Al-Farabi's Philosophy of Society and Religion

First published Wed Jun 15, 2016

While al-Farabi does not have a specific term for ‘philosophy of religion’, he does in fact have one which can more or less literally be translated as ‘philosophy of society’, namely, falsafa madaniyya.[1] Notably, this notion embraces two chief moments. First, in line with Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, it comprises an intrinsically anthropological and ethical element; accordingly, falsafa madaniyya is the part of philosophy dedicated to an inquiry into the kamal al-insan, the perfection of man, as an individual. Second, just like Plato’s Politeia and Aristotle’s Politica, it moreover deals with the madina, the polis, as a whole, taking into account its makeup and administration. However, it does so strictly from two angles: it assesses the madina and its regime with respect to their success, on the one hand, in guiding citizens towards their individual perfection and, consequently, towards ultimate happiness; and on the other hand, in emulating society’s normative model, namely, the cosmic order, through the makeup of the city.

It is precisely in this connection that religion, milla, as al-Farabi views it, has its place. According to him, religion is suited to direct the members of society towards human perfection and thus to contribute simultaneously to the attainment of individual happiness and the well-being of the city. As a consequence, on al-Farabi’s account, religion is essentially an instrument or a craft intended for application; it cannot be considered a sphere of knowledge, wisdom, and truth on its own. This notion of religion and its place within the frame of falsafa madaniyya had a tremendous impact on subsequent thinkers in the Islamic world—such as Ibn Bajja, Ibn Tufayl, and Ibn Rushd—as well as on the manner in which al-Farabi’s thought and, more particularly, what is usually referred to as his ‘political philosophy’ have been assessed in Western historiography. In order to get a clearer idea of these issues, they shall be examined in the sequence just indicated: from the foundation, al-Farabi’s philosophy of society, across the principle of similitude determining the relation of man, society, and cosmos, towards religion and the art of ruling.

1. Conceptual Background

To our knowledge, al-Farabi was the first philosopher in the Islamic world who not only displayed a serious interest in philosophy of society (and religion), but also developed a highly differentiated account thereof. He did not, however, start from scratch. At his time, the majority of those philosophical texts which were actually translated from Greek (mostly through Syriac) into Arabic were available, and al-Farabi was obviously an avid reader of his predecessors. Accordingly, his writings display (a) intimate familiarity with Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics; (b) acquaintance with the essentials of Plato’s Politeia (probably mediated by Galen’s Compendium; cf. Gutas 2012: 85); and, apparently, (c) some knowledge of Aristotle’s Politica, of which only parts were available in Arabic (Pines 1975). Al-Farabi’s philosophy of society (and religion) can be described as an intelligent and original synthesis, particularly, of these oeuvres, a synthesis which shares the late-ancient commentators’ concern for harmonizing the positions of Aristotle and Plato. Moreover, al-Farabi’s philosophy of society (and religion) turns out to be a clever adaptation of Greek ethico-political thought to the needs and demands of its new context, the Islamic world of the 10th century.

Al-Farabi’s Greek heritage is already visible on the most basic conceptual level. A society, on his account, is an association of human beings collaborating “[i]n order to preserve [themselves] and to attain [their] highest perfections” (Perfect State V, 15, 1: 229). Without collaboration, he insists, “man cannot attain the perfection, for the sake of which his inborn nature [fitra] has been given to him” (ibid.). In function of their size, associations can or cannot furnish the basis for a “perfect [kamil] society” (Perfect State V, 15, 2: 229–31). Thus, the smallest unit suited to harbor a perfect society is a city (madina). Smaller associations, such as villages, quarters, streets, and houses are per se imperfect; larger ones, like nations and the “union of all the societies in the inhabitable world” (ibid.), by contrast, are perfect.

The dependence of al-Farabi’s thought thus far, particularly on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Politica is obvious. Both the notion that societies only of a certain size can accommodate their members independent of external supplies, and the idea that human beings strive for some sort of perfection, can be traced back to the Stagirite’s work. Moreover, just like Aristotle, al-Farabi is convinced that attaining the highest possible degree of perfection entails happiness, a key concept of his thought. Inspired perhaps by the Politica, he further elaborates on the concept of human perfection: first, he links it with the notion that people live in societies and, second, draws the conclusion that these societies serve a specific purpose, beyond the mere allocation of daily needs, such as food, shelter, and protection. Societies have their own ‘natural telos’ which consists, according to al-Farabi, in guiding their members towards their end: true felicity. As a consequence, a city

… in which people aim through association at co-operating for the things by which felicity in its real and true sense can be attained, is the excellent city [madina fadila], and the society in which there is a co-operation to acquire felicity is the excellent society [ijtima‘ fadil]. (Perfect State V, 15, 3: 231)[2]

[Unless indicated otherwise, material within square brackets in quotations is added by the author of this entry.]

It is for this reason that society for al-Farabi constitutes an indispensable object of philosophical inquiry. Basically, along with anthropology (‘ilm al-insan, a term al-Farabi himself occasionally employs) and cosmology, philosophy of society seeks to reveal humanity’s final end as well as the means required to achieve this goal (cf. Enumeration 1: 76). Accordingly, this new ‘discipline’ is the main branch of practical philosophy, centered on some core elements which, therefore shall be discussed in more detail in this entry, more precisely: the notions of happiness and the afterlife; the idea of a similitude between society and natural organisms as well as the cosmos as a whole; the moral obligations, both cognitive and practical, entailed by the natural givens; and the methods of directing the citizens of the madina fadila towards their natural telos, the most prominent of which being religion.

2. What is ‘philosophy of society’?

2.1 Happiness and the afterlife

In line with Aristotle, al-Farabi leaves no doubt whatsoever that there is one kind of happiness which constitutes the telos of every human being. Occasionally, he distinguishes between “earthly” and “ultimate felicity” (Attainment i, 1: 13), however, from the majority of his writings it is clear that happiness in the strict sense of the word, that is, as the concomitant of the highest human perfection, is ultimate felicity.[3] Yet, in contrast to Aristotle’s notion of eudaimonia, al-Farabi’s ultimate happiness is a state associated with the afterlife, when, according to his theory of the soul, the soul has separated from the body (see the entry on al-Farabi's psychology). The achievement of this state is contingent upon a number of preconditions.[4] However, before these preconditions can be broached (see section 2.2), further scrutiny of al-Farabi’s concepts of human perfection and the afterlife is required.

Human perfection is defined by humanity’s place within the cosmic order. Prior to death, human beings are hybrids—corporeal entities, on the one hand, yet also immaterial, on the other, due to their intellects, that is, the rational faculty of their souls which survives death—and as such exposed to two sets of powers. Just like every other inhabitant of the sublunary world,[5] human beings are subject to the natural laws determining corporeal substances. In contrast, however, to all the other species belonging to the sphere of generation and corruption, human beings moreover experience a certain influence by the so-called ‘active intellect’, an immaterial, incorruptible, supralunary entity whose existence is pure thinking.[6] This active intellect does not affect the body of a human being, but rather her intellect and imagination, i.e., those psychic faculties involved in thinking. The most fundamental influence which the active intellect exerts on the human soul consists in, first, the provision and, second, the basic ‘formatting’ of the rational faculty:

… [the active intellect] gives the human being a faculty and a principle by which to strive, or by which the human being is able to strive on his own for the rest of the perfections that remain for him. That principle is the primary sciences and the primary intelligibles attained in the rational part of the soul. (Political Regime B, 1, 68: 62)

Only due to these “primary sciences” and “primary intelligibles” can human beings think in an abstract and universal fashion and thus acquire knowledge about what there is.[7] And precisely in the realization of this activity, i.e., thinking, and its perfection—ideally, the attainment of its most sublime level, i.e., science—consists humanity’s telos. Human beings, hence, are born with the natural obligation to perfect their rational faculty. While they are equipped by the active intellect with this faculty and the principles of thought, their task consists in actualizing this potential, i.e., their intellects, “by which a human being is a human being” (Political Regime A, 2, 8: 32). Becoming an intellect in actuality, just like the active intellect and the other separate intelligences, therefore, constitutes humanity’s perfection. Once a human being reaches this level of perfection, she acquires the state of ultimate happiness:

When the rational faculty attains to being an intellect in actuality, that intellect it now is in actuality also becomes similar to the separate things and it intellects its essence that is [now] intellect in actuality. …. Through this, it becomes such as to be in the rank of the active intellect. And when a human being obtains this rank, his happiness is perfected. (Political Regime A, 2, 8: 33; square brackets thus in the translation)[8]

Across al-Farabi’s various writings, it remains unclear whether this stage of ultimate felicity can already be reached during one’s lifetime, when the soul is still linked with the human body, or only in the hereafter, once the soul has separated from the body due to this latter’s death.[9] At any rate, in striking contrast to Islamic teachings, al-Farabi is convinced that the afterlife is exclusively psychic or rather intellectual. In his thought there is no room for corporeal resurrection. Instead, the felicity of the hereafter, according to him, means purely intellectual pleasures, a state, however, which requires preparation during one’s lifetime, a state, moreover, which allows for individual differences. In function of the excellence an individual has achieved during her life, the felicity of her afterlife will be greater or lesser. This excellence now, on al-Farabi’s account, can be measured against a number of ‘natural duties’, prerequisite for the attainment of happiness, but differentiated in accordance with the individual citizens’ natural endowments (cf. Perfect State V, 16, 2–3: 261–5):

The people of the excellent city have things in common which they all perform and comprehend, and other things which each class knows and does on its own. Each of these people reaches the state of felicity by precisely these two things …. The same is true of the actions by which felicity is attained: the more they increase and are repeated …, the stronger and more excellent and more perfect becomes the soul …, until it arrives at that stage of perfection in which it can dispense with matter so that it becomes independent of it ….[10] |4: 265| When one generation passes away, their bodies cease to exist and their souls are released and become happy and when other people succeed them in their ranks …, they occupy in their turn the same ranks in felicity as those who passed away before, and each joins those who resemble him in species, quantity and quality. … |5: 267| The kinds of felicity are unequal in excellence and differ in three ways, in species, quantity and quality …. (Perfect State V, 16, 2: 261–3; 4: 265; 5: 267)[11]

True individual happiness, as al-Farabi sees it, thus turns out to be a peculiar blend of Aristotelian, Platonic, and Neoplatonic elements. It simultaneously embraces the idea of the individual felicity attained by the philosophers, the notion of a purification and, ultimately, deification of the human soul, and a theory of intellect which largely intertwines cosmic and epistemic dimensions. While the just-quoted passage from the Perfect State shows that, beyond the knowledge of certain things, particular actions must be performed as a precondition for the attainment of individual happiness, al-Farabi’s emphasis on cognition cannot be overestimated. For, whatever he has in mind regarding activities, from the above it is clear that the human telos is located at the level of rationality. Happiness, consequently, consists in the as-perfect-as-possible assimilation of the human soul to the active intellect, whose unique activity is thinking.

This being said, a number of questions remain open and must be addressed in what follows: first, the things every citizen of the madina is expected to know; second, the role activities are intended to play in the attainment of individual felicity; and, third, how al-Farabi’s just-discussed concept of happiness squares with his distinction between different “classes” of citizens as well as various degrees of felicity.

2.2 The preconditions of happiness

As the last citation from the Perfect State conveys, when discussing the preconditions of felicity, al-Farabi distinguishes between (a) common and (b) specific duties of the citizens, as well as between (i) knowledge and (ii) activities. His most detailed indications concerning these preconditions address (a.i) the common things that everyone must know and are spelled out in the following list:

The things in common which all the people of the excellent city ought to know are: (1) In the first place to know the First Cause and all its qualities; (2) then the immaterial existents [including the above mentioned active intellect] …; (3) the celestial substances …; (4) [without number in Walzer’s translation] then the natural bodies which are beneath them, and how they come to be and pass away …; (5) then the generation of man; (6) then the first ruler …; (7) then the rulers who have to take his place …; (8) then the excellent city and its people and the felicity which their souls ultimately reach …. (Perfect State V, 17, 1: 277–9)

From this list it follows that al-Farabi presupposes a quite profound knowledge of cosmology, physics, anthropology, and philosophy of society. This is rather astounding in view of the fact that, as he himself admits, only a minority of people are sufficiently gifted intellectually to do science, which is to say, to understand those things al-Farabi mentions in his list.[12] This raises the question of whether or not felicity is in effect attainable by everyone, a question that will be pursued in section 3.2 of this entry. Regarding the preconditions of happiness, however, it can be concluded that, as far as the common knowledge requirements (a.i) are concerned, al-Farabi sets the bar fairly high: only accomplished philosophers will be able to fulfill these criteria.

As for the remaining preconditions, al-Farabi is far less explicit. There are some indications regarding the common activities (a.ii). It appears that, once again in unison with Aristotle, these embrace all sorts of exercises suited to purify one’s soul while it is still unified with ‘its’ body, as al-Farabi’s references to the soul’s disposition as well as his recurrent comparisons with arts and crafts suggest. Thus, he intimates, in connection with the last quoted passage:

When each of [the people of the excellent city] acts in this way [i.e., according to the citizens’ common duties], these actions of his make him acquire a good and excellent disposition of the soul, and the more steadily he applies himself to them, the stronger and better becomes that disposition of this and increases in strength and excellence—just as steadily applying himself to performing the actions of writing well make a man acquire proficiency in the art of writing …. (Perfect State V, 16, 2: 261)

In the background of this notion of acquiring a better psychic disposition by virtue of repeatedly performing certain activities, is (in addition to Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics) the ancient medical tradition. Accordingly, even the (immaterial) rational faculty of the soul can be positively affected, if those faculties of the soul which operate by virtue of corporeal organs (such as sense perception and imagination) are improved. This concerns, at the most basic level, the mixture of the temperaments, which is directly related to the nutritive faculty: the better one’s temperaments are in balance, the fewer are the negative influences by the body on the soul, and the more easily this human being will, hence, be able to use her rational faculty. On a slightly more complex level, this idea of balance or harmony as a means to purify the soul also concerns the realm of moral virtues. For while one’s character is fundamentally predisposed by her temperament, al-Farabi maintains that virtues can be trained and improved. Thus, just as keeping the bodily humors in check, being able to find the ‘golden mean’ in ethical matters usually prepares the ground for a swifter and less distracted application of one’s rational faculty.[13]

That al-Farabi in fact envisages moral virtues as one of the preconditions of individual happiness, is further corroborated by his assessment of deficient cities and societies. Among these communities are the “immoral cities” whose inhabitants, despite knowing better, “through their passion and will [are] inclined toward” what al-Farabi considers to be wrong or presumed goods, such as “status, honor, domination” (Political Regime C, 3, 120: 90; cf. also Book of Religion 11: 101), which distract from humanity’s natural telos. Other examples of misguided ambitions include the quest for “the enjoyment of pleasures” imagined to be found in gluttony, drinking, and sexual intercourse (Political Regime C, 3, 119: 89). Al-Farabi’s verdict regarding these communities is unambiguous: “No one at all among the inhabitants of these cities gains happiness” (ibid. 120: 90). As these examples and al-Farabi’s assessment evince, just like the balance of one’s temperaments, her character is significant in the pursuit of happiness not for its own sake, but insofar as it fulfills a preparatory task. It prepares the human being’s soul so that it can, to the best of its ability, perform its proper activity, i.e., reasoning.

Regarding, finally, those things which citizens are supposed to know and do in accordance with their respective classes (referred to as b.i and b.ii above, first paragraph of this section), al-Farabi seems to think of the various trades and professions performed in the polis.[14] As the next section will reveal, he differentiates between the individual skills and weaknesses with which each human being is born. He is convinced that, equipped with these specific talents, each human being possesses her natural place and duty within society. Actualizing her individual potential to the best of her capacities, hence, contributes to the functioning and well-being of the community. This, in fact, does not immediately lead towards individual happiness, but is a necessary precondition as it contributes to covering the daily needs and, thus, warranting the basis for society to aspire for its own natural telos (see section 1 above).

3. The principle of similitude

3.1 Being: man, society, cosmos

Al-Farabi’s notion of ultimate felicity has tremendous impact on his philosophy of society. In the light of humanity’s particular telos, a society can be “excellent (fadil)”, in the sense introduced above,[15] if and only if its cooperation pursues society’s natural telos, i.e., if it seeks to equip its members with the necessary means for the attainment of individual happiness. Therefore, the primary goal of governing a society must consist in providing the means so that everyone can acquire theoretical knowledge,[16] learn about her natural duties, and put them into practice. In order to explain his notion of the excellent society, al-Farabi falls back on two recurrent examples, natural organisms and the cosmos. At first glance, this comparison might appear inappropriate, linking voluntary behavior in the case of human beings and society with the strictly natural and causal processes characterizing the functioning of organisms and the cosmos as a whole. However, al-Farabi’s aim is not to deny the distinction between the voluntary and the natural—quite the contrary.

While human beings, on his account, are in fact endowed with free will and, hence, can organize their own lives as well as their communities ad libitum,[17] there is, as seen above, a natural norm for humanity distinguishing the good life from the bad life and, in terms of eschatology, the attainment of happiness from failure to do so. In this sense, al-Farabi clearly subscribes to what nowadays would be called a natural law ethics. And it is precisely at this level that his two examples, organisms and the cosmos, come into play and lend his notions of society and happiness a conspicuously Platonic flavor. In al-Farabi’s view, organisms and the cosmos are the perfect models which human beings—for themselves as well as for their social lives—are well advised to emulate:

Both the city and the household have an analogy with the body of the human being. The body is composed of different parts …, each doing a certain action, so that from all their actions they come together in mutual assistance to perfect the purpose of the human being’s body. In the same way, both the city and the household are composed of different parts of a definite number …, each performing on its own a certain action, so that from their actions they come together in mutual assistance to perfect the purpose of the city or the household. (Selected Aphorisms 25: 23)

Essentially, al-Farabi applies Aristotle’s notion of ergon to the cosmos and each of its members. Accordingly, the cosmos as such is not only determined by a certain order, it actually represents the best of all possible structures, as it is the effect of the over-perfect first cause.[18] Consequently, every part of the cosmos possesses a specific function which it must perform in order to keep the perpetuum mobile cosmos running smoothly, without interruptions and disturbances. While everything else executes its function by nature, humanity, equipped with reason and free will, must choose to do so. Therefore, it must understand the cosmic order and its own place and duty, or rather ergon, in the frame of this all-embracing structure, which, once again, underscores the significance attached to knowledge in al-Farabi’s thought.

And yet, the implications of the two paradigmatic examples, organisms and the cosmos, reach further, inasmuch as both examples represent complex entities with a diversified internal makeup. To be sure, every element of the cosmos or an organism in general contributes to the well-being of the whole, nonetheless, each one has its peculiar activity. The heart, for instance, is in charge of pumping the blood through the blood vessels and thus keeping the body alive, whereas the kidneys are responsible for filtering the blood and regulating water fluid levels. Similarly, al-Farabi gives to understand that each human being has a particular task within the framework of society, in view of her specific skills (cf. above, section 2.2, regarding the citizens’ specific knowledge and activities [b.i and b.ii]):

The excellent city resembles the perfect and healthy body, all of whose limbs co-operate …. Now the limbs and organs of the body are different and their natural endowments and faculties are unequal in excellence, there being among them one ruling organ, namely the heart, and organs which are close in rank to that ruling organ …. The same holds good in the case of the city. Its parts are different by nature, and their natural dispositions are unequal in excellence: there is in it a man who is the ruler, and there are others whose ranks are close to the ruler, each of them with a disposition and a habit through which he performs an action …. (Perfect State V, 15, 4: 231–3)

This position lies at the core of al-Farabi’s philosophy of society, creating, however, several remarkable tensions within his thought. Thus, as seen above, in the vein of Aristotle, he maintains that humanity’s specific difference is rationality and that the natural telos of every human being consists in perfecting this feature. Meanwhile, he also holds that human beings differ with regard to their natural endowments. Accordingly, some are highly intelligent, while others are not. Some have the potential to become philosophers and recognize the makeup of the world, happiness, and the natural norm encapsulated in these ontological givens; others—actually the majority, as al-Farabi believes—do not possess these capacities. This raises the two interrelated questions of, first, how these individuals can nevertheless attain felicity, if at all; and, second, how society must be set up in order to achieve its own natural telos and offer each member an equal opportunity for attaining individual happiness.

3.2 Knowing: things versus symbolic representations

In order to approach these questions, it is imperative to have a closer look at al-Farabi’s anthropology (‘ilm al-insan) which represents the backbone of his philosophy of society (and religion). In line with the Greek medical tradition, particularly Galen, al-Farabi is convinced that individual natural endowments depend chiefly on two factors, first, the region of the world in which one happens to be born and, second, one’s bodily constitution, i.e., the body’s concrete mixture of elements (cf. above, section 2.2).[19] For although the human soul as such is immaterial, so long as it is coupled with ‘its’ body, it depends for its activities (including, in a way, thinking) on corporeal organs like the external senses, allowing for sense perception and imagination. Notably, one’s temperament or natural disposition—determining primarily those processes which can be associated with moods, emotions, and, in general, character traits—thus turns out to be the limiting factor defining whether a human being will be sharp-witted or rather dull and, hence, able to perfect for herself humanity’s specific ergon, i.e., reasoning.

While at first glance this seems to imply natural predestination, providing the happy few, on the one hand, with the means to attain eudaimonia, but dooming the unfortunate many, on the other, to misery, al-Farabi insists that every human being is equipped with the necessary requirements to attain ultimate felicity, even those whose natural disposition does not allow them to become philosophers. For, according to him, people

… whose innate character is sound share in an innate character that disposes them to receive the intelligibles in which they all share and by which they strive toward objects and actions common to all of them. Then, afterward, they diverge and differ, thereby coming to an innate character that is particular to each one of them and to each group. So one among them is disposed to receive certain other intelligibles that are not shared, but are particular to him …. (Political Regime B, 1, 74: 65)

Accordingly, provided one is not born a fool or a madman but a compos mentis,[20] every human being has the means to “strive toward objects and actions common to all”. These objects and actions common to all, meanwhile, along with “other things which each class knows and does on its own” (Perfect State V, 16, 2: 261) precisely correspond to the prerequisites for the attainment of happiness discussed above, in section 2.2. However, as likewise seen above, these prerequisites, and particularly those things which all human beings ought to know, set fairly high intellectual standards. Nonetheless, according to al-Farabi, the requirement of knowing these common objects does not exclude anyone from attaining happiness, because they

… can be known in two ways, either by being impressed on [the people’s] souls as they really are or by being impressed on them through affinity and symbolic representation. (Perfect State V, 17, 2: 279)

Every human being, thus, can attain the individual felicity of the hereafter,[21] provided, that is, that she learns about the common objects in one of these two ways. It is the duty of society or, more precisely, of the ruler of the excellent city to ensure that everyone is taught these things according to her capacities. In this connection, now, as will be discussed in section 4, religion as the ‘art of persuasion’ has its specific place and significance. Concerning al-Farabi’s notion of society, however, it is important to note that the chief duty ascribed here to society and the excellent city has notable implications for the nature of its government. Government, as can now be concluded and is corroborated by various passages throughout al-Farabi’s oeuvre,[22] must primarily be described as ‘offering guidance’, ‘teaching’, or ‘habituating’.

At this point, the second aspect mentioned above, i.e., the “innate character that is particular to each [individual] and to each group” must be further elucidated (cf. the first quote in this section). Human beings, as noted before, have the same relationship to society as organs to the body. Owing to their particular “innate character” or specific natural disposition, they hold a particular natural place within the ‘organism society’, with a specific ergon they ought to perform, so that the entire ‘body’ can function well. Consequently, human beings not only have a natural duty towards themselves, entailing individual felicity, but also towards society and, even beyond, the cosmic order as a whole, contributing both to the proper functioning of their society and to the happiness of the ‘organism cosmos’ and its various parts.[23] Hence, in correspondence with the particular trades and professions implied by the members’ individual skills, society is structured by nature in an at once organic and hierarchical fashion:

The ruling organ in the body is by nature the most perfect and most complete of the organs in itself and in its specific qualification …; beneath it, in turn, are other organs which rule over organs inferior to them …; they rule and are ruled. In the same way, the ruler of the city is the most perfect part of the city in his specific qualification and has the best of everything which anybody else shares with him; beneath him are people who are ruled by him and rule others. (Perfect State V, 15, 5: 235)

The natural hierarchy underlying society is spelled out in terms of al-Farabi’s distinction between ruling and serving functions. In the excellent city, itself the perfect image of a natural body as well as the cosmos as a whole, the criterion for rulership, in the vein of Plato’s Politeia, is intelligence and wisdom. This is to say that there is a ruler by nature who distinguishes herself by her intimate understanding of the cosmic order, its normative implications, human nature, and how to realize the discovered normative implications in view of the diverse talents and limitations determining the citizens’ “innate characters”. Ruling the city, as was already stated before, consists in providing precisely this kind of guidance: actualizing the various potentials in a well-coordinated manner which faithfully resembles the functioning of organisms, and thus seeking to facilitate every citizen’s pursuit of happiness.[24]

The excellent ruler, as can now be inferred, is not only the most accomplished philosopher possessing a comprehensive theoretical knowledge of all there is.[25] She is also and particularly the one who is able to ensure, first, that every citizen is taught the things they need to do and to know, thus inducing individual felicity; and, second, that everyone is instructed in and carries out those “things which each class knows and does on its own” (Perfect State V, 16, 2: 261; cf. also Political Regime B, 2, 78: 68), in this manner simultaneously bringing about the well-being of the city and contributing to the happiness of the organism cosmos. With this background, al-Farabi’s account of religion, i.e., the art of persuasion or of teaching by virtue of “affinities and symbolic representations” can be addressed.

4. Religion and the art of ruling

4.1 What is ‘religion’?

Religion is opinions and actions, determined and restricted with stipulations and prescribed for a community by their first ruler, who seeks to obtain through their practicing it a specific purpose with respect to them or by means of them. …. If the first ruler is excellent and his rulership truly excellent, then in what he prescribes he seeks only to obtain, for himself and for everyone under his rulership, the ultimate happiness that is truly happiness; and that religion will be the excellent religion. (Book of Religion 1: 93, slightly modified)

As this quotation amply evinces, al-Farabi has a fairly peculiar notion of religion. First, it embraces “opinions” and “actions” and, hence, those two elements which, as seen above (section 2.2), play a significant role in connection with the attainment of individual felicity. Accordingly, human beings need to know certain things (in one of the two mentioned ways) and perform certain actions in order to become truly happy. Second, religion is described as the result of a first ruler’s activities. More precisely, this ruler is depicted as the one who first established the opinions and actions to be held and performed by the community she rules. Furthermore, in so doing she pursued a specific purpose. In other words, these opinions and actions are supposed to be defended and carried out, not for their own sake, but—provided “the first ruler is excellent”—for the sake of ultimate happiness. Religion, therefore, is not a goal in and of itself; it is an instrument, more specifically, it is an instrument of rulership.

At first glance, al-Farabi’s concept of religion may appear as depreciative, particularly from the perspective of existing religions, such as Islam. He bluntly denies religion the status of an autonomous sphere of knowledge and wisdom; he rejects its claim to exclusive truth; and he reduces it to a mere tool. However, these features cannot be assessed tel quel, but require their specific context, namely, al-Farabi’s basic ontological and epistemological views. According to him, the givens of reality—the things constituting reality, their behavior, and the underlying natural laws—are the effects of certain primary principles, such as intelligence, soul, and matter, which are ultimately all founded in a single, first cause (cf. above, section 2.1).[26] These facts now, on al-Farabi’s account, can be known by human beings, just as the moral obligations they entail (as discussed above, section 3.1). Accordingly, there is one objective reality and, epistemologically, one objectively true account of it. There are, however, several methods for appropriating this true account and, in turn, imparting it to others, namely, “either … as [these things] really are or … through affinity and symbolic representation” (section 3.2).

Precisely this latter method of symbolic representation is identified with religion, while its counterpart, teaching and knowing things as they “really are”, corresponds to philosophy. To be sure, philosophy is therefore superior to religion, as is often underscored by scholarship and acknowledged by al-Farabi himself (cf. Book of Religion 5: 97–8). This superiority, however, concerns only the respective epistemic levels. While philosophy is based on demonstration and results in objective certitude, religion is based on dialectical and rhetorical means and results only in probable opinion and conviction.[27] From a pragmatic point of view, by contrast, the coordinate system shifts considerably. From this angle, it is religion which turns out to be no less important than philosophy, due to the givens of anthropology: for by far the majority of people depend on “symbolic representation” as the avenue to the knowledge and activities required for the attainment of felicity, while only a minority can grasp the things as they “really are”.

The relation of religion to philosophy, therefore, is like the relation of human beings to organisms, and of society to the cosmos: that of similitude—provided, that is, it is an excellent religion. It is a similitude of philosophy in various respects, on the one hand, concerning its immanent structure, on the other, regarding its mode of operation. Just like philosophy, it embraces a body of theoretical knowledge (a creed) from which it derives practical rules (the law); and just like philosophy, its principal purpose consists in teaching and, thus, providing a means of governance to the ruler. From this particular setting it can be concluded that what religion teaches, or rather, what the ruler teaches by virtue of religion, is a metaphorical account of what philosophy presents scientifically. This is already conspicuous, for example, in the way al-Farabi presents the theoretical doctrines (creed) conveyed by religion:

Among the theoretical [things taught by the excellent religion] are those that describe God, may He be exalted. Then there are some that describe the spiritual beings, their ranks in themselves, their stations in relation to God, may He be exalted …. (Book of Religion 2: 94)

Even without presenting the entire list, it is obvious that al-Farabi refers to the same issues as those detailed in his Perfect State (see section 2.2 above). However, while the Perfect State employed a terminology reminiscent of philosophical jargon, the Book of Religion falls back on religious terms. Instead of the first cause, it speaks of God; instead of cosmology, it refers to theology; instead of the separate intellects, it evokes angels and demons as spiritual beings. The same kind of shift can be observed in connection with the activities the excellent religion ought to determine (law):

As for actions, they are, first of all, the actions and speeches by which God is praised and extolled. Then there are those that praise the spiritual beings and the angels. Then there are those that praise the prophets, the most excellent kings, the righteous rulers, and the leaders of the right way who have gone before. (Book of Religion 3: 96, slightly modified)

Once again, already the formulas used by al-Farabi to indicate the type of activities determined by religion, without giving a single example, evoke associations with existing religions, particularly, Islam. Thus, with God’s praise one will easily connect the five daily prayers demanded of Muslims; the “prophets”, “righteous rulers”, and “leaders of the right way” are reminiscent of the prophet Muḥammad and his predecessors; of the first four caliphs; and of either the imams of Shi‘ism or other spiritual leaders of Islam (e.g., sufis).

Notably, in light of the above (section 2.2), it is evident that a religion’s holy scripture, like the Qur’an, serves two functions—provided that the respective religion fulfills the excellence criterion. With regard to the doctrines it imparts, it offers a similitude of the objects people actually ought to know in order to achieve their natural telos.[28] As to its practical implications, i.e., the rites and norms it conveys, it executes the aforementioned preparatory function: it trains the faithful in a behavior which is suited to foster exactly the same moral virtues as those addressed by the Nicomachean Ethics and referred to by al-Farabi himself: virtues which improve the soul’s disposition so as to realize, to the best of one’s capacities, its natural ergon.

4.2 Religion and rulership

The natural ruler of the excellent city, nation, or “union of all the societies in the inhabitable world” (section 2.1, first quotation) is, against the backdrop of al-Farabi’s philosophy of society and religion, someone who is at once an accomplished philosopher, prophet, supreme ruler, lawgiver, and imam. She truly understands reality and its underlying principles and is able to verify her knowledge demonstratively. However, she also has the ability to ‘translate’ her knowledge into metaphors and symbolic representations and present them, by means of rhetorical devices, in a convincing fashion.[29] From the perspective of the majority of people, this metaphorical account appears to be some sort of supernatural, divine revelation. In a way, it is certainly ‘divine’, given al-Farabi’s cosmology. However, from the perspective of philosophy, it is clearly not supernatural; it is merely a symbolic representation faithfully encapsulating the essentials of metaphysics, natural philosophy, anthropology, and philosophy of society.[30]

Religion, embracing a doctrinal as well as a legal branch, is thus the most important element of rulership. It is an enterprise that must be carried on beyond the death of the first ruler, fostered and further developed by subsequent rulers and those savants who in a given society are situated fairly high in the natural hierarchy, being intelligent and erudite themselves, and thus ‘naturally’ in charge of disseminating the knowledge required for happiness. In particular, those actions which the first ruler, for whatever reason, did not determine, will have to be legislated at some point.[31] Notably, even though the supposed similitude of society with the cosmos, as well as al-Farabi’s own parlance, suggest that the ‘natural’ form of government would be a monarchy, he remains fairly noncommittal on this topic.

Obviously, if there is at a given time in a given society a human being unifying the required qualities, she will be the natural leader. And in agreement with Plato’s Politeia, al-Farabi seems to believe that the founding act of creating a religion suited to serve as the ‘constitution’ of an excellent polis, presupposes a single, first ruler acting as the original lawgiver. However, if subsequently there is nowhere in the madina a single person incorporating these qualities, several people with complementary properties should team up and henceforth guide the community. This clearly exhibits that al-Farabi was not particularly interested in concrete political structures and systems. His attention, instead, was directed towards the metaphysical principles underlying human associations and their normative implications.

This peculiar stance is clearly displayed in al-Farabi’s discussion of deficient cities and societies. While the details differ across his various treatises dedicated to this topic, the scale by means of which he assesses ‘excellence’ and ‘deficiency’ is consistently those two factors identified above: knowledge and action, on both the common and the class-related levels. Thus, for instance, in the Political Regime he distinguishes six deficient forms of cities, among which he lists the “necessary societies” (Political Regime C, 2, 93: 76, substituting ‘societies’ for ‘associations’). This kind of society or city, he explains,

… is the one in which there is mutual assistance for earning what is necessary to constitute and safeguard bodies. …. Among the necessary cities, there may be some that bring together all of the arts that procure what is necessary. Their ruler is the one who has fine governance and excellent stratagems for using [the citizens] so that they gain the necessary things and fine governance in preserving these things for them or who bestows these things on them from what he has. (Political Regime C, 2, 94: 77)

At first glance, this seems just fine and precisely what good rulership ought to accomplish. All the trades and professions required for the polis to subsist are extant. The ruler is by no means a tyrant exploiting her subjects, but rather excels in helping them to gain these goods, preserving them and distributing them among the latter. Nevertheless, what is deficient in this type of society is adumbrated in the first phrase of the quote: the mutual cooperation described here is directed exclusively towards the well-being of bodies. It thus neglects society’s proper purpose, namely, the promotion of humanity’s natural telos, which certainly presupposes but cannot be reduced to well-functioning bodies.

Society, according to al-Farabi, as can be deduced from these observations, ought to be a joint venture, grounded in the true understanding of reality and its principles, and guided by a religion which translates this understanding, first, into generally comprehensible doctrines, i.e., similitudes, and, second, activities suited to purify and prepare the citizens’ souls in their quest for felicity. Thus, it clearly ought to transcend the mere satisfaction of daily needs and wants. Therefore, al-Farabi concludes,

… the first ruler of the excellent city must already have thorough cognizance of theoretical philosophy; for he cannot understand anything pertaining to God’s, may He be exalted, governance of the world so as to follow it except from that source. It is clear, in addition, that all of this is impossible unless there is a common religion in the cities that brings together their opinions, beliefs, and actions; that renders their divisions harmonious, linked together, and well ordered; and at that point they will support one another in their actions and assist one another to reach the purpose that is sought after, namely, ultimate happiness. (Book of Religion 27: 113, slightly modified)

5. Final remarks

Philosophy and religion turn out to possess a fairly peculiar relation to one another in al-Farabi’s thought. Philosophy, or rather metaphysics, is the only way to advance to the most profound explanation of all there is as well as humanity’s natural duties entailed by the natural givens. Accordingly, an excellent philosopher can do without religion in her pursuit of happiness. Religion, however, cannot do without philosophy and, a fortiori, neither can society. In view of what is at stake in the case of failure to grasp and convey the truth, the pressure put on philosophy and, to some lesser extent, on religion in this theory is enormous. Society cannot fulfill its ergon without either philosophy or religion, nor without a government conscientiously imparting the theoretical and practical duties; with the consequence that, apart from a few ‘born’ philosophers, human beings will fail to attain individual felicity.

While these are serious threats on the practical level, it appears that as far as the underlying anthropology is concerned, al-Farabi endorses a profoundly optimistic view. He is convinced that everything which needs to be known and done to reach individual happiness is attainable by virtue of humanity’s natural endowments. As such, there is no need for revelation of a supernatural kind. Instead, as al-Farabi gives to understand, there is plenty of evidence to be found in reality and its principles, which teach humanity about happiness. There are, furthermore, abundant models, ranging from the cosmic order to the makeup of the most primitive organisms, which need only be emulated to guide humanity towards its final goal. And, last but not least, there are philosophers who discovered and understood these natural givens and implications already centuries ago.[32] Hence, the only thing that remains to be done, on his account, is to put these insights into practice.


Primary Literature in English Translation

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  • –––, Book of Religion, in Alfarabi 2001: 93–113.
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  • –––, Selected Aphorisms, in Alfarabi 2001: 11–67.
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  • –––, 2001, The Political Writings: “Selected Aphorisms” and Other Texts, trans. and annot. by C.E. Butterworth, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.

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