Ludwig Andreas Feuerbach

First published Mon Dec 9, 2013

For a number of years in the mid-nineteenth century Ludwig Feuerbach (1804–1872) played an important role in the history of post-Hegelian German philosophy, and in the transition from idealism to various forms of naturalism, materialism and positivism that is one of the most notable developments of this period. To the extent that he is remembered today by non-specialists in the history of nineteenth-century religious thought, it is mainly as the object of Marx’s criticism in his famous Theses on Feuerbach, originally penned in 1845 and first published posthumously by Friedrich Engels as an appendix to his book, Ludwig Feuerbach and the End of Classical German Philosophy (Engels, 1888). Although never without his admirers, who included several leading popularizers of scientific materialism in the second half the nineteenth century (cf. Gregory, 1977), Feuerbach’s public influence declined rapidly after the failed revolution of 1848/49 (in approximately inverse proportion to the rising popularity of Schopenhauer). Renewed philosophical attention paid to him in the middle of the twentieth century is largely attributable to the publication, beginning in the late 1920s, of Marx’s early philosophical manuscripts, including The German Ideology, which revealed the extent of Feuerbach’s influence on Marx and Engels during the period culminating in the composition of that historic work (1845–46).

Apart from this influence, and the continuing interest of his work as a theorist of religion, Feuerbach’s importance for the history of modern philosophy is also due to the fact that the publication of The Essence of Christianity in 1841 can be taken, as it was by Engels, to symbolically mark the end of the period of classical German philosophy that had begun sixty years earlier with the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason—though some might want to question the assumption involved in this way of putting things that classical German philosophy culminated in the Hegelian system that Engels thought of Feuerbach as having overthrown. In any case, Feuerbach’s biography and the trajectory of his thinking are both closely intertwined with political and intellectual developments in the period referred to by historians as the Vormärz, which extends from 1830–1848.[1] Although he remained unable to bring to fruition the “philosophy of the future,” the aphoristically formulated “principles” of which he attempted to set out in 1843, the emphases in his later essays on corporeality, the senses, finitude, inter-subjectivity, and drive psychology introduced into the history of modern thought themes developed further by Marx, Freud, Nietzsche, Martin Buber, Karl Löwith, Maurice Merleu-Ponty and Alfred Schmidt, among others.

1. Biographical Introduction

Ludwig was the third son of the distinguished jurist, Paul Johann Anselm Ritter von Feuerbach. His nephew, the neo-classical painter, Anselm Feuerbach, was the son of Ludwig’s older brother, also called Anselm, himself a classical archaeologist and aesthetician “in the spirit of Lessing and Winckelmann.”[2] Ludwig’s father, who studied philosophy and law at Jena in the 1790s with the Kantians, Karl Reinhold and Gottlieb Hufeland, respectively, belonged to a group of distinguished northern German scholars called to Bavaria during the period of administrative reform under Maximilian Montgelas, and charged with the task of modernizing the legal and educational institutions of what became in 1806 the modern kingdom of Bavaria. Other members of this group of Nordlichter or “northern lights” included F. I. Niethammer, F. H. Jacobi (the godfather of Ludwig’s younger brother, Friedrich), and Friedrich Thiersch (the tutor of Ludwig’s two oldest brothers, who has sometimes been called “the Humboldt of Bavaria”). P. J. A. Feuerbach was knighted in recognition of his achievement in modernizing of the Bavarian penal code, though his political influence was dramatically curtailed as a result of outspoken national-liberal criticisms of Napoleon expressed in pamphlets he published in 1813 and 1814.

Raised Protestant and religiously devout in his youth, Ludwig matriculated in the theological faculty of the University of Heidelberg in 1823, where his father hoped he would come under the influence of the late rationalist theologian, H. E. G. Paulus. Ludwig was won over instead by the speculative theologian, Karl Daub, who had been instrumental in bringing Hegel to Heidelberg for two years in 1816, and was by this time one of the foremost theologians of the Hegelian school. By 1824 Ludwig had secured his father’s grudging permission to transfer to Berlin under the pretext of wanting to study with the theologians Friedrich Schleiermacher and August Neander, but in fact because of his growing infatuation with Hegel’s philosophy. Feuerbach’s matriculation at Berlin was delayed because of suspicions of his involvement in the politically subversive student fraternity (Burschenschaft) movement, in which two of his older brothers were active, as a result of which one of them (Karl, a talented mathematician) was imprisoned and subsequently attempted suicide. In 1825, to his father’s consternation, Ludwig transferred to the philosophical faculty, thereafter hearing within a two-year period all of Hegel’s lectures except for those on aesthetics, repeating the lectures on logic twice.[3]

Shortly after defending his Latin dissertation, De ratione, una, universali, infinita, at Erlangen in 1828 Feuerbach began to lecture on the history of modern philosophy at the conservative university there, many of whose faculty were closely associated with the neo-Pietist Awakening, and, in the case of Julius Friedrich Stahl, who would go on to become a leading theorist of conservatism, also with the so-called “positive philosophy” of the late Schelling. The scathingly satirical and even vulgar couplets (Xenien) directed against the Pietists that Feuerbach appended to his first book, Thoughts on Death and Immortality (1830, hereafter Thoughts; see Section 2 below), which he published anonymously in 1830, effectively destroyed his prospects for an academic career.

During the 1830s Feuerbach published three books on the history of modern philosophy, in addition to several essays and reviews. These include the History of Modern Philosophy from Bacon to Spinoza (1833), History of Modern Philosophy: Presentation, Development, and Critique of the Leibnizian Philosophy (1837), and Pierre Bayle: A Contribution to the History of Philosophy and Humanity (1838), none of which have been translated into English. The first of them won him the praise of Edward Gans and an invitation to contribute reviews to the Annals for Scientific Criticism, the principal journal of the Hegelian academic establishment in Berlin. In these reviews Feuerbach defended the Hegelian philosophy vigorously against critics such as Karl Bachmann. Even after the publication of the works on Leibniz and Bayle, however, he was refused an academic appointment. He was able for several decades to sustain his existence as an independent scholar in the remote Frankish village of Bruckberg by virtue of his wife, Bertha Löw, having been partial heir of a porcelain factory located there, from a modest pension due to his father’s service to Bavaria, and from publishing royalties.

The event that precipitated the gradual dissolution of the Hegelian synthesis of faith and knowledge that Marx and Engels later referred to sardonically as the “putrefaction of absolute spirit” was the publication in two volumes in 1835–36 of D. F. Strauss’s Life of Jesus Critically Examined. Here Strauss used the tools of the “higher criticism” he had acquired from his Tübingen teacher, F. C. Baur, to reveal the historical unreliability of the accounts of the life of Jesus preserved in the canonical gospels, and interpreted the doctrine of the incarnation of Christ as a mythological expression of the philosophical truth of the identity of the divine spirit and the human species (conceived as the community of finite spirits existing throughout history, and not as the historical individual, Jesus of Nazareth). The appearance of Strauss’s book confirmed the suspicions of theological conservatives like E. W. Hengstenberg and Heinrich Leo that Hegel’s philosophy, despite its use of Christian terminology, is incompatible with the historical faith, and the editors of the Berlin Annals felt compelled to publically discredit Strauss’s Hegelian credentials. It was in the wake of these events that Arnold Ruge established the Halle Annals for German Science and Art, which served for several years as the principal literary organ of the Young Hegelians, and to which Feuerbach began to contribute essays and reviews in 1838, including in 1839 an essay entitled “Toward a Critique of the Hegelian Philosophy,” in which he first began to distance himself publically from the Hegelian cause, calling for a “return to nature”—and to a naturalistic explanation of the mysteries of Christianity, and of religion more generally.[4]

Feuerbach achieved the height of his brief literary fame with the publication in 1841 of The Essence of Christianity, which was translated into English by the novelist, Mary Anne Evans (a.k.a. George Eliot), who also translated Strauss’s Life of Jesus. Engels recalled the appearance of Feuerbach’s book as having a profoundly “liberating effect” on him and Marx by “breaking the spell” of the Hegelian system, and establishing the truths that human consciousness is the only consciousness or spirit that exists, and that it is dependent upon the physical existence of human beings as part of nature (Engels, 1888, 12–13). In 1844 Marx wrote to Feuerbach, with reference to the latter’s Principles of the Philosophy of the Future (1843; hereafter Principles) and The Essence of Faith According to Luther (1844), that in them he had, intentionally or not, “given socialism a philosophical foundation” (GW, v. 18, p. 376). In fact, Feuerbach was only then beginning to acquaint himself with socialist ideas through his reading of authors like Lorenz von Stein and Wilhelm Weitling. In the end he declined Marx’s request for a contribution to the German-French Annals, as well as Ruge’s urging that he become more politically engaged. He did come out of rural seclusion to observe fairly passively the ultimately disappointing events in Frankfurt in 1848, and to deliver a series of public lectures at Heidelberg beginning the same year. He unfortunately failed to develop with much specificity or argumentative rigor the “philosophy of the future” for which he himself called in the early 1840s, continuing instead to focus his attention mainly on religion in works like The Essence of Religion (1845), Lectures on the Essence of Religion (1851), and Theogony According to the Sources of Classical, Hebrew and Christian Antiquity (1857). The five years of philological labor that Feuerbach invested in the latter work, which he considered his crowning achievement, went largely unnoticed both by his contemporaries and by posterity.

During the 1840s Feuerbach corresponded and occasionally visited and maintained close personal relationships with several leading German radicals, including, in addition to Ruge and Marx, the publishers Otto Lüning, Otto Wigand, and Julius Fröbel; the revolutionary poet, Georg Herwegh, and his wife, Emma; Hermann Kriege, a freelance activist and early German socialist who emigrated to America; and scientific materialists like Jacob Moleschott and Carl Vogt. The impression made by him on several leading lights of the younger generation is reflected in the Gottfried Keller’s Bildungsroman, Green Henry, first published in 1855, and in the dedication (to Feuerbach) of Richard Wagner’s early book, The Art-Work of the Future (1850).

Partly as the result of a global financial crisis, the porcelain factory that had supported Feuerbach’s literary existence went bankrupt in 1859. The following year he and his wife and daughter were forced to relocate to the village of Rechenberg, located then on the outskirts of Nuremberg, where Feuerbach lived out the remainder of his life under severely strained financial circumstances and in increasingly ill health. Although his productivity as a writer declined sharply during this period, he was able to bring out in 1866 the tenth and final volume of his collected works (which had begun to appear in 1846), bearing the title God, Freedom and Immortality from the Standpoint of Anthropology, and including a fairly substantial, though fragmentary, essay “On Spiritualism and Materialism, Especially in Relation to the Freedom of the Will.” In this essay, and in an essay on ethics that Feuerbach left incomplete at his death, we find him beginning to sketch out a moral psychology and an eudaimonistic ethical theory in which the concept of the “drive-to-happiness” (Glückseligkeitstrieb) plays a central role.

2. Early Idealistic Pantheism

In an essay published in 1835 Heinrich Heine observed that pantheism had by this time become “the secret religion of Germany.”[5] That Feuerbach is generally remembered as an atheist and a materialist has tended to obscure the fact that he began his philosophical career as an enthusiastic adherent of this philosophical religion, one early expression of which can be found in the Greek words “Hen kai Pan” (One and All) inscribed in 1791 by Hölderlin in Hegel’s student album from Tübingen (cf. Pinkard, 2000, 32).[6] This inscription is an allusion to words uttered by Lessing after reading Goethe’s poem-fragment, “Prometheus,” and responding enthusiastically by declaring himself a Spinozist, according to the account contained in Jacobi’s famous Letters on the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785; cf. Jacobi, 1994, 187). It was the publication of these letters that set off the original Pantheism Controversy, and had the unintended effect of leading more than one generation of young German poets and thinkers to regard Spinoza no longer as a “dead dog” and a godless atheist, but rather as the God-intoxicated sage of a pantheistic creed in which those who, like Lessing, could no longer “stomach” orthodox conceptions of the divinity that make a strict distinction between creator and creation, could seek to satisfy their spiritual aspirations. Feuerbach included several verses of the Prometheus-fragment as an epigram to his first book, in which he used the tools of Hegelian logic to develop a view of the divinity as One and All along lines laid out by Spinoza, Giordano Bruno and Jacob Boehme. These three he hailed as “pious God-inspired sages […] Who prophetically laid the ground for the feast of reconciliation [between nature and spirit that it is] the task of the modern age [to celebrate]” (GTU 241/48, 463/214). But this reconciliation, he argued, cannot occur as long as God continues to be thought of as an individual person existing independently of the world.

That Feuerbach, unlike Strauss, never accepted Hegel’s characterization of Christianity as the consummate religion is clear from the contents of a letter he sent to Hegel along with his dissertation in 1828.[7] In this letter he identified the historical task remaining in the wake of Hegel’s philosophical achievement to be the establishment of the “sole sovereignty of reason” in a “kingdom of the Idea” that would inaugurate a new spiritual dispensation. Foreshadowing arguments put forward in his first book, Feuerbach went on in this letter to emphasize the need for “the I, the self in general, which especially since the beginning of the Christian era, has ruled the world and has thought of itself as the only spirit that exists at all [to be] cast down from its royal throne.”[8] This, he proposed, would require prevailing ways of thinking about time, death, this world and the beyond, individuality, personhood and God to be radically transformed within and beyond the walls of academia.

Feuerbach made his first attempt to challenge prevailing ways of thinking about individuality in his inaugural dissertation, where he presented himself as a defender of speculative philosophy against those critics who claim that human reason is restricted to certain limits beyond which all inquiry is futile, and who accuse speculative philosophers of having transgressed these. This criticism, he argued, presupposes a conception of reason is a cognitive faculty of the individual thinking subject that is employed as an instrument for apprehending truths. He aimed to show that this view of the nature of reason is mistaken, that reason is one and the same in all thinking subjects, that it is universal and infinite, and that thinking (Denken) is not an activity performed by the individual, but rather by “the species” acting through the individual. “In thinking,” Feuerbach wrote, “I am bound together with, or rather, I am one with—indeed, I myself am—all human beings” (GW I:18).

In the introduction to Thoughts Feuerbach assumes the role of diagnostician of a spiritual malady by which he claims that modern moral subjects are afflicted. This malady, to which he does not give a name, but which he might have called either individualism or egoism, he takes to be the defining feature of the modern age insofar as this age conceives of “the single human individual for himself in his individuality […] as divine and infinite” (GTU 189/10). The principal symptom of this malady is the loss of “the perception [Anschauung] of the true totality, of oneness and life in one unity” (GTU 264/66). This loss Feuerbach finds reflected in three general tendencies of the modern age: 1) the tendency to regard human history solely as the history of the opinions and actions of individual human subjects, and not as the history of humanity conceived as a single collective agent, 2) the tendency to regard nature as a mere aggregate of “countless single stars, stones, plants, animals, elements and things” (GTU 195/14) whose relations to one another are entirely external and mechanical, rather than as an organic whole the internal dynamics of which are animated by a single all-encompassing vital principle, and 3) the tendency to conceive of God as a personal agent whose inscrutable will, through which the world came into being from nothing and is continually directed, is unconstrained by rational necessity.

Feuerbach’s basic objection to the theistic conception of God and his relation to creation is that, on it, both are conceived as equally spiritless. Rather than consisting of lifeless matter to which motion is first imparted by the purposeful action of an external agent, Feuerbach argues that nature contains within itself the principle of its own development. It exercises “unlimited creative power” by ceaselessly dividing and distinguishing its individual parts from one another. But the immeasurable multiplicity of systems within systems that results from this activity constitutes a single organic totality. “Nature is ground and principle of itself, or—what is the same thing, it exists out of necessity, out of the soul, the essence of God, in which he is one with nature” (GTU, 291/86). God, on this view, is not a skilled mechanic who acts upon the world, but a prolific artist who lives in and through it.

In Thoughts Feuerbach further argues that the death of finite individuals is not merely an empirical fact, but also an a priori truth that follows from a proper understanding of the relations between the infinite and the finite, and between essence and existence. Nature is the totality of finite individuals existing in distinction from one another in time and space. Since to be a finite individual is not to be any number of other individuals from which one is distinct, non-being is not only the condition of individuals before they have begun to exist and after they have ceased to do so, but also a condition in which they participate by being the determinate entities that they are. Thus, being and non-being, or life and death, are equally constitutive of the existence of finite entities throughout the entire course of their generation and destruction.

Everything that exists has an essence that is distinct from its existence. Although individuals exist in time and space, their essences do not. Essence in general is timeless and unextended. Feuerbach nevertheless regards it as a kind of cognitive space in which individual essences are conceptually contained. Real or three-dimensional space, within which individual things and people exist in distinction from one another and in temporal succession, he thinks of as essence “in the determination of its being-outside-of-itself” (GTU 250/55). In his being-one, Feuerbach argues, God is everything-as-one, and is, as such, the universal essence in which all finite essences are “grounded, contained and conceived [begriffen]” (GTU 241/48).

It is by means of Empfindung or sense experience that sentient beings are able to distinguish individuals from one another, including, in some instances, individuals that share the same essence. The form of experience is temporality, which is to say that whatever is directly experienced occurs “now,” or at the moment in time to which we refer as “the present.” Experience, in other words, is essentially fleeting and transitory, and its contents are incommunicable. What we experience are the perceivable features of individual objects. It is through the act of thinking that we are able to identify those features through the possession of which different individuals belong to the same species, with the other members of which they share these essential features in common.

Unlike sense experience, thought is essentially communicable. Thinking is not an activity performed by the individual person qua individual. It is the activity of spirit, to which Hegel famously referred in the Phenomenology as “ ‘I’ that is ‘We’ and ‘We’ that is ‘I’” (Hegel, 1977, 110). Pure spirit is nothing but this thinking activity, in which the individual thinker participates without himself (or herself) being the principal thinking agent. That thoughts present themselves to the consciousness of individual thinking subjects in temporal succession is due, not to the nature of thought itself, but to the nature of individuality, and to the fact that individual thinking subjects, while able to participate in the life of spirit, do not cease in doing so to exist as corporeally distinct entities who remain part of nature, and are thus not pure spirit.

A biological species is both identical with and distinct from the individual organisms that make it up. The species has no existence apart form these individual organisms, and yet the perpetuation of the species involves the perpetual generation and destruction of the particular individuals of which it is composed. Similarly, Spirit has no existence apart from the existence of individual self-conscious persons in whom Spirit becomes conscious of itself (i.e. constitutes itself as Spirit). Just as the life of a biological species only appears in the generation and destruction of individual organisms, so the life of Spirit involves the generation and destruction of these individual persons. Viewed in this light, the death of the individual is necessitated by the life of infinite Spirit. “Death is just the withdrawal and departure of your objectivity from your subjectivity, which is eternally living activity and therefore everlasting and immortal” (GTU, 323/111). Arguing thus, Feuerbach urged his readers to acknowledge and accept the irreversibility of their individual mortality so that in doing so they might come to an awareness of the immortality of their species-essence, and thus to knowledge of their true self, which is not the individual person with whom they were accustomed to identify themselves. They would then be in a position to recognize that, while “the shell of death is hard, its kernel is sweet” (GTU, 205/20), and that the true belief in immortality is “a belief in the infinity of Spirit and in the everlasting youth of humanity, in the inexhaustible love and creative power of Spirit, in its eternally unfolding itself into new individuals out of the womb of its plenitude and granting new beings for the glorification, enjoyment, and contemplation of itself” (GTU, 357/137).

In light of the emphasis placed in his later works on the practical existential needs of the embodied individual subject, it should be noted that during his early idealistic phase Feuerbach was strongly committed to a theoretical ideal of philosophy according to which contemplation of and submersion in God is the highest ethical act of which human beings are capable. Whereas in his later works Feuerbach would seek to compel philosophy “to come down from its divine and self-sufficient blissfulness in thought and open its eyes to human misery (GPZ 264/3),” here he spoke instead of “the painful whimpering of the sick and the last moans of the dying as victory songs of the species [in which it] celebrates its reality and victorious lordship over the single phenomenon” (GTU, 302/ 95).

3. Feuerbach as Historian of Philosophy

The understanding of reason as one and universal embodied in the works discussed in the preceding section also informs the approach taken by Feuerbach to the history of philosophy in the three previously mentioned books and a series of lectures that he produced during the 1830s.[9] In his lectures on the history of modern philosophy Feuerbach emphasizes that philosophical reflection is an activity to which human beings are driven. The history of the philosophical systems that this activity has produced, he argues, is conceived only subjectively and thus inadequately as long as it is regarded as the history of the opinions of individual thinkers. Because thinking is a species-activity the philosophical systems that have arisen in the course of the history of philosophy should be regarded as necessary standpoints of reason itself. The Idea is not something first produced by philosophical reflection. Rather, the individual thinker, in the act of thinking, transcends his individuality and functions as an instrument or organ through which the Idea actualizes one of its moments, which is later reproduced in the consciousness of the historian of philosophy. The activity of the Idea is experienced subjectively as inspiration (Begeisterung). In producing itself, the Idea does not pass from nonbeing into being, but rather from one state of being (being in itself) to another (being for itself). The Idea produces itself by determining itself, and human consciousness is the medium of its self-actualization. “Reason is nothing but the self-activity of the eternal, infinite idea, whether in art or religion or philosophy, but this activity is always the activity of the Idea in a particular determination and thus also at a particular time, for it is precisely according to the particular determinations of the idea that enter successively into human consciousness that we differentiate the periods and epochs of history” (VGP, 11).

The emergence of new philosophical systems results on this view from a necessity that is both internal and external. Certain philosophical ideas are only capable of achieving historical expression under specific historical conditions. Just as it was only possible for Christianity to appear at that point in history when the ties of family and nation in Greco-Roman antiquity were dissolved, so it was only possible for modern philosophy to appear under specific historical conditions. The beginning of the history of modern philosophy must be located at the point at which the modern spirit first begins to distinguish itself from the medieval spirit. The dominant principle of the medieval period was the Judeo-Christian monotheistic principle, according to which God is conceived as an omnipotent person through an act of whose will the material world was created from nothing (ex nihilo). It is because nature as conceived from this standpoint is excluded from the divine substance, according to Feuerbach, that medieval thought showed no interest in the investigation of nature. It is only where the substantiality of nature begins to be rediscovered that the spirit of modernity distinguishes itself from the medieval spirit. This occurs most clearly where matter comes to be regarded as an attribute of the divine substance, so that God is no longer conceived of as a being distinct from nature but rather as the immutable and eternal imminent cause from which the plenitude of finite shapes in nature pours forth. This happens first among the nature philosophers of the Italian Renaissance, and subsequently in the speculative reflections of Jakob Böhme and in the system of Spinoza. Indeed, it is one distinctive feature of Feuerbach’s view of the history of modern philosophy that he sees it begins, not with Descartes, but with the nature philosophers of the Italian Renaissance. Feuerbach insists upon speculative significance of Bacon’s philosophy of nature. It is precisely in subjecting nature to experimentation and thereby to rational comprehension that spirit raises itself above nature. But while Feuerbach emphasizes philosophical importance of experience in modern rediscovery of nature, he nevertheless insists that empiricism lacks a “principle” of its own. Later he will speak of the need for an alliance between German metaphysics and “the anti-scholastic, sanguine principle of French sensualism and materialism” (VT, 254–255/165).

Feuerbach’s conviction that Christian faith is inimical to reason and philosophy was strengthened by his own studies of the history of modern philosophy, especially his studies of Leibniz and Bayle. His monographs on these figures were written during the period of controversy following the appearance of Strauss’s Life of Jesus. Toward the end of the 1830s the Young Hegelians were increasingly opposed on two fronts, by right-wing Hegelians such as Friedrich Göschel, who insisted upon the compatibility of Hegelianism and Protestant orthodoxy, and by representatives of the so-called “Positive Philosophy,” who, taking their inspiration from the late Schelling, emphasized the personality of God as disclosed in the Christian revelation as the supreme metaphysical principle (cf. Breckman 1999 and Gooch 2011). It is in light of these developments that, beginning in the Leibniz monograph, Feuerbach sought increasingly to distinguish from one another, and to demonstrate the incompatibility of, what he refers to there as “the philosophical standpoint” and “the theological standpoint,” respectively. In general, Feuerbach regarded Leibniz’s theory of monads as an original philosophical position that offers a genuinely novel conception of substance and an alternative to the mechanistic-mathematical Cartesian account of motion, and thus constitutes an organic link in the developmental sequence of historical philosophical systems. Feuerbach criticized Leibniz, however, for not having derived the unity or harmony of the monads from the nature of the monads themselves, and for appealing instead to a theological representation of God as an alien, external power who achieves this harmonization miraculously, and hence, inexplicably.

Feuerbach regards the theological standpoint as “practical” because it imagines God as a being separate from the world, upon which he acts according to purposes similar to those that guide the actions of human beings, rather than conceiving the world as a necessary, and hence rationally intelligible, consequence of the divine nature. To be sure, for Leibniz, there is nothing arbitrary about the divine will. God’s will is determined by his infinite wisdom and goodness, which compel him to choose to create the best possible world. But this attempt to synthesize rational necessity and divine sovereignty remains in Feuerbach’s view an unacceptable compromise. Like Tycho Brahe, who sought to combine the Ptolomaic and Copernican astronomies, Leibniz sought to reconcile the irreconcilable.

Although, considered superficially, Feuerbach’s study of Bayle is a continuation of the line of inquiry pursued in his earlier historical monographs, closer observation confirms Rawidowicz’s observation that this book marks an important turning point in his intellectual development (Rawidowicz, 1964, 62–62). The book is full of digressions that go on for many pages without making any reference to Bayle, which can produce an impression that it lacks a clearly defined focus. In fact Feuerbach is here moving toward, and building a case for, a claim that he articulates more explicitly in succeeding years, namely, that the “practical negation” of Christianity is a fait accompli insofar as the scientific, economic, aesthetic, ethical and political values and institutions that are constitutive of modern European culture are incompatible with the demands of authentic Christian faith as expressed in the Bible and in the writings of classical patristic and medieval authors, who are either indifferent or inimical to the scientific investigation of nature, the acquisition of wealth, the pursuit of artistic creativity as an end in itself, and attempts to establish ethical and political norms on the basis of universally valid rational principles rather than the authority of revelation or of the Church.

Although the Protestant Reformation, in its rejection of clerical celibacy, its affirmation of the vocation of the laity, and its separation of temporal and spiritual authority, resolved the contradiction between the spirit and the flesh that was characteristic of medieval Catholicism, Feuerbach argues, it failed to resolve the contradiction between faith and reason, or theology and philosophy. Bayle’s historical significance for Feuerbach consists in his uncompromising exposure of this contradiction, which, because it was so deeply rooted in Bayle’s own character, he himself could only resolve by embracing fideism. Feuerbach sought to further expose this contraction in his 1839 essay, “On Philosophy and Christianity,” in which he for the first time publically repudiated the Hegelian claim that philosophy affirms in the form of conceptual thinking the same truths affirmed by religion in the form of sensible representations.

4. The Critique of Christianity

In a section of the preface to the second edition of The Essence of Christianity (1843) that Eliot omitted from her translation Feuerbach reveals that he had sought in this book to achieve two things: First, to attack the Hegelian claim for the identity of religious and philosophical truth by showing that Hegel succeeds in reconciling religion with philosophy only by robbing religion of its most distinctive content. Second, “to place the so-called positive philosophy in a most fatal light by showing that the original of its idolatrous image of God [Götzenbild] is man, that flesh and blood belong to personality essentially” (WC, 10–11). Appreciation of each of these objectives requires further clarification of the historical context in which Feuerbach’s book appeared, namely one year after the ascension to the Prussian throne of the Romantic conservative, Friedrich Wilhelm IV, whose inner circle of advisors consisted of devout aristocrats closely associated with the neo-Pietist Awakening, who felt called to establish a German-Christian state as a bulwark against the influence of subversive ideas on the continent. 1840 also saw the death of the Prussian minister of culture, Karl vom Stein zum Altenstein, who had been a supporter of the Hegelian cause, and a bearer of the hopes of the Young Hegelians both for academic advancement and for a Prussian state informed by a liberal Protestant ethos amenable to progress in the arts and sciences. The wedge driven by the outcry surrounding the appearance of Strauss’s book between the right and left wings of the Hegelian camp made this “center” position increasingly untenable. The policies of Altenstein’s successor were aimed instead at slaying the “dragonseed” of Hegelian pantheism in the universities under Prussian jurisdiction.

By the time Feuerbach published his most famous book, The Essence of Christianity (1841), in which he sought to develop “a philosophy of positive religion or revelation” (WC, 3), he had begun to move away from his earlier idealistic pantheism. That he nevertheless sought in this book to criticize both Hegelian speculative theology and the positive philosophy from “the same standpoint” taken by Spinoza in his Theologico-Political Treatise (VWR, 16/ 9; cf. WC, 10–11) has often been overlooked. At one point in the Treatise Spinoza observes that the biblical authors “imagined God as ruler, legislator, king, merciful, just, etc., despite the fact that all the latter are merely attributes of human nature and far removed from the divine nature” (Spinoza 2007, 63). In Christianity Feuerbach makes a similar distinction between the metaphysical and personal divine predicates. God considered as the theoretical object of rational reflection, or “God as God,” is a timeless and impassible entity that is unaffected by human suffering and ultimately indistinguishable from reason itself. “The consciousness of human nullity that is bound up with consciousness of this being is in no way a religious consciousness; it is much more characteristic of skeptics, materialists, naturalists and pantheists” (WC, 89/ 44). It is God’s personal predicates that concern the religious believer, for whom God exists, not as an object of theoretical contemplation, but of feeling, imagination, and prayerful supplication.

Whereas the metaphysical predicates, which “serve only as external points of support to religion” (WC, 62/25), can be thought of as ones that apply to the first person of the Trinity (i.e. God in his abstract universality), the second person of the Trinity, by virtue of his having subjected himself for the salvation of humanity to a humble birth and an ignominious death, “is the sole, true, first person in religion” (WC, 106/51). The doctrine of the Incarnation, Feuerbach argues against Hegel, is for the Christian believer not a symbolic representation of the eternal procession and return of infinite spirit into, and back from, its finite manifestations, but rather “a tear of divine compassion [Mitleid]” (WC, 102/50), and, as such, the act of a sacred heart that is able to sympathize with human suffering. That God was compelled by his love for humanity to renounce his divinity and become human Feuerbach takes as proof that “Man was already in God, was already God himself, before God became man” (ibid.), i.e., that belief in divine compassion involves the attribution or projection onto God of a moral sentiment that can only be experienced by a being capable of suffering, which “God as God” is not.

The Essence of Christianity is divided into two parts. In the first part Feuerbach considers religion “in its agreement with the human essence” (WC, 75), arguing that, when purportedly theological claims are understood in their proper sense, they are recognized as expressing anthropological, rather than theological, truths. That is, the predicates that religious believers apply to God are predicates that properly apply to the human species-essence of which God is an imaginary representation. In the second part Feuerbach considers religion “in its contradiction with the human essence” (WC, 316), arguing that, when theological claims are understood in the sense in which they are ordinarily taken (i.e. as referring to a non-human divine person), they are self-contradictory.[10] In early 1842 Feuerbach still preferred that his views be presented to the public under the label “anthropotheism” rather than “atheism” (GW, v. 18, 164), emphasizing that his overriding purpose in negating “the false or theological essence of religion” had been to affirm its “true or anthropological essence,” i.e. the divinity of man.

Feuerbach begins The Essence of Christianity by proposing that, since human beings have religion and animals don’t, the key to understanding religion must be directly related to whatever it is that most essentially distinguishes human beings from animals. This, he maintains, is the distinctive kind of consciousness that is involved in the cognition of universals.[11] A being endowed with such “species-consciousness” is able to take its own essential nature as an object of thought. The capacity for thought is conceived here as the capacity to engage in internal dialogue, and thus to be aware of oneself as containing both an I and a Thou (a generic other), so that, in the act of thinking, the human individual stands in a relation to his species in which non-human animals, and human beings qua biological organisms, are incapable of standing. When a human being is conscious of himself as human, he is conscious of himself not only as a thinking being, but also as a willing and a feeling being. “The power of thinking is the light of knowledge [des Erkenntnis], the power of the will is the energy of character, the power of the heart is love” (WC, 31/3). These are not powers that the individual has at his disposal. They are rather powers that manifest themselves psychologically in the form of non-egoistic species-drives (Gattungstriebe) by which individuals periodically find themselves overwhelmed, especially those poets and thinkers in whose works the species-essence is most clearly instantiated. [12] Such manifestations include the experiences of erotic and platonic love; the drive to knowledge; the experience of being moved by the emotion expressed in music; the voice of conscience, which compels us to moderate our desires to avoid infringing on the freedom of others; compassion; admiration; and the urge to overcome our own moral and intellectual limitations. The latter urge, Feuerbach contends, presupposes an awareness that our individual limitations are not limitations of the species-essence, which functions thus as the norm or ideal toward which the individual’s efforts at self-transcendence are directed.

The individual human being is limited both physically and morally. Our physical existence is limited in time and space. We are also limited—and often painfully aware of our being so—in our intellectual and moral capacities. But I only experience as a painful limitation my inability do be and do things that others of my kind are able to be and to do, so that in recognizing my own limitations I simultaneously recognize that they are not limitations of the species. If they were, either I would not be aware of them at all, or I would not experience my awareness of them as painful. For example, I only reprove myself for cowardice because I am aware of the bravery of others, which I myself lack. I only reprove myself for my stinginess because of my awareness of the generosity of others, which I myself lack. The experience of conscience—taken in the broad sense as an awareness of one’s moral and intellectual shortcomings and inadequacies—presupposes species-consciousness in the sense of an awareness of the qualities that one finds oneself lacking but can imagine oneself under other circumstances possessing.

Feuerbach’s central claim in The Essence of Christianity is that religion is an alienated form of human self-consciousness insofar as it involves the relation of human beings to their own essence as though to a being distinct from themselves. Although, in developing this claim, Feuerbach was clearly influenced by Hegel’s account of Unhappy Consciousness in the Phenomenology, Ameriks’ contention that “Feuerbach’s philosophical doctrines […] can be understood as little more than a filling out of the details of Hegel’s scathing account of orthodox Christianity as a form of ‘unhappy consciousness’” (Ameriks 2000, 259) is problematic for several reasons. First, it overlooks the likelihood of Hegel’s having understood his analysis of Unhappy Consciousness to apply to the otherworldliness he associated with medieval Catholicism, or perhaps to otherworldly religion more generally, but not in any case to the type of Protestantism that he regarded as “the religion of the modern age” (Hegel, 1977, 14), and in which he found the sacred and the secular reconciled. Second, it overlooks the fact that Feuerbach’s appropriation of themes found in Hegel’s account of Unhappy Consciousness occurs in the context of an explicit, albeit incomplete, repudiation of Hegel’s philosophy of spirit. Unlike Hegel, who conceives of Unhappy Consciousness as a moment in the development of human self-consciousness that is also a moment in the coming-to-be-for-itself of the absolute, Feuerbach has by this time reached the conclusion that one cannot distinguish absolute spirit from “subjective spirit or the essence of man” without, in the end, continuing to occupy “the old standpoint of theology” (VT, 246–247). Third, it overlooks the significance of Feuerbach’s emphasis on the importance for grasping the essence of religion of precisely those subjective aspects of religious consciousness (imagination and feeling) that Hegel himself regarded as inessential or of secondary importance. Finally, in connection with this third point, it overlooks the significance of Feuerbach’s agreement with Spinoza against Hegel that “faith […] requires not so much truth as piety” (Spinoza 2007, 184).

In a short essay published 1842, in which he sought to clarify the difference between his own approach to the philosophy of religion and Hegel’s, Feuerbach suggested that this difference is most evident in the relations in which each of them stands to Schleiermacher, who famously defined religion as the feeling of utter dependence. Whereas Hegel had “rebuked” Schleiermacher for abdicating the truth-claims of the Christian faith by taking the articles of faith as expressions of this feeling, Feuerbach says he does so only because Schleiermacher was prevented by his “theological prejudice” from drawing the unavoidable conclusion that, “if feeling is subjectively what religion is chiefly about, then God is objectively nothing but the essence of feeling” (B, 230). These comments fail to acknowledge that, in The Essence of Christianity Feuerbach had conceived of God as an alienated projection of the human species-essence, which was said to include not only feeling, but reason and will, as well. They nevertheless reflect Feuerbach’s generally overlooked deployment against Hegel of resources derived from the philosophies of feeling of Schleiermacher and Jacobi,[13] and they indicate the direction in which his thinking about religion continued to move after the publication of The Essence of Christianity, namely, away from an emphasis on species-consciousness conceived along Hegelian lines, and toward what Van Harvey has aptly referred to as the “naturalist-existentialist” themes that predominate in his later writings on religion (cf. Harvey 1995).

5. The “New” Philosophy

In the years following the appearance of The Essence of Christianity Feuerbach published two short philosophical manifestos, the “Preliminary Theses for the Reformation of Philosophy” (1842) and the Principles of the Philosophy of the Future (1843), in which he called for a radical break with the tradition of modern speculative thought. In Principles he locates the origin of this tradition in the Cartesian philosophy, and specifically in “the abstraction from the sensuous [Sinnlichkeit], from matter” (GPZ, 275/ 13) through which the conception of the cogito first arose. Much of the content of Principles consists of a truncated survey of the history of modern philosophy, which purports to trace through a number of dialectical inversions a necessary development from the rationalistic theism of Descartes and Leibniz through the pantheism of Spinoza to the idealism of Kant and Fichte, culminating in Hegel’s philosophy of identity. What this survey is primarily intended to show is that the fundamental tendency of this development has been toward the actualization and humanization of God or, alternatively, toward “the divinization of the real, of the materially existent—of materialism, empiricism, realism, humanism—[and] the negation of theology” (GPZ, 285/ 22). This survey is followed by a short “demonstration” of the historical necessity of the new philosophy, which takes the form of a critique of Hegel, and by the enumeration of several doctrines that distinguish the new philosophy from the old.

Whereas earlier rationalists had conceived of God as being entirely distinct from nature and possessing perfect knowledge untainted by materiality, and had furthermore “placed the effort and labor of abstraction and of self-liberation from the sensuous only in themselves,” Feuerbach notes that Hegel was the first to transform “this subjective activity into the self-activity of the divine being,” so that, like the heroes of pagan antiquity, God (or the Idea) must “fight through virtue for his divinity,” and only comes to be for himself (or itself) at the end of a long and laborious process (GPZ, 296/32). This process, as it is described by Hegel at the end of the Science of Logic, involves the logical Idea “freely releas[ing] itself … [into] the externality of space and time existing absolutely on its own without the moment of subjectivity” (Hegel, 1969, 843). What Feuerbach refers to as “the liberation of the absolute from matter” is achieved as spirit gradually distinguishes itself from nature before attaining to the awareness of itself as absolute. Here, Feuerbach notes, “matter is indeed posited in God, that is, it is posited as God,” and to posit matter as God is to affirm atheism and materialism, but insofar as the self-externalization of the Idea in nature is superseded in the course of the coming-to-be-for-itself of the Idea in the forms of subjective, objective and absolute spirit, this negation of “theology” (i.e. of God conceived as an immaterial being distinct from nature) is negated in turn. Hegel’s philosophy thus represents, for Feuerbach, “the last magnificent attempt to restore Christianity, which was lost and wrecked, through philosophy … by identifying it with the negation of Christianity” (GPZ, 297/34).

Whereas the claim for the identity of thought and being was the cornerstone of the Hegelian philosophy in which Feuerbach finds the “old” philosophy perfected, one of the most characteristic features of the new philosophy is its rejection of this claim. Because the concept of pure being with which Hegel begins the Logic is an abstraction, Feuerbach argues, in the end Hegel succeeds only in reconciling thought with the thought of being, and not with being itself. The new philosophy affirms that being is distinct from, and prior to, thought, and that it is as various as is the panoply of individually existing beings, from which it cannot be intelligibly distinguished. “Thought comes from being, but being does not come from thought” (VT 258/168). To say that something exists in actuality, Feuerbach maintains, is to say that it exists not only as a figment of someone’s imagination, or as a mere determination of their consciousness, but that it exists for itself independently of consciousness. “Being is something in which not only I but also others, above all also the object itself, participate” (GPZ 304/40). In affirming the distinction between being and thought, and that nature exists through itself, independently of thought, the new philosophy also affirms the reality of time and space, and that real existence is finite, determinate, corporeal existence.

The old philosophy conceived of the cogito as “an abstract and merely a thinking being to whose essence the body does not belong” (GPZ, 319–320/ 54). The new philosophy, by contrast, affirms that, as a thinking subject, “I am a real, sensuous being and, indeed, the body in its totality is my ego, my essence itself” (ibid.). Although it remains unclear just what Feuerbach could mean in claiming that “the body in its totality is my ego,” elsewhere he says that to affirm that the ego is corporeal “has no other meaning than that the ego is not only active but also passive … [and that] the passivity of the ego is the activity of the object” in such a way that “the object belongs to the innermost being of the ego” (AP, 150/142). Object and ego are, to use a Heideggerian term, gleichursprunglich or “equiprimordial.” “It is through the body that the ego is not just an ego but also an object. To be embodied is to be in the world; it means to have so many senses, i.e. so many pores and naked surfaces. The body is nothing but the porous ego” (AP 151/143).

If philosophical thought is to avoid remaining “a prisoner of the ego,” Feuerbach insists, it “must begin with its antithesis, with its alter ego” (AP, 146/138). The antithesis of thought is sensation. Whereas in thinking it is the object that is determined by the thinking activity of the subject, in sense experience, he maintains, without much argument and with apparently little concern for the epistemological problems that preoccupied the British empiricists and Kant, the consciousness of the subject is determined by the activity of the object, which functions thus as a subject in its own right. What makes it possible for the ego to posit the object is only that, in positing the object as something distinct from itself, the ego is at the same time posited by the object. If, however, the “the object is not only something posited, but also (to continue in this abstract language) something which itself posits, then it is clear that the presuppositionless ego, which excludes the object from itself and negates it, is only a presupposition of the subjective ego against which the object must protest” (AP, 147/ 139).

It is not to the I, but to the not-I within the I, that real, sensuous objects are given. Memory is what first enables us to transform objects of sense experience into objects of thought, so that what is no longer present to the senses can nevertheless be present to consciousness. In doing so it allows us to transcend the limitations of time and space in thought, and to construct from a multitude of distinct sense experiences a conception of the universe as a whole, and of our relations to the various other beings that exist in it. Feuerbach continues to affirm that, unlike the animals, “man” is a universal, cosmopolitan being, but he now maintains that we need not ascribe to human beings any unique supersensible faculty in order to affirm this truth, since “wherever a sense is elevated above the limits of particularity and its bondage to needs, it is elevated to an independent and theoretical significance and dignity; universal sense is intelligence [Verstand]; universal sensibility, mind [Geistigkeit]” (GPZ 336/69). What distinguishes humans from the animals is not their possession of non-natural powers either of reason or volition, but the fact that human beings are “absolute sensualists” whose powers of observation and recollection extend to the whole of nature.

As Rawidowicz (1964, 113) and Ascheri (1964, 62) have both observed, the break with the speculative tradition that Feuerbach signals in the “Preliminary Theses” and in Principles corresponds to a notable change in his evaluation of religion. In his polemical essays of the late 1830s and in The Essence of Christianity Feuerbach had unfavorably contrasted the “egoistic,” practical standpoint of religion, which he associated with the unrestricted subjectivity of feeling (Gemüt) and imagination (Phantasie), with the theoretical standpoint of philosophy, which he associated with reason and objectivity. At the end of Principles, however, he informs his readers that the new philosophy, without ceasing to be theoretical, nevertheless has a fundamentally practical tendency, and that in this respect it “assumes the place of religion” and “is in truth itself religion” (GPZ, 341/73). This line of thought is developed somewhat further in an unpublished manuscript where Feuerbach observes that, in order to replace religion, philosophy must itself become religion in the sense that “it must, in a way suited to its own nature, incorporate the essence of religion or the advantage that religion possesses over philosophy” (NV, 123/148).

Two short books on religion that Feuerbach published in the years following the appearance of Principles suggest that he took the advantage that religion possesses over the “old” philosophy to consist in its acknowledgement of “the truth and essentiality of sensuousness” (GW, v. 10, 187), and of the importance of corporeal finitude for human psychology. In the foreword to the first volume of his collected works, which appeared in 1846, Feuerbach acknowledged that in The Essence of Christianity his emerging commitment to sensuousness remained wedded to the emphasis on species-consciousness, which, as noted earlier, was characteristic of his early, idealistic pantheism. It was only in the course of further investigations of religion pursued in 1844–45 that Feuerbach felt he had finally been able to break decisively with his Hegelian past.[14] Whereas previously he had summed up his “doctrine” in the slogan “theology is anthropology,” by the end of the 1840s Feuerbach had augmented this slogan to include anthropology “and physiology” (VWR, 28/21). The Essence of Faith According to Luther (1844) and The Essence of Religion (1845) are thus important not only for the changes they represent in Feuerbach’s approach to religion, but also because it was in the course of these investigations that he came to define, to the limited extent that he succeeded in doing so, the terms of the philosophical anthropology with which he hoped to replace the “old” philosophy of spirit.

Feuerbach’s espousal of sensuousness coincides with a movement toward nominalism that is reflected in a shift of emphasis from the human species to the individual human being in his later works on religion. One way that this shift shows itself is in a striking change in Feuerbach’s estimation of egoism. Whereas, in The Essence of Christianity, he had contrasted the egoism and intolerance of faith (which he associated with the false, theological essence of religion) with the altruism and universality love (which he associated with the true, human essence of religion), in the Luther book Feuerbach emphasizes that faith in God is faith in a God who loves human beings, and he now interprets this faith as an indirect form of human self-affirmation. In faith, the believer affirms the existence of, as well as his or her confidence in, the goodness of God, who has promised him or her blessedness or freedom from the painful limitations of mortality. “Only a being who loves man and desires his happiness [Seligkeit] is an object of human worship, of religion” (VWR 71/60). The gods are the objects of worship and the recipients of sacrifice because they are the benefactors of human beings in the specific sense that they are imagined to have it in their power to satisfy fundamental human wishes, including the wish not to die.

In what seems to be a significant departure from, and not simply a supplement to, the theory of religion presented in The Essence of Christianity, where God was interpreted as an imaginary projection of the human species-essence, the central premise of The Essence of Religion is that the subjective ground of religion is the feeling of dependence (Abhängigkeitsgefühl), and that the original object of this feeling is nature, which Feuerbach defines at one point as “the sum of all the sensuous forces, things, and beings that man distinguishes from himself as other than human … [including] light, electricity, magnetism, air, water, fire, earth, animals, plants, [and] man insofar as he acts instinctively [unwillkürlich] and unconsciously” (VWR 104/90).[15] To say that human beings are dependent upon nature is to say, among other things, that nature, which is devoid of consciousness and intention, is what has caused human beings to exist, and that the same physical processes that have produced the human brain have also produced human consciousness. While all organisms are dependent upon nature for their existence, human beings are distinguished from other organisms by the extent of their conscious awareness of this dependence, which Feuerbach finds expressed in the earliest forms of cultic activity, including especially the offering of sacrifice to divine beings associated with various aspects of the natural world. To feel dependent upon something is in some sense to recognize oneself as distinct from that upon which one is dependent. It is in the dawning awareness of their dependence upon nature that human beings first begin to distinguish themselves from nature, without, however, thereby ceasing to be dependent upon it. The feeling of dependence in which religion originates is the feeling “that I am nothing without a not-I which is distinct from me yet intimately related to me, something other, which is at the same time my own being” (VWR, 350).

The concept of the feeling of dependence is closely related to two other concepts that play an equally important role in Feuerbach’s later writings on religion, namely, “human egoism” and the Glückseligkeitstrieb or drive-to-happiness. Feuerbach writes at one point that “the feeling of dependence has led us to egoism as the ultimate hidden ground of religion. … Where there is no egoism, there is also no feeling of dependence” (VWR 91–92/79–80). The conception of egoism with which Feuerbach is working here, however, is peculiar. When he speaks of “human egoism,” he tells us specifically that he is not thinking of the kind of self-interestedness that he takes to be “the hallmark of the Philistine and the bourgeois” (VWR 60/50). He is referring rather to “man’s love for himself, that is, love of the human essence, the love that spurs him on to satisfy and develop all the impulses and tendencies without whose satisfaction and development he neither is nor can be a true, complete human being” (VWR 61/50). This type of self-love, which warrants comparison with, but is not the same as, Rousseau’s amour de soi, encompasses love of one’s fellow human beings, apart from whom one cannot either cultivate or satisfy the ethical, intellectual and aesthetic impulses and capacities in which one’s essential humanity consists, and to whose well-being one’s own is thus inextricably linked.

Among the many issues that remain unclear in Feuerbach’s later writings is what the expression “human essence” can mean for him once he has abandoned the species-ontology of his earlier writings and declared himself a nominalist. That pivotal question aside, it is at least clear that in Principles, and in his later writings on ethics, Feuerbach continues to emphasize the importance of inter-subjectivity and of the I-Thou relationship, but that these are no longer conceived in idealistic terms, as they had been in his earlier writings. Human beings are essentially communal and dialogical beings, both with respect to our cognitive and linguistic capacities, and with respect to the range of moral sentiments we experience toward one another. But the communality in which the human essence is manifested is now said to be one that presupposes a real, “sensible” distinction between I and Thou.

Undoubtedly the central concept in Feuerbach’s last works, which include the essay, “On Spiritualism and Materialism, Especially in Relation to the Freedom of the Will,” and an incomplete essay on ethics, is the concept of the Glückseligkeitstieb or drive-to-happiness. Toward the end of the Preliminary Theses, after affirming that all science must be grounded in nature, and that doctrines not so grounded remain purely “hypothetical,” Feuerbach had gone on to note that this is especially true of the doctrine of freedom, and he had assigned to the new philosophy the task of “naturalizing freedom” (VT 262/172). This is one of the tasks to which he applies himself in “On Spiritualism and Materialism,” where he takes aim at “supernaturalistic” philosophers, among whom he counts Kant, Fichte and Hegel, who ascribe to human beings a noumenal or universal will that is “independent of all natural laws and natural causes and thus of all sensuous motivations [Triebfedern]” (SM, 54). In arguing that it is possible for the will to be determined by the mere form of the moral law, independently of any sensible inclination, Kant had identified the will with pure practical reason. In doing so, Feuerbach argues, he turned the will into a mere abstraction. For Feuerbach it makes no sense to speak of a timeless will devoid of affect directed toward some particular object.

The concepts of drive (Trieb), happiness, sensation and will are closely interrelated in the account of agency that Feuerbach sought to develop in these last writings. Feuerbach regards sensation as the “first condition of willing” (M, 366), since without sensation there is no pain or need or sense of lack against which for the will to strive to assert itself. At one point he defines happiness as the “healthy, normal” state of contentment or wellbeing experienced by an organism that is able to satisfy the needs and drives that are constitutive of its “individual, characteristic nature and life” (M, 366). The drive-to-happiness is a drive toward the overcoming of a multitude of painful limitations by which the finite, corporeal subject is afflicted, which can include “political brutality and despotism” (VWR, 61/50). Every particular drive is a manifestation of the drive-to-happiness, and the different individual drives are named after the different objects in which people seek their happiness (SM, 70). Among the specific drives to which Feuerbach refers in his later writings are the drive-to-self-preservation, the sexual drive, the drive-to-enjoyment, the drive-to-activity and the drive-to-knowledge. Although he does not explicitly associate drives with the unconscious, Feuerbach does anticipate Nietzsche and Freud in regarding the body as the “ground” of both the will and of consciousness (SM, 153), and he emphasizes that action results from the force with which a dominant drive succeeds in subduing other conflicting drives that may reassert themselves under altered circumstances (SM, 91). Feuerbach also occasionally distinguishes between healthy and unhealthy drives, though he has little to say about how these are to be distinguished.

Whereas happiness involves the experience of a sense of contentment on the part of a being that is able to satisfy the drives that are characteristic of its nature, the inability to satisfy these drives results in various forms of discontent, aggravation, pain and frustration. The German word “Widerwille” means disgust or repugnance, but literally it involves not-wanting or, etymologically, “willing against,” and this, Feuerbach contends, is the most rudimentary form of willing. “Every malady (Übel), every unsatisfied drive, every unassuaged longing, every sense of absence [i.e. of a desired object] is an irritating or stimulating injury and negation of the drive-to-happiness innate in each living and sensing being, and the countervailing affirmation of the drive-to-happiness, accompanied by representations and consciousness, is what we call ‘will’” (M, 367). Freedom of the will, as Feuerbach conceives of it here, is freedom from the evils (Übeln) by which my drive-to-happiness is restricted, and is contingent upon the availability to me of the specific means required for overcoming these restrictions.

Another way that Feuerbach seeks to “naturalize freedom” is by developing a naturalistic account of conscience according to which the voice of conscience, which imposes restrictions on my own drive-to-happiness, functions in doing so as the advocate for the drive-to-happiness of “the I apart from me, the sensuous Thou” (SM 80), who has been or stands to be harmed by those actions from which I can have a moral obligation to refrain from performing. Where there is no harm or benefit, Feuerbach contends, there is no criterion for distinguishing right from wrong (SM, 75–76). Feuerbach agrees with Schopenhauer in regarding compassion (Mitleid) as a basic source of moral motivation, but rejects Schopenhauer’s association of compassion with the renunciation of the will to live. The purpose of morality and law is to harmonize the drive-to-happiness of the various individual members of a moral community. “My right is the legal recognition of my own drive-to-happiness, my duty is the drive-to-happiness of the other that demands recognition from me” (SM, 74). The moral will, as Feuerbach conceives of it here, is not a disinterested will. It is rather “that will which seeks to cause no harm because it wishes to suffer no harm” (SM, 80), and has come to identify its own interests with those of others. Because sympathy for the suffering of others presupposes antipathy toward my own suffering, whoever does away with self-interest (i.e. refuses to recognize moral value in actions motivated by self-interest) does away at the same time with compassion (Mitleid).


Primary Sources

References to Feuerbach’s published writings are to the critical edition of his collected works or Gesammelte Werke (hereafter GW) edited by Werner Schuffenhauer, Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1981-. Feuerbach’s writings are cited in the text using the following system of abbreviation. Page numbers refer to the relevant volume of GW as indicated below. In cases where two page numbers are separated by a slash, the second refers to the relevant translation as indicated below. Although I have made use of these translations, in many cases I have preferred to provide my own.

AP “Einige Bemerkungen über den Anfang der Philosophie von D. J. F. Reiff” (1841) = GW, v. 9, 143–153 = “On ‘The Beginning of Philosophy,’” in FB, 135–144.
B “Zur Beurteilung der Schrift Das Wesen des Christentums” (1842) = GW, v. 9, 229–242. No translation available.
FB The Fiery Brook: Selected Writings of Ludwig Feuerbach, trans. with an introduction by Z. Hanfi, Garden City, N.Y., Doubleday, 1972.
GPZ Grundsätze der Philosophie der Zukunft = GW, v. 9, pp. 264–341 = Principles of the Philosophy of the Future, trans. M. Vogel with an intro by T. E. Wartenberg, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1986.
GTU Gedanken über Tod und Unsterblichkeit aus den Papieren eines Denkers (1830), GW, v. 1, pp. 175–515 = Thoughts on Death and Immortality from the Papers of a Thinker, trans. with intro and notes by J. A. Massey, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980.
GW Feuerbach, L. (1981-), Gesammelte Werke, W. Schuffenhauer (ed.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
M “Zur Moralphilosophie” (1868), W. Schuffenhauer (ed.), in Braun, 1994, 353–430. No translation available.
NV “Grundsätze der Philosophie: Notwendigkeit einer Veränderung” (date uncertain), in Feuerbach, 1996, 119–135 = “The Necessity of a Reform of Philosophy,” in FB, 145–152. This unpublished manuscript is not included in any of the volumes of GW that have appeared to date.
SM “Über Spiritualismus und Materialismus, besonders in Beziehung auf die Willensfreiheit” (1866) = GW, v. 11, 53–186. No translation available.
VGP Vorlesungen über die Geschichte der neueren Philosophie, E. Thies (ed.), Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1974. This volume contains notes for lectures on the history of modern philosophy delivered by Feuerbach in Erlangen during the 1835/36 academic year.
VWR Vorlesungen über das Wesen der Religion = GW, v. 6 = Lectures on the Essence of Religion, trans. R. Manheim, New York: Harper & Row, 1967.
VT “Vorläufige Thesen zur Reformation der Philosophie” (1842) = GW, v. 9, 243–263.
WC Das Wesen des Christentums (1841) = GW, v. 5 = The Essence of Christianity, trans. G. Eliot with an intro by K. Barth and a foreword by H. R. Niebuhr, New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1957.
WGL Das Wesen des Glaubens im Sinne Luthers = GW, v. 9, p. 353–412 = The Essence of Faith According to Luther, trans. and with an introduction by M. Cherno, New York: Harper & Row, 1967.

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