Notes to Affirmative Action

1. Preferences for women don’t figure into the current controversy because women have no trouble competing for college admissions. 2016 figures show women constituting 54 percent of college students and 58 percent of graduate and professional school students. Data from 2017 show women making up 49 percent of first year law school students and 50.7 percent of medical school enrollees. See

The story is quite different for African-Americans and Hispanics.

2. So profound was the shock to the academy that Nicholas Capaldi, writing in 1985, remained under the impression that “[a]ffirmative action as a public policy was first applied on a massive and national scale to institutions of higher learning” (Capaldi 1985, 1).

3. Ironically enough, the first discussions of “inverse” discrimination began in one of the prime sites of analytical philosophy, Analysis. For the full record of exchanges, see Nickel 1972; Cowan 1972; Taylor 1973; Shiner 1973; Silvestri 1973; Nunn 1974; Nickel 1974; Goldman 1975; Ketchum & Pierce 1976; Woodruff 1976; and Simon 1978.

4. See also Fullinwider 1975, Goldman 1979 (65–102), and Fullinwider 1980 (30–44).

5. Similar sentiments were expressed by Virginia Black:

If it is irrational and unjust and cruel to fire someone because he is a black or she is a woman—cases whose absurdity seems obvious—then it is equally irrational and unjust and cruel to hire someone because be is a black or she is a woman. To appreciate the parallel, one has only to remember that to hire X because of color is, ipso facto, not to hire Y because of color. When inscribed in law, this is racism. (Black 1974, 106).

See also Capaldi 1998, 535, 536 (affirmative action is “incoherent” in practice and “illogical”).

6. This idea that using racial preferences involves a kind of practical contradiction was given voice and support at the highest levels of government in the 1980s. William Bradford Reynolds, during his tenure as Assistant Attorney General for Civil Rights in the Reagan Administration, contended:

[T]o those who argue that we must use race to get beyond racism …[h]istory teaches us all too well that such an approach does not work. It is wrong when the government bestows advantages on whites at the expense of innocent blacks; it assumes no greater claim of morality if the tables are turned…. Whatever group membership one inherits, it carries with it no entitlement to preferential treatment over those not similarly endowed with the same immutable characteristics. Any compromise of this principle is discrimination, plain and simple, and such behavior is no more tolerable when employed remedially, in the name of “affirmative action” or “racial balance,” to bestow a gratuitous advantage on members of a particular group, than when it is divorced from such beneficence and for the most invidious of reasons works to one’s disadvantage. (Reynolds 1984, 1004).

While Reynolds found the proposition, “Use race to achieve a colorblind society,” an assault on common sense, he belonged to an administration—like a long line of previous administrations—whose defense policy was grounded on the proposition, “Prepare for war in order to have peace.”

7. Title 42 United States Code Sec. 2000d. Title IX of the Education Amendments of 1972 promised the same protection against gender discrimination. See 20 USC 1681.

8. “(a) It shall be unlawful for an employer (1) to refuse to hire or to discharge any individual, or otherwise to discriminate against any individual with respect to his compensation, terms, conditions, or privileges of employment, because of such individual’s race, color, religion, sex, or national origin; or (2) to limit, segregate, or classify his employees or applicants in any way which would tend to deprive any individual of employment opportunities or otherwise adversely affect his status as an employee, because of such individual’s race, color, religion, sex, or national origin.” Title 42 USC Sec 2000e-2. Unlike Title VI, Title VII went on to spell out some exceptions. Under special circumstances, the Title permitted the use of gender, religion, and national origin as legitimate bases for employer selection. But it made no such exception for race. While being a woman or being a Roman Catholic could sometimes count as a legitimate occupational qualification, being black could not.

9. Griggs v. Duke Power Company, 401 U.S. 424 (1971), at 430, 431. At issue in the case was the use of an aptitude test and a high-school graduation requirement to screen job applicants. Duke Power Company did not succeed in showing that the results of the aptitude test or the possession of a high school diploma bore any demonstrable relation to performance at such of its jobs as janitor, maintenance worker, and the like.

10. For a more extended discussion of goals and quotas, see Fullinwider 1980, 162–177.

11. Consider, for example, this 1969 court decision involving a union with a record of excluding African-Americans and Mexican-Americans. The court imposed an injunction that

prohibit[ed] discrimination in excluding persons from union membership or referring persons for work; prohibit[ed] use of member’s endorsements, family relationship or elections as criteria for membership; …ordered the development of objective membership criteria and prohibited new members …until developed; and ordered continuation of chronological referrals for work, with alternating white and Negro referrals until objective membership criteria are developed.

On appeal, the Court of Appeals for the Fifth Circuit upheld the lower court. In its view,

[t]he District Court did no more than prevent future discrimination when it prohibited a continuing exclusion of Negroes through the application of an apparently neutral membership provision …which served no significant trade-related purpose. [Further] the District Court did no more [in barring new membership until objective criteria were developed] than ensure that the injunction against further racial discrimination would be fairly administered. Absent objective criteria …covert subversion of the purpose of the injunction could occur. The same administrative reasons support alternating white and Negro referrals…

Asbestos Workers v. Vogler, 407 F. 2d 1047 (1960), at 1051, 1055. Each part of the lower court’s order, including the part that required racially balanced referrals, harkened back to a single ground: the part was necessary to prevent future discrimination.

12. For a list of Circuit Court decisions embracing this theory, see Fullinwider 1986b, 106–08 and accompanying footnotes.

13. In 1974, the Court had accepted for decision a similar case involving a race-preference policy at the University of Washington Law School. However, perhaps experiencing second thoughts, the Court then dismissed the case as moot (the plaintiff, admitted to the Law School by a lower court, was about to graduate). See De Funis v. Odegaard, 416 U.S. 312 (1974).

14. Unlike Title VII, which is grounded in the Interstate Commerce Clause of the Constitution, Title VI is grounded in the federal government’s spending powers. Brennan relied on Congressional debate over the Civil Rights Act to argue for the substantive identity of Title VI with the Fourteenth Amendment to the Constitution (which forbids states to discriminate) and the Fifth Amendment (which incorporates the Fourteenth Amendment’s strictures and applies them to the federal government). The debate can be summed up in this rhetorical question: “Why should the government through its spending subsidize acts of private discrimination that it would be forbidden by the Constitution to do itself?” See Bakke, at 329–336 (Brennan, dissenting).

15. For an early statement of the anti-caste principle, see Fiss 1976.

16. A nice discussion of Bakke and equality’s dictates can be found in Dworkin 1985 (see “Bakke’s Case: Are Quotas Really Unfair?” and “What Did Bakke Really Decide?”).

17. To see the limitations of political theory, consider John Rawls’ theory of justice as fairness. For our purposes, what is striking about the theory is the division of labor it embraces. Its very broadest principles of liberty and equality are themselves unable to single out proper micro-allocations of social benefits and burdens. This is not a defect; this is their nature. What they can do is guide the structuring of basic social roles and institutions which then, in their operations, create the social and legal machinery for assigning benefits and burdens. Rawls’ principles oblige a constitution to protect equality of citizenship but leaves most other matters to legislative judgment. Thus, a law that in form and fact makes some people second-class citizens would be unjust, clearly; but this limitation doesn’t bar government from asking people to bear unequal burdens for the common good, not even unequal burdens premised on race or ethnicity. Nor does Rawls’ principle of fair equality of opportunity block such burdens, either, for, while ordinarily discouraging selection based on race or ethnicity, it can itself be limited in the name of achieving greater equality of opportunity (the point made by Goldman in the text, above). To reformers in a society that has greviously failed to secure equal citizenship and fair equality of opportunity throughout its history, Rawls’ principles supply few guideposts.

Robert S. Taylor (2009) disagrees. He argues that Rawls’ principle of fair equality of opportunity implies quite definite policy restrictions on affirmative action. In particular, the principle rules out using racial or gender preferences to overcome the legacy of disadvantage engendered by our society’s long history of racial oppression and gender subordination. Taylor’s intricate and lengthy argument guides us through the ideal/non–ideal distinction in Rawls and the role that pure procedural justice plays in ideal theory. Policies adopted in a far–from–ideal world may have to depart from the “letter” of the fair equality of opportunity principle, according to Taylor, but should never violate its “spirit.” If society were permitted to adopt any means necessary to overcome a legacy of injustice, that would makes Rawls’ theory too instrumentalist; it would put the non–ideal part of the theory in “fatal tension” with its “deontological ideal–theory counterpart” (Taylor, 490). Society, aiming for justice, must seek to “counterbalance and ultimately eliminate the social disadvantages of gender [and] race” through programs that equalize “inputs” to human capital formation. Special training, mentoring, and funding directed toward disadvantaged groups may violate the “letter” of formal equal opportunity but are justified to bring about greater justice. By patiently, systematically applying such “inputs” society will eventually neutralize unjust disadvantages, Taylor argues. But what if structures of informal and systemic discrimination are so robust that this application can’t possibly eventuate in a just society? Taylor concedes that resort to racial and gender preferences might then be warranted on Rawlsian grounds. He believes, however, that such structural blockages are rare (Taylor 502).

The crux of Taylor’s complaint against racial and ethnic preferences is this: the “spirit” of fair equality of opportunity lies in its pure proceduralism. A “fair distribution” of jobs and college admissions “is simply whatever emerges from a fair procedure, defined as one that neutralizes social contingencies” such as class-position, wealth, and the like (Taylor, 493). If these contingenies aren’t neutralized and some groups continue to suffer unjust disadvantages, the way is nevertheless not open to use a tool like racial preferences to mimic the distribution of benefits that would have obtained otherwise. “[W]e simply cannot know what the counterfactual results of a ‘clean’ competition would look like” (Taylor, 494). D. C. Matthew (2015) and Kristen Mishelski (2016) take issue with Taylor’s argument. They accuse him of misunderstanding how pure procedural justice works (Meshelski, 437, 439) and what it implies for non-deal circumstances (Matthew, 334). They dispute our ignorance of outcomes under ideal conditions (Meshelski, 440-441) or that it is disabling (Matthew, 333-334). Meshelski admits the policy implications of her rebuttal are “narrow” (441) and, indeed, a careful reading of these three essays ends up shedding very little light on affirmative action as a legitimate undertaking (though it may sharpen our understanding of the complexities in Rawls’ theory of justice).

18. Podberesky v. Kirwan, 38 F 3d 147 (Fourth Circuit, 1994).

19. Wessmann v. Gittens, 106 F 3d 798 (First Circuit, 1998).

20. Johnson v. Board of Regents, 263 F 3d 1234 (Eleventh Circuit, 2001).

21. Grutter v. Bollinger, 137 F. Supp. 2d 821 (2001).

22. For example, in 1992, when Cheryl Hopwood filed a law suit against the University of Texas Law School, it was using a two-track admissions policy in which applications from African-Americans and Hispanics were evaluated separately—and against more lenient standards—from other applications. See Hopwood v. Texas, 861 F. Supp. 551 (1994) at 561–2, 563, 575.

23. See Wygant v. Jackson, 476 U.S. 267 (1986); Richmond v. J. A. Croson Company, 488 U.S. 469 (1989); Adarand Constructors v. Pena, 515 U.S. 200 (1995).

24. See Koppelman and Rebstock (2007) for an argument that admissions schemes never provide “truly individualized consideration.”

26. Consider the waffling in the University of Texas brief in Fisher 2016. The University claims to operate with a “broad vision of diversity”. It goes on: “The educational benefits of diversity include, but are not limited to, bringing unique and direct perspectives to the issues and topics discussed and debated in classrooms, promoting cross–racial understanding, breaking down racial and ethnic stereotypes, and creating an environment in which students do not feel like spokespersons for their race” (University of Texas 2015, 5). All of the benefits listed here, including the “unique and direct perspectives,” refer to upshots of racial diversity, though the sentence begins with “diversity” unmodified and within an initial framing of a “broad vision.”

27. According to Anderson, integration helps undermine stereotypes. Here is what she says about integrated education.

The stereotypes in question are forms of practical incompetence, embodied in clumsy and disrespectful habits that typically inform our behavior in an unconscious way. Breaking them down is a matter of acquiring practical knowledge, a skilL of engaging with people of different races in a manner that is sensitive to and respectful of their individual differences and social circumstances. This is why this knowledge cannot be obtained [in schools] solely from curricular materials or from a racially homogenous faculty. It requires actually interacting with people of different races. Nor can it be obtained from token numbers of blacks, Latinos, and Native Americans who would populate selective college campuses in the absence of affirmative action […] A critical mass of students of a given racial group needs to be present to help people learn to see internal heterogeneity in that group. This explains why the educational interest in racial diversity needs to pay “attention to the numbers” (Anderson 2002, 1224 [emphases added; footnotes omitted]).

[E]lites in a democratic society, in which racial ascriptions and identities place people in different walks of life, need to be educated in racially integrated settings (Anderson 2004, 26).

On its face it looks as though Anderson is siding with the amici briefs discussed earlier in making integrated education an imperative. Thus, it would be interesting to know her take on the Spelman graduate in my example and the adequacy of her education. This is not an idle question. In her book, The Imperative of Integration, she seems committed to the “imperative” without qualification. Tommie Shelby in a long review of her book takes issue with her on this point, focusing especially on spacial integration (Shelby 2014). Anderson refers only in passing to Historically Black Colleges and Universities but implies their time has passed: “Black students today who attend majority–white colleges have higher incomes than HBC graduates” (Anderson 2014, 169). She doesn’t address directly whether the Spelman graduate has had a “deficient” education and, if so, whether the deficiency lies in her not “actually interacting with people of different races.”

28. In 2007, after taking testimony from several individuals including Sander, the U. S. Civil Rights Commission published a briefing document proposing that “[l]aw schools voluntarily disclose…[information] on student academic performance, attrition, graduation, bar passage, student loan default, and future income disaggregated by academic credentials.” During the same period, Sander asked the State Bar Association of California to allow conditional access to its data base about bar passage from 1972–2007. This data base indicates for 246,000 applicants to the bar whether they passed the bar exam, their scores, the law schools they attended, their LSAT scores and GPAs. The State Bar refused and Sander sued. The State Bar alleged its disclosiure of the records would violate the confidentiality of bar exam takers. Sander proposed to “access…[the] admissions records…subject to conditions designed to ensure the privacy of bar applicants” (emphasis added). Litigation ensued for eight years. In November 2016, a trial court found for the State Bar on the grounds that none of Sander’s proposals could successfully anonymize the records. See Sander v. State Bar of California, Supreme Court of California, Case No. S194951, December 19, 2013, and Sander v. State Bar of California, Superior Court of California, San Francisco, Department 305, Case No. CPF-08-508880, November 7, 2016.

29. Bernard Boxill has insisted that merely receiving benefits produced by injustice is enough to make one personally liable to compensate the victim of injustice (Boxill 1972). And who is the victim of injustice? “We know that all blacks, lower class, middle class, and upper class, have been wronged by racial injustice” (Boxill 1984, 164). In Boxill 1978, 251, he argues that the correlation between “preferences received” and “compensation deserved,” though not perfect, is very high. A recent piece by D. W. Haslett (2002) also conceives of affirmative action as a way to neutralize “tainted” advantages enjoyed by whites, although he concedes that the neutralization is “extremely rough” (83). James Sterba carries on the tradition, striving to refute the claim that affirmative action distributes its benefits and burdens in an up-side down way, rewarding well–off blacks and placing the costs on unoffending whites. Well–off blacks are no less victims of discrimination, he insists, and nearly every white has unjustly benefited from racial discrimination (Sterba 2009, 89–90. Fiscus 1992 echoes Justice Brennan’s argument and generalizes it. See also Wise 2003.

Copyright © 2018 by
Robert Fullinwider <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free