Supplement to Kant's Theory of Judgment

Do the Apparent Limitations and Confusions of Kant's Logic Undermine his Theory of Judgment?

From a contemporary point of view, Kant's pure general logic can seem limited in two fundamental ways. First, since his propositions are all either simple 1-place subject-predicate propositions or else truth-functional compounds of these, he apparently ignores relational predicates, the logic of relations, and the logic of multiple quantification. This is directly reflected in the fact that the argument-schemata explicitly considered by him in the Jäsche Logic are all either truth-functional, syllogistic, or based on analytic containment. So his pure general logic is at most what we would now call a monadic logic (see Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 25), although second-order. Second, since Kant's list of propositional relations leaves out conjunction, even his propositional logic of truth-functions is apparently incomplete. The result of these apparent limitations is that Kant's logic is significantly weaker than “elementary” logic (i.e., bivalent first-order propositional and polyadic predicate logic plus identity) and thus cannot be equivalent to a mathematical logic in the Frege-Russell sense, which includes both elementary logic and also quantification over properties, classes, or functions (a.k.a. “second-order logic”). Indeed, elementary logic and mathematical logic in the Frege-Russell sense would count as varieties of transcendental logic for Kant, not as pure general logic.

Again from a contemporary point of view, Kant's logic can also seem confused in at least four basic ways. First, he construes the so-called “A” propositions of the Aristotelian-Scholastic square of opposition—i.e., universal affirmative propositions of the form “All Fs are Gs”—in the Aristotelian manner as carrying existential commitment in the “F” term, and therefore apparently overlooks the correct interpretation of “A” propositions as non-existentially-committed material conditionals of the form “For all x, if Fx then Gx.” Second, he construes the “if-then” or hypothetical conditional as the ground-consequence relation, and therefore apparently confuses strict or formal conditionals (i.e., logically necessary material conditionals) with material conditionals (according to which “if P then Q” is equivalent with “not-P or Q”). Third, in his distinction between negative and infinite judgments he apparently needlessly distinguishes between a “wide scope” negation of whole propositions and a “narrow scope” negation of predicates, thus creating a systematic ambiguity in interpreting propositions of the form “Fs are not Gs,” which can then be construed either as “no Fs are Gs” or as “Fs are non-Gs.” The ambiguity here is that because Kant assumes existential commitment in the “F” term of universal affirmative propositions, and because “Fs are non-Gs” can be construed a special case of an “A” proposition, then “Fs are non-Gs” has existential commitment, whereas “no Fs are Gs” does not. Fourth, he construes disjunction as the “exclusive or,” which implies that if “P or Q” is true then “P and Q” is false, and therefore apparently overlooks the correct interpretation of disjunction as the “inclusive or,” which implies that the truth of “P or Q” is consistent with the truth of “P and Q.” So the joint result of these four apparent confusions is that in this respect Kant's logic is significantly stronger than elementary logic and Frege-Russell logic alike, and in fact it is not an extensional logic.

Now it is true that for Kant all judgments are inherently a priori constrained by pure general logic, and it is also true that from a contemporary point of view Kant's logic can seem limited and confused in several fundamental ways. But is this actually a serious problem for his theory of judgment? No. To see why it is not, notice that the ascription of limitations and confusions to his logical theory depends almost entirely on taking a special point of view on the nature of logic, namely the viewpoint of Fregean and Russellian logicism, which posits the reducibility of mathematics (or at least arithmetic) to some version of second-order logic. This leads to two Kantian rejoinders. First, while it is quite true that Kant's pure general logic includes no logic of relations or multiple quantification, this is precisely because mathematical relations generally for him are represented spatiotemporally in pure or formal intuition, and not represented logically in the understanding. In other words, he does have a theory of mathematical relations, but it belongs to transcendental aesthetic, not to pure general logic. As a consequence of this, true mathematical propositions for Kant are not truths of logic—which are all analytic truths, or concept-based truths—but instead are synthetic truths, or intuition-based truths (see Section 2.2.2). So for Kant, by the very nature of mathematical truth there can be no such thing as an authentically “mathematical logic.” And this is a substantive thesis about logic and mathematics that cannot be simply dismissed, in view of what we now know to be the very problematic status of logicism in relation to Russell's paradox, Alonzo Church's theorem on the undecidability of classical predicate logic, Kurt Gödel's first incompleteness theorem on the unprovability of classical predicate logic plus the Peano axioms for arithmetic, Alfred Tarski's closely related theorem on the indefinability of truth (Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 15), Frege's “Caesar” problem about uniquely identifying the numbers (Frege 1953), Paul Benacerraf's closely related worry about referential indeterminacy in any attempt to identify the numbers with objects (Benacerraf 1965), and ongoing debates about the supposedly analytic definability of the numbers in second-order logic plus Hume's principle of equinumerosity (Boolos 1998). Second, while it is again quite true that Kant does not include conjunction in his list of logical constants and that he construes disjunction as exclusive, it is also true (i) that he is clearly aware of inclusive disjunction, when he remarks that if we assume the truth of the ground-consequence conditional, then “whether both of these propositions are in themselves true remains unsettled here,” and then immediately distinguishes the “relation of consequence” from exclusive disjunction (A73/B98–99), and (ii) that as Augustus De Morgan and Harry Sheffer later showed, conjunction is systematically definable in terms of negation and inclusive disjunction (De Morgan), and all possible truth-functions (including of course exclusive disjunction) can be expressed as functions of a single truth-function of two propositions involving only negation and inclusive disjunction (Sheffer). So at least implicitly, Kant's propositional logic of truth-functions is complete. Third and finally, while it is yet again quite true that Kant's logic is not extensional, this is precisely because his logic is an intensional logic of non-uniform existential commitments, primitive modalities, and finegrained conceptual structures. So given Kant's conception of logic, his list of logical forms will automatically be in one way much more narrowly restricted (because of his focus on monadic logic) and in another way automatically much more broadly inclusive (because of his focus on intensional logic), than those of elementary logic or second-order logic. But this dual focus also presents a uniquely Kantian conception of logic that cannot be simply dismissed, in view of (a) the important fact that amongst the classical predicate logics monadic logic alone (whether first-order or second-order) is decidable and provable or complete (Boolos & Jeffrey 1989) (Denyer 1992), which well supports a claim to the effect that Kant's pure general logic is the “a priori core” of classical predicate logic, and (b) the equally important fact of the rigorous development and burgeoning of intensional logics—and non-classical logics more generally—since the middle of the 20th century (Priest 2001).

Copyright © 2013 by
Robert Hanna <>

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