. By 1949, however, Althusser was totally pessimistic about this possibility and, in a letter to his mentor Jean Lacroix, he argued that the sole possibility for realizing Christian values is through communist action. Though some critics have argued that Christian and Catholic values and modes of reasoning inform all of Althusser’s philosophy, any explicit consideration of a practical and theoretical reconciliation between the two was abandoned at this point in Althusser’s development.

2.2 Hegelian Marxism

The second category of Althusser’s early work, one closely related to the first, are those texts that deal with Hegel. Written primarily for an academic audience, they approach Hegel’s philosophy either critically, in terms of the history of its reception and use, or exegetically, in terms of examining what possibility Hegel’s metaphysics, logic, politics, epistemology, and understanding of subjectivity offer to those interested in understanding and encouraging societal transformation. Between 1946 and 1950, the results of Althusser’s exegeses were positive: Hegel indeed had something to offer. This judgment finds its most detailed explanation in Althusser’s 1947 thesis “On Content in the thought of G.W.F. Hegel.” In addition to detailing Hegel’s relation to Kant and criticizing the simplification of the dialectic by Hegel’s commentators, Althusser argues in this work that the dialectic “cannot be attacked for its form” (1947, 116). Instead, Hegel can only be critiqued for a failure of the contents of the form (as these contents are specified in Hegel’s historical and political works) to have actually fulfilled the absolute idea. Following the Young Hegelians, then, Althusser uses Hegel’s dialectic against itself to criticize claims like the one made in The Philosophy of Right that the Prussian state is the fulfillment of the dialectic. Though he uses Marx’s Critique of Hegel’s Philosophy of Right to make his points and though he is in agreement with Marx that the Hegelian concept, realized in thought, must now be realized in the world, Althusser does not suggest in his thesis that Marx’s philosophy leaves Hegel’s insights about, history, logic, and the subject behind. Instead, he contends that Marx is guilty of committing the same error as Hegel in mistaking historical content for the fulfillment of the dialectic. Because all knowledge is historical, Althusser argues, Marxists can only correct for this error by appeal to the idea of the dialectic and to its end in the absolute and the eternal, to a time “when the human totality will be reconciled with its own structure” (1947, 156). Something like this argument will appear again in his classical work as a critique of the empiricist tendency in Marxist philosophy.

2.3 Marx not Hegel

By the early 1950s, Althusser’s judgments that Marxism was, of necessity, Hegelian and that it aimed at human fulfillment had undergone revision. This transition to thinking about Marx as the originator of a philosophy totally distinct from Hegel’s was signaled in a review essay from 1950 which argued that the post-war mania for Hegel in France was only a bourgeois attempt to combat Marx. In two short essays from 1953 on Marxist philosophy, this switch is fully apparent. In these texts, Althusser aligns himself with the position advanced by Mehring and Lenin that, at a certain point in Marx’s development, Hegel is left behind and that, afterwards, Marx forged his own original concepts and methodology. In his description of what these concepts and methodology are, Althusser pretty much follows the Party line, insisting that Marx reversed the Hegelian dialectic, that historical materialism is a science, that the sciences verify dialectical materialism, and that the proletariat needs to be taught Marxist science from above. Though these essays repeat the Party philosophy as formulated by Lenin, Stalin, and Zhdanov, they also include recognizable Althusserian themes and show his thinking about these themes to be in transition. For instance, both essays retain the idea from Althusser’s 1947 thesis about the quasi-transcendental status of present scientific knowledge. Both also anticipate future concerns in their speculations about the ideological character of current scientific knowledge and in their incorporation of ideas from Mao about the relationship between theory and practice. Written as a response to Paul Ricoeur and representing the last example of this third category of Althusser’s early work, a text from 1955 argues for the objectivity of historical science. This is a theme to which he would return. Noticeably absent from this body of work, however, are the detailed and original claims Althusser would make in the early 1960s about Marx’s philosophy.

2.4 Historical Work: Montesquieu and Feuerbach

Two essays that Althusser wrote in the mid 1950s were the first to focus exclusively on Marxist philosophy and are interesting inasmuch as they evidence his rejection of Hegel and his embrace of the Party’s Marxism-Leninism. In addition, these texts suggest the need for a thorough study of Marx. This study, however, would wait until the beginning of the next decade. For the rest of the 1950s, most of Althusser’s published work involved the study of philosophical figures who preceded Marx. These figures included Montesquieu, on whose political philosophy and theory of history he wrote a book-length study, and Feuerbach, whose writings he translated and commented upon. The dual thesis of Althusser’s Montesquieu book: that, insofar as Montesquieu studies the “concrete behavior of men” he resists idealism and inaugurates the study of history as a science and that, insofar as Montesquieu accepts past and present political formations as delimiting the possibilities for political life, he remains an idealist, is one that will find echoes in Althusser’s study of Marx during the next decade. Similarly, inasmuch as he makes the argument in a commentary (1960) that part of his intention in translating Feuerbach is to show just what Marx owes in his early writings to the author of The Essence of Christianity so that these may be better seen as absent from Marx’s mature work, these studies of Feuerbach can also be seen as propaedeutic to the study of Marx which Althusser inaugurated in 1961 with his article “On the Young Marx”.

3. Classic Work (1961–1966)

With the perspective afforded by the mass of posthumous writings published since the 1990s, it has become clear that Althusser was perennially concerned with important issues in metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of science, historiography, hermeneutics, and political philosophy. However, it is also true that the primary medium Althusser employed for thinking through problems in these areas was Marxist philosophy. This is especially true of the period between 1961 and 1966 when the majority of his published and unpublished work concerned itself with how to read Marx, the definition of Marxist philosophy, and how to understand and apply Marxian concepts. In addition, if we are to take Althusser’s retrospective word for it, the pieces he published during this period were intended as political-theoretical acts, polemics meant to respond to contemporary opinions and policies and to shift the terms of these arguments as well as the actions which were their results. For these reasons, it is natural when discussing these texts to focus upon the contexts that engendered them and upon the positions within Marxist philosophy that Althusser stakes out by their means. Alternatively, as Althusser indicates in many of these pieces his debts to contemporaneous theorists and to philosophical predecessors such as Spinoza, there is the temptation to understand his thought as a combination of the insights contributed by these thinkers with Marxist philosophy. While each is a useful approach to understanding and explaining Althusser’s philosophy, when excessive attention is paid to one or another of them, one risks historicizing his contributions or suggesting that they are merely derivative. Seeking to avoid either result, even though the following discussion will note the context for Althusser’s work, its relation to Marxist philosophy, and the non-Marxist philosophical insights that contribute to its method and conclusions, this account will also suggest the uniqueness of his contributions to hermeneutics, metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of science, historiography, and political philosophy.

For multiple, overlapping, and complicated reasons of which the most relevant may be the discrediting of Stalin’s personage, policies, and version of Marxist philosophy that followed Khrushchev’s “Secret Speech,” Europe in the late 1950s saw a blossoming of political and philosophical alternatives to the version of Marxism-Leninism promulgated by the Soviet Union. This version of Marxist philosophy had dominated European leftist thought and action since the dawn of the Cold War in 1947 and, in France, was widely disseminated via Communist Party schools and literature. While political and philosophical change were slow to occur in the French Communist Party, by the late 1950s, many intellectuals associated with the Party began to ask questions about what constitutes the core of Marx’s philosophy and about how this philosophy guides, relates to, or allows for political action.

For many of these intellectuals, answering this question meant a return to Marx’s early work (those texts written before 1845) in the hopes of finding the “key” to his philosophy. In pieces like “Contribution to the Critique of Hegel’s Philosophy of Right” (1844), and the Economic and Philosophic Manuscripts (1844), these thinkers found and championed a Marx obviously indebted to a Hegelian dialectical understanding of subjectivity and historical development and deeply concerned about ending human alienation. It is to this project—that of finding the true method, aim, and intent of Marx’s philosophy in his early work’s emphasis on the realization of full human freedom and potentials through dialectical historical change—that Althusser made the first of his public “interventions” into Marxist philosophy. He inaugurated this effort with the essay “On the Young Marx” (1961), which sought to demonstrate that this method of looking to Marx’s early work for the key to his philosophy was methodologically suspect and ideologically driven. Further, in this essay and in subsequent work, he developed an alternate method of investigation or “reading” that would allow Marx’s true philosophy to be revealed in its purity.

From the fruits of this new method of reading, Althusser argued that not only was Marx the originator of a new philosophy, Dialectical Materialism, that had nothing to do with its Hegelian and Feuerbachian predecessors, but that he also founded a new science, Historical Materialism, which broke with and superseded such ideological and pre-scientific precursors as the political economics of Smith and Ricardo. For the most part, the essays collected in For Marx (1965) and the seminar papers issued as Reading Capital (1965) develop and utilize this method of reading in order to justify and describe Marxist philosophy and Marxist science as well as to distinguish between these two theoretical activities. In so doing, Althusser says quite a bit about the nature of knowledge and the general relations between philosophy, science, politics, and ideology. Further, Althusser applies this hermeneutic method to argue against what he labeled “empiricist” understandings of Marx. These included the Humanist interpretations of Marx described above as well as variations on the orthodox Marxist-Leninist theory, which specified the strict determination of culture and history by the existing modes of economic exchange and resulting class struggles. The following paragraphs discuss this theory of reading, how it produces a different understanding of Marx’s philosophy than that which is derived from Humanist and Economist readings, and how it informs his epistemology, philosophy of science, historiography, and political philosophy.

3.1 Hermeneutic Theory

The label that Althusser gave to the method by which he approached Marx’s texts was that of a “symptomatic reading.” Instead of looking back at Marx’s early work in order to find the “essence” of his philosophy, one of whose expressions was Capital, and also instead of trying to build a true or consistent theory out of Marx’s oeuvre by explaining away contradictions within it and noting certain passages as key, Althusser argued that Marx’s true philosophy was largely absent from his work prior to 1845. Even in mature texts such as Capital, Althusser maintained that Marx’s philosophy remained largely implicit, as the background system of concepts which allowed the scientific work Marx was involved in generating to take place. The symptomatic method of reading was designed to make these concepts explicit and “to establish the indispensable minimum for the consistent existence of Marxist philosophy (1965a [2005], 35).

The three inspirations Althusser gave for this interpretive method were those provided by Spinoza, Freud by way of Lacan, and that provided by Marx himself. In addition, he added to these examples insights from the French tradition of historical epistemology about the way in which sciences come to be constituted. One of the ideas borrowed from Spinoza was the contention that texts and authors are the products of their times and that the thoughts authors set down on the page cannot help but be a part of, and be affected by, the ideological currents that accompany and allow for the satisfaction of needs in a specific era. So then, similar to the way in which Spinoza argued in the Theological Political-Treatise that by engaging in a materialist historical study of the Bible one could disentangle those prophetic laws and commands which were merely the result of temporal exigencies and the prophet’s imagination from those which represented the true word of God, so Althusser argued that one could disentangle those concepts which were merely ideological in Marx’s texts from those which comprised his true philosophy.

Though this theory was later to be complicated and revised, during this period, Althusser consistently argued that Marx’s work prior to 1845 was ideological and that it was saturated with non-Marxian concepts borrowed from Hegel’s and Feuerbach’s philosophical anthropologies. Althusser did recognize that some of Marx’s early work is marked by its rejection of idealist premises and concepts. However, inasmuch as this early work was seen to espouse a telic view of humanity in which the individual and society was said to undergo a necessary historico-dialectical development, Althusser identified it as fundamentally Hegelian. That there was a materialist correction to this basic narrative with Marx’s embrace of Feuerbach, Althusser also granted. However, the replacement by Marx of a speculative anthropology which saw the historical development of society as the self-fulfillment of human freedom with a materialist anthropology that cited the same logic of development but which specified that the motor of this development was human beings in their “sensuous life activity,” was seen by Althusser to represent little conceptual and no logical advance from Hegel.

This “theory of the break,” which held that Marx’s early work was Hegelian and ideological and that, after a decisive rupture in 1845 and then a long period of transition between 1845–1857, his work became recognizably Marxist and scientific, would seem to indicate that all one has to do to understand Marx’s philosophy is to read this mature work. However, the actual case is not so simple. While reading Capital and other late works is necessary for understanding Marx’s philosophy, it is not sufficient. It is not sufficient, Althusser argued, because, even in his post-1857 writings, Marx provides no systematic exposition of his epistemology or his ideas about social structure, history, and human nature, all of which were necessary for Marxist philosophy’s consistent and continuing existence.

Many interpreters of Marx, and not just those Althusser directly engaged with during the early 1960s, have maintained that such texts as the 1859 Preface and the 1844 Manuscripts provide keys to understanding Marx’s philosophy. However, Althusser made the case that these texts were contradictory and insufficient for this purpose. It is with this contention that the models provided by psychoanalysis and by Marx’s own critique of classical political economy come to inform Althusser’s overall hermeneutic strategy. Part of this strategy, Althusser maintains, is directly taken from Marx’s own method. Thus, in a way parallel to Marx pointing out in Capital V.II (1885) that Adam Smith needed the concept of the “value of labor” for his explanations of capitalist economic activity but could not fully generate it out of the systems of ideas available to him, Althusser argued that, though Marx was recognizably engaged in the work of Historical Materialism in Capital, the philosophical theory or background conceptual framework that allowed this investigation to proceed was not fully articulated.

The explicit project of Reading Capital and of many of the essays included in For Marx was to make these fundamental concepts explicit. It was to do so by paying attention to the theoretical “problematic,” or background ideological framework in which the work was generated, by analyzing those passages where a philosophical concept had to have been in use but was not made explicit, and by noting and explaining where and why one theoretical pronouncement is in contradiction with itself or with another passage. For Althusser, such areas of Marx’s text are “symptoms,” in the psychoanalytic sense of the word, of the necessary but unarticulated philosophical framework that underwrites and allows his scientific investigations. Of these frameworks, Marx was not fully conscious. However, they were what allowed him to investigate and describe such socio-economic events as the transformation of money into capital without recourse to Hegelian logic and concepts. Althusser argues that by paying attention to these passages in Marx’s text as well as by seeking out Marxist concepts as these were developed during the course of practical Marxist activity by theorists such as Lenin and Mao, an attentive reader can render explicit Marx’s philosophy.

That the concepts Althusser derived from his symptomatic reading of Marx, Lenin, and Mao were Marxist concepts was avowed. Nevertheless, Althusser also acknowledged that some of the concepts found latent in these texts were derived from and consistent with his philosophical and social scientific contemporaries as well as with those of Spinoza. Of course, this is not inconsistent with the theory of reading and authorship that underwrites a symptomatic reading of a text. Inasmuch as authors and readers are always said to think with concepts borrowed from or supplied by the problematic that they inhabit, there is no such thing as an innocent or objective reading: we understand things with and through the concepts available to us. Perhaps nowhere is this borrowing more evident than in Althusser’s ideas about how scientific and philosophic knowledge is generated. Though Althusser is very careful to back up his arguments about Marx’s epistemology with close analyses of Marx’s work, it is apparent that the model for knowledge acquisition that is developed in Reading Capital owes much to Spinoza and to the French tradition of historical epistemology.

3.2 Epistemology and Philosophy of Science

With his re-reading of Marx, Althusser wished to offer an alternative to the two then dominant understandings of Marx’s philosophy. Both understandings were charged with the same mistake. This mistake was, fundamentally, an epistemological one: each cast Marx as an empiricist. At first glance, this charge might seem ridiculous. This is especially the case as, according to Althusser’s own critique, both understandings of Marx offered variants of the Hegelian claim that there is a reason to history. For Althusser, however, both readings were “empiricist” inasmuch as each ascribed to Marx a theory of knowledge in which the subject, by means of a process of observation and abstraction, comes to know what an object really and truly is, according to its essence. This is a definition of empiricism meant to include philosophers as diverse as Locke, Kant, and Hegel and traditions as varied as British Empiricism, German Idealism, Positivism, and Pragmatism. In the case of Humanist Marxism, the object that comes to be known by its essence is the human subject in its full freedom. It does so by means of critique and by creatively overcoming that which is alien to it or “merely historical.” In the case of orthodox Marxism-Leninism, this object is the economy, the reality that underlies, causes, and can explain all historical structures and transformations. The economy comes to be known as it truly is only by the proletariat, by those whom the historical process has endowed with an objective gaze and who possess the ability to make this truth objective.

In opposition to the empiricist model of knowledge production, Althusser proposes that true or scientific knowledge is distinguished from ideology or opinion not by dint of an historical subject having abstracted the essence of an object from its appearances. Instead, this knowledge is understood to be produced by a process internal to scientific knowledge itself. Though this transformation takes place entirely in thought, Althusser does not maintain that scientific knowledge makes no use of facts. However, these facts or materials are never brute. Rather, specific sciences start with pre-existing concepts or genera such as “humors,” “unemployment,” “quasars,” or “irrational numbers.” These genera may be ideological in part or in whole. Science’s job is to render these concepts scientific. This labor is what Althusser terms “theoretical practice.” The result of this practice is scientific knowledge. Scientific knowledge is produced by means of applying to these genera the body of concepts or “theory” that the science possesses for understanding them. This body of concepts may be more or less unified and consistent and it may be more or less consciously articulated. Further, the sum of the individual concepts that this theory consists of delimits the possible ways in which the genera that a science begins with can be understood.

When applied, a science’s theory weeds out ideological notions associated with the original concept or genera. The result of this application of theory to genera is the transformation of the “ideological generality into a scientific generality” (1963b [2005], 185). An example of such a process is the transformation in medical science of a concept like “phlegmatic humors” into the idea of blood-borne pathogens by dint of the theory of circulation and infectious disease. Once generated, such scientific concepts inform regular scientific practice, allowing specific research programs within an individual science to progress. Althusser himself gives examples of three such major transformations. The first is the founding of modern physics by Galileo, the other that of Greek mathematics, and the third, that of Marx’s founding of the science of Historical Materialism out of Classical Political Economy. Each of these foundings is marked by what Althusser terms an “epistemological break,” or a period when ideological concepts are replaced by scientific ones. Any similarity here to Kuhnian ideas about revolutionary and normal science is not surprising. Both Canguilhem and Bachelard, from whom Althusser drew inspiration for his theory, were part of a dialogue that took in the work of Alexander Koyré on scientific revolutions, a thinker from whom Kuhn, in turn, drew his inspiration.

Althusser’s debt to the tradition of French historical epistemology in this account of knowledge production and philosophy of science should now be evident. However, this epistemology’s Marxian and Spinozistic elements may be less pronounced. The vocabulary adopted above to express this theory, however, gestures to both influences. For Althusser, Marx’s founding of the science of history is crucial not only to politics (as will be addressed below) but also to understanding all of human activity, including scientific activity. That there is a circular logic to this epistemological theory, Althusser readily admits, for it is only the science of Historical Materialism that allows us to understand scientific practice in general. Althusser, though, is comfortable with this circularity. This is because, insofar as this understanding of scientific practice in general allows us to understand how individual sciences produce their knowledge, Historical Materialism is a science that functions like any other.

For Althusser, the concept that helps to produce this understanding of scientific practices is that of the “mode of production.” With it, he argues, Marx supplied theorists with an idea sufficient to comprehend the way in which we materially produce our selves, our environments, our knowledges, and our histories. Indeed, this concept makes it possible to analyze all of our activities in their specificity and to understand them in their relation to the totality of which they are a part. As it must be if we are to make sense of scientific practice as one aspect of the total mode of production, much more than the activity of economic production must be included in this totality of productive practices. Added by Althusser to these two aspects of the mode of production are those of ideological, political, and philosophical production, among others.

In each of the practices that together comprise, at any given time, a specific mode of production, some form or forms of labor uses the existing means of production to transform existing materials into new products. According to Althusser, this realization is Marx’s basic insight. In scientific production, for example, thinkers use existing theories to transform existing concepts into new, scientific concepts. However, and this is where Althusser’s Spinozism becomes apparent and also where he breaks with economistic understandings of Marx, it is not the case that the analysis of any one mode of production within the totality of productive practices is capable of generating an understanding of the way in which all rest of the productive processes are causally determined. Rather, and in line with the parallelism attributed by Leibniz to Spinoza, as each productive process transforms a unique material (concepts in science, goods in economics, social relations in politics), each process can only be understood in terms of its unique causal structure. In addition, and again also in a way similar to Spinoza’s account of substance as seen from different aspects, each productive process is understood to stand in relation to and play a part of a complexly structured whole, none of which is reducible to being the simple or essential cause of the others.

That Althusser regards most, if not all, human activity as consisting of material processes of production and reproduction can be used as a key to understanding other parts of his philosophy. These include his thoughts on the structure of the social and political world, the historical process, and philosophy. As philosophy is closely related to science and because it is charged with a task that allows the production of knowledge about the other socio-economic practices to be generated, it is probably best to start with Althusser’s understanding of philosophy as a material practice of production before proceeding to a discussion of how Althusser understands the other practices listed above.

3.3 The Role of Philosophy

According to Althusser, most activity labeled “philosophy” is really a type of ideological production. By this, he means to say that most philosophy reproduces, in highly abstract form, notions about the world whose effect is to sustain existing socio-economic relations. As such, philosophy merely reflects the background values, attitudes, and ideas that allow the socio-economic world to function. However, for Althusser, genuine philosophy functions as a “Theory of theoretical practice” (1965b). In this mode, it works to provide an aid to scientific practice by distinguishing between ideological concepts and scientific ones as well as by clarifying and rendering consistent the scientific concepts that enable a science to transforms existing ideas into scientific knowledge.

For Althusser, it is not necessary that this process of distinction and clarification be accomplished before a specific theoretical practice can generate scientific knowledge. In fact, scientific activity often proceeds without a clear understanding of the concepts that allow it to produce its knowledge. Indeed, Althusser maintained that this was Marx’s lot when he was writing Capital: scientific knowledge of the capitalist economic system was being produced, but Marx did not possess a full awareness of the concepts allowing this production. According to this definition of philosophy as the Theory of theoretical practice, Althusser’s re-reading of Capital and other texts was philosophical insofar as it was able to name and distinguish the concepts that allowed Marx’s scientific analysis of history to proceed.

3.4 Marxist Philosophy

The latent concepts rendered explicit by the practice of symptomatic reading were said by Althusser to constitute the theory of Dialectical Materialism, or what is the same thing, Marx’s philosophy. With these concepts made explicit, Althusser believed that Marxist science, or Historical Materialism, could employ them in order to achieve better analyses of specific modes of production and better understandings of the opportunities that specific modes of production presented for political change. Some of these concepts have already been articulated in the discussion of the mode of production above, but without being named. To label these concepts and then to add some more, the idea that each individual productive process or element stands in relation to and plays a part of a complexly structured whole, none of which is reducible to being the simple or essential cause of the others, is what Althusser terms the idea of “structural causality.” This concept, in turn, is closely related to the idea of “overdetermination” or the theory that every element in the total productive process constituting a historical moment is determined by all the others.

Another Marxist philosophical concept that allows the historical materialist scientist to understand the logic of a specific mode of production is that of “contradiction.” This is the idea that, at any given period, multiple, concrete and definite practices take place within a mode of production. Among and within these specific practices, there may or may not be tensions. To take an example from Marx’s chapter on “Primitive Accumulation” in Capital V.I, at the same time as peasants holdings were being expropriated in the late 15th and early 16th centuries by a nascent bourgeoisie, the church and the aristocracy were passing laws against this appropriation. Any isolable element of the total structure, be it a person, a social class, an institution, or the state, in some way reflects and embodies these practices and these antagonisms and as such each is said to be “overdetermined.” Further, Althusser specifies that the development of productive practices within a specific mode of production is often “uneven” in addition to possibly being antagonistic. This means, for instance, that some economic elements within a whole may be more or less capitalistic while others simultaneously operate according to socialist norms. Thus the development within a mode of production of the practices specific to it is not necessarily homogenous or linear.

Added to the Marxian concepts of structural causality, contradiction, uneven development, and overdetermination is that of the “structure in dominance.” This concept designates that major element in a structural whole that tends to organize all of the other practices. In much of the contemporary world and inasmuch as it tends to organize the production of moral values, scientific knowledge, the family, art, etc. this structure is the economic practice of commodity production and consumption. However, in another era and in other places, it may be the production and dissemination of religious beliefs and practices that dominates and organizes the socio-economic structure.

3.5 Social and Political Philosophy, Historiography

With this understanding of the elements that compose any socio-economic structure and their relations made explicit, something can now be said about the social and political philosophies that follow from it. First, with the idea that human individuals are merely one of the sites at which the contradictory productive forces that characterize an era are enacted, Althusser signals that the primary object of social philosophy is not the human individual. Second, with the idea that the state produced by political activity is merely one productive process among others, Althusser signals that the primary element in political philosophy is not the state. Though both states and individuals are important elements of the socio-economic whole, nothing philosophical is learned by examining the essence of the individual or the way in which justice is embodied by the state.

As Althusser understands them, whatever conceptions we have of the nature of human beings or about the proper function of the state are historically generated and serve to reproduce existing social relations. In other words, they are ideological. Apart from the necessity of human beings to engage in productive relations with other human beings and with their environment in order to produce their means of subsistence, there is no human nature or essence. This is the core of Althusser’s “anti-humanist” position. Further, though some order must exist in order to allow for the production and reproduction of social life, there is no essential or best form that this order must take. This is not to say that human beings do not conceive of or strive for the best order for social life or that they do not believe that they are essentially free or equal and deserving of rights. It also does not mean that all of our ideas are homogenous and that heterogeneous ideas about what is best cannot exist side by side in the same system without leading to conflict (though they sometimes do). However, the science of Historical Materialism has revealed the desire for such orders to be historically generated along with the ideas about human nature that justify them.

This account of the ideological role of our conceptions of human nature and of the best political arrangement shows Althusser to differ little from interpretations of Marx which hold that political ideologies are the product of and serve existing economic relations. However, and as was detailed above, Althusser rejects the simple understanding of causality offered by this model in which economic practices order consciousness and our cultural practices. He also rejects the philosophy of history that often accompanies this model. This philosophy has it that certain economic practices not only generate corresponding cultural practices, but that there is a pattern to economic development in which each economic order inexorably leads to its own demise and replacement by a different economic system. In this understanding of history, feudalism must lead to capitalism and capitalism to socialism. Althusser, however, argues against the idea that history has a subject (such as the economy or human agency) and that history has a goal (such as communism or human freedom). History, for Althusser, is a process without a subject. There are patterns and orders to historical life and there is historical change. However, there is no necessity to any of these transformations and history does not necessarily progress. Transformations do occur. However, they do so only when the contradictions and levels of development inherent in a mode of production allow for such change.

4. Revisions (1966–78)

From the time of its initial dissemination, Althusser’s re-reading of Marx was met by almost equal amounts of enthusiasm and castigation. For every reader who found in his prose an explanation of Marx’s philosophy and science that rendered Marx philosophically respectable and offered renewed hope for Marxist theory, there were critics who judged his work to be idealist, Stalinist, dogmatist, or excessively structuralist, among myriad other charges. Though many of the initial reactions were contradictory and evidenced misunderstandings of what Althusser was up to, compelling criticisms were also offered. One was that Althusser was only able to offer his reading by ignoring much of what Marx actually wrote about his logic and about the concepts important to his analysis. Another criticism, and one voiced to Althusser by leaders of the French Communist Party, was that Althusser’s reading of Marx offered little on the relationship between Marxist theory and Marxist political practice.

It took a long time before Althusser explicitly addressed the charge that he had ignored much of what Marx had to say about his own logic and concepts. However, buffeted by these criticisms and with a sense that there were idealist or “theoreticist” tendencies in his reading of Marx and that the relationship between theory and practice was indeed under-developed, Althusser set out during the late 1960s and 1970s to correct and revise his take on the relationships among philosophy, science, ideology, and politics. To some readers, these revisions represented a politically motivated betrayal of his theoretical accomplishments. For others, they simply revealed his project as a whole to be untenable and self-contradictory. Some recent critics, however, have argued that these revisions are consistent with and necessary to the development of what they view to be the overall goal of Althusser’s work: the development of a materialist political philosophy adequate for political practice.

4.1 The Relationship between Theory and Practice

Althusser’s initial revisions to his understanding of the social structure and knowledge production were informed by a renewed attention to the works of Lenin and by a seminar he convened at the ENS in 1967 for leading scientists and interested students. This course resulted in a series of papers, gathered together as Philosophy and the Spontaneous Philosophy of the Scientists (1967a), in which Althusser began rethinking the relations among philosophy, science, ideology, and politics. Though this revision was later to be made more explicit, one of the most striking aspects of these papers was Althusser’s abandonment of the Spinozistic claim that the different levels of theoretical practice were autonomous. He now maintained that there was no criterion sufficient to demarcate scientific from ideological concepts and that all theoretical concepts are marked by ideology. This did not mean, however, that any concept was as good as any other. Scientists, through their work on the material real, tended to generate better understandings of things than were available intuitively. Further, he argued that philosophy still had a role to play in the clarification of scientific concepts. This is the case because, no matter how much work scientists do to understand the material real and to generate better concepts, they must always employ ideological concepts to frame their investigations and its results. Marxist philosophers, he maintained, could be useful to scientists by pointing out, from the standpoint of politics and by the method of historical critique, where and how some of the concepts scientists employed were ideological. The result of this intervention of philosophy into politics would not be “truer” concepts, but ideas that were more “correct” or “right” in both the normative and positive senses of these words.

Parallel to this move, and motivated by the need to provide the link between philosophical theory and political practice that was largely missing from his classic work, Althusser now argued that philosophy had a useful role to play between politics and science. Political practice, Althusser maintained, was mostly motivated by ideological understandings of what the good is and how to accomplish it. Though he did not argue that there was a way to leave ideology behind and to reveal the good in itself, he did maintain that science could help to correct ideological thinking about political means and ends. Social science in particular could do so by showing how certain goals were impossible or misguided given present socio-economic relations and by suggesting that, at a certain time and in a certain place, other means and other ends might be more fruitfully adopted and pursued. As scientific knowledge does not speak directly to the public or to politicians, Althusser assigned materialist philosophers the job of communicating scientific knowledge of the material real, its conditions, and its possibilities to politicians and the public. If this communication is successful, Althusser maintained, one should not expect all political activity to be successful. Instead, one should expect a modest shift from an idealist ideology to one that is materialist and more scientific and which has a better chance of realizing its goals.

4.2 Theory of Ideology

During the 1970s, Althusser continued the revisions begun in 1967 and elaborated other Marxian ideas he believed to be underdeveloped. Perhaps the best known of the new conceptual formulations resulting from these efforts is that of “ideological interpellation.” This account of how a human being becomes a self-conscious subject was published in an essay titled “Ideology and Ideological State Apparatuses” (1970). It was excerpted from a larger essay essay titled “On the Reproduction of Capitalism.” This work analyzed the necessary relationship between state and subject such that a given economic mode of production might subsist. It includes not only an analysis of the state and its legal and educational systems but also of the psychological relationship which exists between subject and state as ideology. This narrative of subjectification was intended to help advance Althusser’s argument that regimes or states are able to maintain control by reproducing subjects who believe that their position within the social structure is a natural one. Ideology, or the background ideas that we possess about the way in which the world must function and of how we function within it is, in this account, understood to be always present. Specific socio-economic structures, however, require particular ideologies. These ideologies are instantiated by institutions or “Ideological State Apparatuses” like family, schools, church, etc., which provide the developing subject with categories in which she can recognize herself. Inasmuch as a person does so and embraces the practices associated with those institutions, she has been successfully “hailed” or “interpellated” and recognized herself as that subject who does those kinds of things. As the effect of these recognitions is to continue existing social relations, Althusser argued that a Dictatorship of the Proletariat is necessary so that Ideological State Apparatuses productive of the bourgeois subject can be replaced with those productive of proletarian or communist subjects.

4.3 Marx’s Philosophy Redux

In 1978 and as a response to what he saw, yet again, as the theoretical and political misdirection of the Communist movement, Althusser authored a piece, “Marx in his Limits,” which was intended to separate the good from the bad in Marx’s philosophy. In his classic work, Althusser had tried to accomplish this goal by separating out ideological concepts and by bringing forth the scientific ones. However, in “Marx in his Limits,” he now argued that such a method of separation cannot work because—within Marx’s writings and throughout his oeuvre—both good and bad, materialist and idealist concepts, are hopelessly intermixed and many are underdeveloped.

Inasmuch as Althusser admits in this piece that Marx never fully abandoned Hegel’s logic, the concept of human alienation, or the idea that history has a goal, the inventory Althusser offers can be seen as a positive response to the charge that he had ignored Marx’s explicit statements in order to imagine for Marx a consistent and “true” philosophy. Althusser does not give up on the task of articulating a better Marxist philosophy, however. Instead, he argues that there is another, “materialist” criterion that allows us to see the limits of Marx’s thinking and to recognize those points in his work where Marx was unable to transcend his bourgeois background and his education in German Idealism. This criterion is that of the practical success or failure of Marx’s concepts as each has been employed in the history of Marxist movements. When we have affected this inventory and grouped together the successful concepts, what we are left with is a materialist Marxism, a Marxism which endorses the scientific method as the best way for understanding ourselves and our potential but that also understands that this method is fallible. Remaining also is a Marxism which does not subscribe to any philosophy of history and which certainly does not maintain that capitalism will inevitably lead to communism. This Marxism has no system of interrelated concepts that guarantee a scientific analysis. Further, it possesses no worked out theory of the relations between economic structures and cultural structures but for that limited knowledge which scientific practice provides. Finally, this Marxism has given up the dream of analyzing the whole of culture and its movement from the outside; it realizes that one thinks inside and about the culture one inhabits in order to possibly effect and change that culture.

5. Late work (1980–1986): Aleatory Materialism

After being interrupted by ill health and by the events following from the murder of his wife, in 1982 Althusser returned to the question of what was essential to Marx’s philosophy and expanded the scope of this inquiry to include speculation about the metaphysics that must underlie it. Freed by his ignoble status from the task of influencing the direction of the Communist movement, the texts associated with this project and gathered together in the book Philosophy of the Encounter differ tremendously in subject matter, style, and method from his other writings. Whether these texts represent a continuation of, or even the key to his philosophy or whether they are an aberration is presently being debated in the secondary literature. However, as there is strong textural and archival evidence that many of the ideas explicitly expressed in these works had been gestating for a long time, the contention that these writings are of a piece with his earlier work seems to be gaining ground.

The principal thesis of Althusser’s last philosophical writings is that there exists an “underground” or little recognized tradition in the history of philosophy. Variously labeled a “materialism of the encounter” or “aleatory materialism,” the method which he uses to articulate this philosophy is to simply comment upon works by philosophers who exemplify this current and to point out where, how, and to what extent they do so. In addition to Marx, the philosophers that he cites as being part of this underground tradition include Democritus, Epicurus, Lucretius, Machiavelli, Spinoza, Hobbes, Rousseau, Montesquieu, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein. From these readings in the history of philosophy, Althusser aims to suggest that this tradition exists and that it is both philosophically fecund and viable. He also wishes to return to and bolster the thesis he first ventured in the late 1960s that there are really only two positions in philosophy: materialism and idealism. As he understood it, the two tendencies are always in a war of opposition with the one functioning to reinforce the status quo and the other to possibly overcome it.

Perhaps because it functions in opposition to the idealist tendency in philosophy, aleatory materialism is marked almost as much by its rejections as it is by the positive claims it contains about the world and about history. As Marx is included within this tradition, it is not surprising that many of these rejections are also attributed to him during the course of Althusser’s earlier work. These include a dismissal of what Althusser calls “the principle of Reason,” or the idea that the universe or history has an origin or an end. With this prohibition, Althusser means to exclude from this tradition not only the usual suspects in the rationalist tradition, but also mechanical and dialectical materialisms with their logics of determination. Also dismissed, he maintains, is the myth that somehow philosophy and philosophers are autonomous, that they see the world from outside and objectively. Though there is an objective world, philosophy does not have knowledge of this world as its object for there is no way for it to ground itself and the material it thinks with and through arises historically. Philosophy is therefore not a science or the Science of sciences and it produces no universal Truth. Rather, the truths it produces are contingent and are offered in opposition to other competing truths. If philosophy does have an object, it is the void, or that which is not yet but which could be.

That the philosophy of the encounter lacks an object does not mean that it lacks positive propositions. However, given the epistemological status attributed to philosophy by Althusser, these metaphysical propositions or “theses” are true only insofar as they have explanatory or practical value. First among them, following Democritus, is the thesis that matter is all that exists. Second is the thesis that chance or the aleatory is at the origin of all worlds. That the patterns which constitute and define these worlds can be known, described, and predicted according to certain laws or reasons is also true. However, the fact that these worlds ever came to be organized in these patterns is aleatory and the patterns themselves can only ever be known immanently. Third, new worlds and new orders themselves arise out of chance encounters between pre-existing material elements. Whether or not such orders emerge is contingent: they do not have to occur. When material elements collide, they either “take” and a new order is founded, or they do not and the old world continues.

To Althusser, the propositions which have explanatory value at the level of ontology and cosmology also have value at the level of political philosophy. After first citing Rousseau and Hobbes as example of philosophers who recognized that the origin and continued existence of political orders is contingent, Althusser turns to Machiavelli and Marx for his principle examples of how aleatory materialism functions in the political realm. The anti-teleological, scientistic, and anti-humanist, Marxist philosophy developed by Althusser over the course of his career works well with the materialist metaphysics recounted above. In this understanding of Marxist philosophy, societies and subjects are seen as patterns of activity that behave in predictable ways. Though scientists may study and describe these orders in their specificity, it does not at first appear that philosophy can do much except to categorize these interactions at the most general level. However, citing Marx’s work again and taking inspiration from Machiavelli’s project of installing “a new prince in a new principality,” Althusser argues that the materialist philosopher may accomplish somewhat more than this with her descriptions, critiques, and predictions. This is because, by examining a political order not from the perspective of its necessity but with an awareness of its contingency, this philosopher may be able think the possibility of its transformation. If chance smiles on her, if someone listens and if effects occur, then elements might recombine and a new political might take hold. This is, to be sure, a very limited and unpredictable power attributed to the philosopher. However, it is also the only one that Althusser in his late works argues is adequate for political practice and that does not, like idealism, merely serve to reproduce existing relations.


Primary Literature

The following list owes much to the comprehensive bibliography of Althusser’s work compiled by Gregory Elliott in Althusser: The Detour of Theory, New York: Verso, 2006 [1987].

  • (1940–45) Journal de captivité (Stalag XA 1940–45), (Paris: Stock/IMEC, 1992)
  • (1946) “L’internationale des bons sentiments”, in Ecrits Philosophiques et Politiques I (Paris: Stock/IMEC 1994), 35–57; tr. as “The International of Decent Feelings,” by G.M. Goshgarian in The Spectre of Hegel: Early Writings (London, NY: Verso, 1997).
  • (1947) “Du contenu dans la pensée de G.W.F. Hegel” in Ecrits Philosophiques et Politiques I (Paris: Stock/IMEC 1994), 59–238; tr. as “On Content in the Thought of G.W.F. Hegel,” by G.M. Goshgarian in The Spectre of Hegel: Early Writings (London, NY: Verso, 1997).
  • (1950) “Le retour à Hegel. Dernier mot du révisionisme universitaire,” La Nouvelle Critique 20 (1950); tr. as “The Return of Hegel: The Latest Word in Academic Revisionism,” by G.M. Goshgarian in The Spectre of Hegel: Early Writings (London, NY: Verso, 1997).
  • (1953a) “À propos du marxisme,” Revue de l’enseignement philosophique, 3:4 (1953): 15–19; tr. as “On Marxism,” by G.M. Goshgarian in The Spectre of Hegel: Early Writings (London, NY: Verso, 1997).
  • (1953b) “Note sur le matérialisme dialectique,” Revue de l’enseignement philosophique, 3:5 (1953): 11–17; tr. as “On Marxism,” by G.M. Goshgarian in The Spectre of Hegel: Early Writings (London, NY: Verso, 1997).
  • (1958) Montesquieu, la politique et l’histoire (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1959); tr. as “Montesquieu: Politics and History” by Ben Brewster, in Politics and History: Montesquieu, Rousseau, Marx, (London: Verso, 2007).
  • (1960) “Les ‘Manifestes philosophiqes’ de Feuerbach,” La Nouvelle Critique 121 (1960): 32–38; tr. as “Feuerbach’s Philosophical Manifestoes” by Ben Brewster in Louis Althusser, For Marx (London: Verso, 2005).
  • (1961) “Sur le jeune Marx (Questions de théorie),” La Pensée 96 (1961):3–26; tr. as “On the Young Marx: Theoretical Questions,” by Ben Brewster in For Marx (London: Verso 2005).
  • (1962) “Contradiction et surdetermination (Notes pour un recherche),” La Pensée 106 (1962): 3–22; tr. as “Contradiction and Overdetermination: Notes for an Investigation” by Ben Brewster in For Marx (London: Verso 2005).
  • (1963a) “Marxisme et humanisme” Cahiers de l’Institut des Sciences Économique Appliquées 20 (1964): 109–133; tr. as “Marxism and Humanism” by Ben Brewster in For Marx (London: Verso 2005).
  • (1963b) “Sur la dialectique matérialiste (De l’inégalité des origines),” La Pensée 110 (1963): 5–46; tr. as “On the Materialist Dialectic: On the Unevenness of Origins,” by Ben Brewster in For Marx (London: Verso 2005).
  • (1964) “Freud et Lacan,” La Nouvelle Critique 161–162 (1964–1965): 88–108; tr. as “Freud and Lacan” by Ben Brewster in Lenin and Philosophy and Other Essays (New York: Monthly Review, 2002.
  • (1965a) Lire le Capital, Tome 1 & 2, with Étienne Balibar, Roger Establet, Pierre Macherey, and Jacques Rancière (Paris: Maspero, coll. “Théorie”); tr. by Ben Brewster as Reading Capital with the contributions of Establet, Macherey, and Rancière omitted (London: Verso 2016)
  • (1965b) “Theory, Theoretical Practice and Theoretical Formation” tr. by James Kavanaugh, in Gregory Elliott ed. Philosophy and the Spontaneous Philosophy of the Scientists (London: Verso, 1990).
  • (1966a) “Sur Lévi-Strauss,” in Écrits philosophiques et politiques, Tome 2 (Paris: Stock/IMEC, 1997), 417–432; tr. by G.M. Goshgarian in The Humanist Controversy and Other Writings (London: Verso 2003).
  • (1966b) “Sur la genèse,” Décalages 1(2) (2013). J. Smith (trans.), 2012, “On Genesis”, Décalages 1 (2), available online.
  • (1967a) Philosophie et philosophie spontanée des savants (1967), (Maspero, coll. “Théorie”, 1974); tr. Warren Montag as “Philosophy and the Spontaneous Philosophy of the Scientists,” in Gregory Elliott ed. Philosophy and the Spontaneous Philosophy of the Scientists (London: Verso, 1990).
  • (1967b) “La tâche historique de la philosophie marxiste” tr. by G.M. Goshgarian as “The Historical Task of Marxist Philosophy” in in The Humanist Controversy and Other Writings (London: Verso 2003).
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  • (1977d) Les vâches noires: interview imaginaire (le malaise du XXIIe congrès) ce qui ne va pas camarades!, G. M. Goshgarian (ed. and trans.), Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2016.
  • (1978a) “Ce qui ne peut plus durer dans le Parti Communiste,”(Paris: François Maspero 1978).
  • (1978b) “Marx dans ses limites,” in Écrits philosophiques et politiques, Tome 1 (Paris: Stock/IMEC, 1994), 357–524.
  • (1978b) “Le marxisme aujourd’hui,” in Solitude de Machiavel et autres texts (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1998), 292–310; tr. as “Marxism Today” by James H. Kavanaugh in Gregory Elliott ed. Philosophy and the Spontaneous Philosophy of the Scientists (London: Verso, 1990).
  • (1980) Philosophy for Non-Philosophers, G. M. Goshgarian (trans. and ed.), New York: Bloomsbury, 2017.
  • (1982) “Sur la pensée Marxiste,” in Future anterieur, Sur Althusser. Passages (Paris: L’Harmattan, 1993), 11–29; and “Le courant souterrain du matérialisme de la rencontre,”in Écrits philosophiques et politiques, Tome 1 (Paris: Stock/IMEC, 1994), 583–594; and ‘Notes sur les Thèses sur Feuerbach,’ Magazine Littéraire, 324 (1994): 38–42; extracts translated as “The Underground Current of the Materialism of the Encounter” by G.M. Goshgarian in Philosophy of the Encounter: Later Writings 1978–1987 (London: Verso, 2006).
  • (1984–1987a) “Lettres de Louis Althusser à Fernanda Navarro,” (1984), Sur la philosophie (Paris: Gallimard, 1994), 89–138; tr. as “Letters from Louis Althusser to Fernanda Navarro” by G.M. Goshgarian in Philosophy of the Encounter: Later Writings 1978–1987 (London: Verso, 2006).
  • (1984–1987a) “Philosophie et marxisme: entretiens avec Fernanda Navarra (1984–1987)” in Sur la philosophie (Paris: Gallimard, 1994), 13–79.
  • (1985) “L’avenir dure longtemps,” in L’avenir dure longtemps, suivi de Les Faits (Paris: Stock/IMEC, 1992), 7–279; tr. as “The Future Lasts Forever” by Richard Veasey in The Future Lasts Forever: A Memoir (New York: New Press, 1993).

Secondary Literature

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