#### Supplement to Kant's Theory of Judgment

## Do the Apparent Limitations and Confusions of Kant's Logic Undermine his Theory of Judgment?

From a contemporary point of view, Kant's pure general logic can seem
*limited* in two fundamental ways. First, since his
propositions are all either simple 1-place subject-predicate
propositions or else truth-functional compounds of these, he
apparently ignores relational predicates, the logic of relations, and
the logic of multiple quantification. This is directly reflected in
the fact that the argument-schemata explicitly considered by him in
the *Jäsche Logic* are all either truth-functional,
syllogistic, or based on analytic containment. So his pure general
logic is at most what we would now call a *monadic* logic (see
Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 25), although second-order. Second,
since Kant's list of propositional relations leaves out conjunction,
even his propositional logic of truth-functions is apparently
incomplete. The result of these apparent limitations is that Kant's
logic is significantly weaker than “elementary” logic
(i.e., bivalent first-order propositional and polyadic predicate logic
plus identity) and thus cannot be equivalent to a mathematical logic
in the Frege-Russell sense, which includes both elementary logic and
also quantification over properties, classes, or functions (a.k.a.
“second-order logic”). Indeed, elementary logic and
mathematical logic in the Frege-Russell sense would count as varieties
of *transcendental* logic for Kant, not as pure general
logic.

Again from a contemporary point of view, Kant's logic can also seem
*confused* in at least four basic ways. First, he construes the
so-called “*A*” propositions of the
Aristotelian-Scholastic square of opposition—i.e., universal
affirmative propositions of the form “All *Fs* are
*G*s”—in the Aristotelian manner as carrying
existential commitment in the “*F*” term, and
therefore apparently overlooks the correct interpretation of
“*A*” propositions as non-existentially-committed
material conditionals of the form “For all *x*, if
*F**x* then *G**x*.” Second, he
construes the “if-then” or hypothetical conditional as the
ground-consequence relation, and therefore apparently confuses strict
or formal conditionals (i.e., logically necessary material
conditionals) with material conditionals (according to which “if
*P* then *Q*” is equivalent with
“not-*P* or *Q*”). Third, in his distinction
between negative and infinite judgments he apparently needlessly
distinguishes between a “wide scope” negation of whole
propositions and a “narrow scope” negation of predicates,
thus creating a systematic ambiguity in interpreting propositions of
the form “*Fs* are not *Gs,*” which can then
be construed either as “no *Fs* are *Gs*” or
as “*Fs* are non-*Gs*.” The ambiguity here
is that because Kant assumes existential commitment in the
“*F*” term of universal affirmative propositions,
and because “*Fs* are non-*Gs*” can be
construed a special case of an “*A*” proposition,
then “*Fs* are non-*Gs*” has existential
commitment, whereas “no *Fs* are *Gs*” does
not. Fourth, he construes disjunction as the “exclusive
*or*,” which implies that if “*P* or
*Q*” is true then “*P* and *Q*”
is false, and therefore apparently overlooks the correct
interpretation of disjunction as the “inclusive
*or*,” which implies that the truth of “*P*
or *Q*” is consistent with the truth of “*P*
and *Q*.” So the joint result of these four apparent
confusions is that in this respect Kant's logic is significantly
stronger than elementary logic and Frege-Russell logic alike, and in
fact it is not an extensional logic.

Now it is true that for Kant all judgments are inherently a
priori constrained by pure general logic, and it is also true that
from a contemporary point of view Kant's logic can seem limited and
confused in several fundamental ways. But is this actually a serious
problem for his theory of judgment? No. To see why it is not, notice
that the ascription of limitations and confusions to his logical theory
depends almost entirely on taking a *special* point of view on
the nature of logic, namely the viewpoint of Fregean and Russellian
*logicism*, which posits the reducibility of mathematics (or at
least arithmetic) to some version of second-order logic. This leads to
two Kantian rejoinders. First, while it is quite true that Kant's pure
general logic includes no logic of relations or multiple
quantification, this is precisely because mathematical relations
generally for him are represented spatiotemporally in pure or formal
intuition, and *not* represented logically in the understanding.
In other words, he *does* have a theory of mathematical
relations, but it belongs to transcendental aesthetic, not to pure
general logic. As a consequence of this, true mathematical propositions
for Kant are not truths of logic—which are all analytic truths,
or concept-based truths—but instead are synthetic truths, or
intuition-based truths (see Section 2.2.2). So for
Kant, by the very nature of mathematical truth there can be no such
thing as an authentically “mathematical logic.” And this is
a substantive thesis about logic and mathematics that cannot be simply
dismissed, in view of what we now know to be the very problematic
status of logicism in relation to Russell's paradox, Alonzo Church's
theorem on the undecidability of classical predicate logic, Kurt
Gödel's first incompleteness theorem on the unprovability of
classical predicate logic plus the Peano axioms for arithmetic, Alfred
Tarski's closely related theorem on the indefinability of truth (Boolos
& Jeffrey 1989, ch. 15), Frege's “Caesar” problem about
uniquely identifying the numbers (Frege 1953), Paul Benacerraf's
closely related worry about referential indeterminacy in any attempt to
identify the numbers with objects (Benacerraf 1965), and ongoing
debates about the supposedly analytic definability of the numbers in
second-order logic plus Hume's principle of equinumerosity (Boolos
1998). Second, while it is again quite true that Kant does not include
conjunction in his list of logical constants and that he construes
disjunction as exclusive, it is also true (i) that he is clearly aware
of inclusive disjunction, when he remarks that if we assume the truth
of the ground-consequence conditional, then “whether both of
these propositions are in themselves true remains unsettled
here,” and then immediately distinguishes the “relation of
consequence” from exclusive disjunction (A73/B98–99), and (ii)
that as Augustus De Morgan and Harry Sheffer later showed, conjunction
is systematically definable in terms of negation and inclusive
disjunction (De Morgan), and all possible truth-functions (including of
course exclusive disjunction) can be expressed as functions of a single
truth-function of two propositions involving only negation and
inclusive disjunction (Sheffer). So at least implicitly, Kant's
propositional logic of truth-functions is complete. Third and finally,
while it is yet again quite true that Kant's logic is not extensional,
this is precisely because his logic is an *intensional*
*logic* of non-uniform existential commitments, primitive
modalities, and finegrained conceptual structures. So given Kant's
conception of logic, his list of logical forms will automatically be
in one way much more narrowly restricted (because of his focus on
monadic logic) and in another way automatically much more broadly
inclusive (because of his focus on intensional logic), than those of
elementary logic or second-order logic. But this dual focus also
presents a uniquely Kantian conception of logic that cannot be simply
dismissed, in view of (a) the important fact that amongst the
classical predicate logics monadic logic alone (whether first-order or
second-order) is decidable *and* provable or complete (Boolos
& Jeffrey 1989) (Denyer 1992), which well supports a claim to the
effect that Kant's pure general logic is the “a priori
core” of classical predicate logic, and (b) the equally
important fact of the rigorous development and burgeoning of
intensional logics—and non-classical logics more
generally—since the middle of the 20th century (Priest
2001).