Supplement to Kant's Theory of Judgment

Judging, Believing, and Scientific Knowing

As Kant points out in a famous letter to his student Marcus Herz (10: 129–130), the leading question of his Critical philosophy in general and of (what eventually would become) the Critique of Pure Reason in particular is: “what is the ground of the reference of that in us which we call ‘representation’ (‘Vorstellung’) to the object?” In other words: how are objectively valid (and in particular, a priori) mental representations possible? This is the fundamental topic of Kant's “theory of cognition” (Erkenntnistheorie). The theory of cognition in Kant's sense however should not be confused with epistemology or theory of knowledge in the contemporary sense, the special theory of justified true belief (or justified true belief plus X, to allow for the Gettier problem about cognitive-semantic luck) with special reference to skepticism. Thus the first Critique is a treatise in cognitive semantics, not a treatise in epistemology. But within his overarching cognitive-semantic framework, Kant also works out an extremely interesting and important epistemology of judgment.

In this connection, the contrast between Kant's theory of judgment and Frege's theory of judgment is especially relevant. For Frege, propositional contents or thoughts, composed of cognitively significant, non-spatiotemporally existing “senses” (Sinne) that uniquely determine worldly complexes consisting of objects and “concepts,”, i.e., not Kantian concepts, but instead unsaturated n-place functions from objects to truth-values (roughly, real properties and real relations), are somehow “grasped”; and then judgment consists in the rational cognitive subject's advance from the somehow-grasped thought to the truth-value. Hence for Frege, since truth-values occur at the level of the reference or Bedeutung of propositions, and not at the level of their sense, the rational cognitive subject engages with truth or falsity only in the context of assertoric propositional attitudes. But according to Kant, for whom judgment is the cognitive-semantic core of all rational human activity, and for whom episodes of judgment-making are essentially proposition-generating intentional actions (Handlungen)(A69/94), any propositional attitude whatsoever is an instance of “taking-for-true” (das Fürwahrhalten) (A820/B848)(9: 66), and thereby constitutes a determinate way in which the rational cognitive agent directly engages with the truth-value of the judgment.

Taking-for-true, in turn, has three basic kinds: (i) “opining” (Meinen), (ii) “scientific knowing” (Wissen), and (iii)“believing” (Glauben) (A820–831/B848–859). Opining is an epistemic propositional attitude that falls short of “conviction” (Überzeugung), i.e., objective sufficiency for the rational/judging subject, and also falls short of “persuasion” (Überredung), i.e., mere subjective sufficiency for the rational/judging subject. Hence opining includes such subjectively and objectively unconvinced attitudes as entertaining a proposition, fiction, supposition, etc.

Epistemic believing, by contrast, includes subjective sufficiency or persuasion for the rational/judging subject, but also, on its own, falls short of conviction, which includes both subjective sufficiency or persuasion and also objective sufficiency, which itself, in turn, necessarily includes truth in such a way as to rule out any sort of accidental connection between epistemic believing and truth, i.e., cognitive-semantic luck, and for that reason is also called “certainty” (Gewisshheit). Finally, then, scientific knowing is perfected epistemic believing that has achieved conviction, i.e., objective sufficiency or certainty.

Unlike many 20th and 21st century epistemologists, Kant holds that a posteriori scientific knowing or empirical certainty about contingent truths is not only really possible, but also realized, in natural science and everyday experience, and also that a priori scientific knowing or non-empirical certainty about necessary truths is really possible and realized in the exact sciences and philosophy. A priori scientific knowing or non-empirical certainty can be either (i) non-inferential and possessed of an intrinsically compelling cognitive phenomenology, in which case it is rational “insight” (Einsicht), i.e., what Descartes would have called “clear and distinct rational intuition,” or else (ii) inferential, i.e., based on logical demonstration or proof (A783–794/B810–822), although even in this case its status as scientific knowing is ultimately grounded on premises guaranteed by rational insight (Hanna 1998; Hanna 2006, ch. 7). Because Kant distinguishes carefully between (i) the intrinsically compelling phenomenology that is characteristic of rational insight, and (ii) the objective sufficiency of a priori epistemic belief and its corresponding non-accidental or luck-avoiding connection with necessary truth, it follows that factor (i) can obtain even if factor (ii) does not obtain. Hence importantly unlike Descartes and other classical infallibilist Rationalists, but also importantly like recent “moderate” Rationalists, Kant is a fallibilist about rational insight, a.k.a. rational intuition (see, e.g., BonJour 1998).

As several recent Kant-interpreters have correctly pointed out and effectively elaborated, however, believing or Glauben for Kant not only occurs in an epistemic mode, but can also occur in several different non-epistemic modes; hence epistemic believing, as complex and important as it is, must also be placed in the larger context of a Kantian ethics of belief (Stevenson 2003, Chignell 2007a, Chignell 2007b, Kain 2010, Pasternack 2011, Pasternack forthcoming). More precisely, for Kant believing or Glauben divides into four distinct doxic sub-kinds: (a) epistemic (or scientific-knowing-oriented) belief, (b) “doctrinal” (or speculative theoretical) belief, (c) “pragmatic” (or instrumental) belief, and finally (d) “moral” (or ethical) belief, the last of which, in turn, might be most illuminatingly captured in English as ‘believing-in’, although the word Glauben, in this connection, is usually misleadingly translated as ‘faith’.This translation is misleading precisely because ‘faith’ in English can, notoriously, refer to non-rational or even irrational mental states of various kinds; but what Kant means by the notion of moral belief or believing-in is an epistemically objectively insufficient propositional attitude that nevertheless provides full and sufficient practical justification, in relation to a reasons-providing system of moral principles grounded in the Categorical Imperative, for choosing and acting as if, per impossibile, one were also in a position to have epistemic belief and scientific knowledge with respect to some truth-valueless proposition about noumenal objects or noumenal subjects. On the contrary, the closest a rational cognitive subject can get to anything epistemic or scientific about such a proposition is to have “doctrinal” or purely speculative theoretical belief with respect to it, and, as Kant notes, “there is something unstable about merely doctrinal belief [because] one is often put off from it by difficulties that come up in speculation” (A827/B855), i.e., rationally unavoidable dialectical fallacies and contradictions. He then also immediately points out that “it is entirely otherwise in the case of moral belief.... [f]or there it is absolutely necessary that something must happen, namely that I fulfill the moral law in all points” (A828/B856). The most important kinds of moral belief or believing-in are also what Kant calls “postulates of pure practical reason” (5: 122–134), which most notably include the immortality of the soul and the existence of God. In Kant's ethics of belief, the soul's immortality and God's existence (and also, just as significantly, God's non-existence) are propositional targets that are impossible-to-believe-epistemically and also impossible-to-know-scientifically, yet at the same time they specify certain morally obligatory ways of living one's life as a rational human agent.

Therefore, when Kant famously writes in the B Preface to the Critique of Pure Reason that “I had to deny Wissen in order to make room for Glauben” (Bxxx), contrary to what is often taken to be his meaning, what he is actually saying is that he had to restrict the scope of epistemic belief and scientific knowing, by means of his Critical epistemology and transcendental idealist metaphysics, in order to make room for fully and sufficiently practically justified moral belief or believing-in. This is also known as Kant's doctrine of the primacy of the practical. In this way, moral belief philosophically trumps epistemic belief (including the exact sciences) and also doctrinal belief (including any kind of speculative metaphysics). But at the same time, the rational ground of this philosophically basic propositional attitude is the judgment, and in that sense Kant's theory of judgment also grounds his meta-philosophy.

Copyright © 2013 by
Robert Hanna <>

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