Notes to Intergenerational Justice

1. In the following I will speak of moral rights rather than legitimate claims, but nothing hinges on this as long as it is understood that having a legitimate claim implies another person or persons standing under the correlative duty to respond to the claim.

2. See, for example, Birnbacher (1988), 140–72, 175–79; Jonas’ notion of a “Heuristik der Furcht” (heuristics of fear) in (1979), 63–64. Another issue is whether we have reasons to discount the future in the sense of discounting future persons’ well-being. See, for example, Cowen and Parfit (1992); Broome (1994).

3. Partly due to these features as well as the unchangeable asymmetry in power-relations between currently living people and remote future generations, currently living people’s compliance with their obligations to remote future people is likely to be less reliable. See Birnbacher (2008).

4. See Section 4 for a sufficientarian interpretation of future people’s welfare rights vis-à-vis currently living people.

5. See Heyd (1992), chs. 1 and 4. Whether future people can be said to and have a right to non-existence under certain circumstances is the central issue of “wrongful life” cases, which are to be distinguished from both “wrongful birth” and “wrongful pregnancy” cases. The latter two concern interests of parents in not giving birth to a defective child and in not having an unwanted pregnancy, respectively. “Wrongful life” cases concern the interests of children in not being brought into existence under certain circumstances.

6. On how to understand the relevant threshold see Section 4 below. To define such a threshold we do not have to compare the value of such a life with the value of non-existence (see nn. 16–17 and accompanying text).

7. It is beyond the scope of the entry to work out an interpretation of harm that specifies the necessary and sufficient conditions for wrongful harming. See Feinberg (n. 18 below).

8. Parfit (1984), part iv, and especially ch. 17.; see the contributions in Ryberg and Tännsjö (2004); entry on the repugnant conclusion).

9. It is worth pointing out that there are, plausibly, at least some future persons whose existence and identity is altogether independent of our actions (although this claim may be implausible in the case of public policy choices). For example, somebody now set a booby-trap that would cause harm to some future persons. Performing the action may harm the bodily integrity of future people who will live quite independently of his having performed the action and thus the contingency of future persons’ existence on present actions can in no way exempt this particular action from moral condemnation. Many contributions on what we owe to future people concentrate on what Parfit calls “same people choices” ((1984), 355–56), i.e., such decision-situations in which we assume that future people’s existence, identity and number are not contingent upon our decisions.

10. For the distinctions see Parfit (1984), 487–90; Woodward (1986), 818; Morreim (1988), 23; Fishkin (1991); Fishkin (1992), 63–64; Shiffrin (1999). For the wording of these notions of harm see Pogge (2003).

11. For a defense of the view that certain types of inactions, namely omissions, can be harmful see, e.g., Feinberg (1984), ch. 4 and Birnbacher (1995), chs. 3–5.

12. The formulation may be misleading in suggesting that by t2 we refer to a moment of a person’s life. Rather, the notions of harm as distinguished in this entry should be understood to allow for differing interpretations of the relevant unit of well-being (e.g., the life of the affected person as a whole or future periods of her life). For discussions of how to interpret and measure the well-being of people see Griffin (1986), part i; Hurka (1993), ch. 6; Scanlon (1998), ch. 3.

13. “Acted with respect to this person” is meant to include the act that causes this person’s existence. It is difficult to interpret such acts as interactions. We prefer “had we not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all” to David Gauthier’s “in our absence” (Gauthier (1986), 203–05). Both formulations are problematic and it is beyond the scope of this entry to discuss their respective problems at length. Gauthier himself points out that his formulation runs into difficulty in dealing with situations in which a person has assumed a certain social role, e.g., the role of a life-guard that is, in part, defined by positive duties vis-à-vis others. If a person assumes such a role her “absence” in a situation where she is duty-bound to intervene can render the situation of others worse (ibid., 205). For the formulation we prefer it seems plausible to suggest that assuming such a role does constitute an “interaction” of the then duty-bound person with those to whom she is bound where fulfilling the duties of her role is concerned.

14. See Roberts (1998).—A probabilistic and a necessarian reading of future people’s contingency upon our actions can be distinguished (see Parfit’s “Time-Dependence Claim” ((1984), 351–52) and, thus, of the scope of the non-identity problem. According to the necessarian reading it matters that the same person or people could have existed had we not carried out the act or policy. Whether it is in fact likely or unlikely to have happened does not matter. According to the probabilistic reading, if it was extremely unlikely and the probability was close to zero, it is reasonable to hold that the same person would not have existed. The latter view can be attributed to Parfit ((1984), 352). For discussion whether it normatively matters that genetically identical people can be brought about by different acts and under different circumstances, see Simmons (1995), 178–79; Roberts (1998), sects. 3.4 and 3.5.; Gosseries (2004), ch. ii.

15. This is why this type of notion of harm is also called identity-independent. See Fishkin (1991); Fishkin (1992), 63–64.

16. This is assuming that to compare an existing person’s current state of well-being with the state of this person had the person not been conceived is to compare an existing person’s current state with this person’s “never existing”.

17. How to compare the value of prenatal nonexistence with death for a living person is a different issue. See Kamm (1993), 36; Raz (2001), 90–92.

18. Feinberg (1984), 102, suggests that the inapplicability of notion (II) precludes “criminal liability for ‘wrongful conception’”. According to Feinberg, in the context of the criminal law “harming someone” should presuppose worsening a person’s condition, i.e. setting back a person’s interests. Thus, Feinberg does not consider our notion (III) a notion of harm to be applied in delineating criminal liability. However, in his analysis the afflicted child in wrongful life cases was “wronged” (ibid. and 34–35) by having been deprived of his “birth rights” (ibid., 99) and “the wrongful progenitors … should … be held civilly liable to pay damages to the child” (ibid., 102). Feinberg (1990), 327, proposes “a clear categorical exception” to his (liberal) interpretation of the criminal law for “malicious or reckless conceptions”, i.e., cases in which a child is “born with a serious and permanent impairment—though not one that is so serious that the child would prefer even nonexistence to it—” (325) and the parents could have easily avoided having a child in an impaired condition. Feinberg suggests that such cases “can in principle be legitimately proscribed by the criminal law even though they harm no one in the sense required by the harm principle.” (327) See ibid., 27–33.

19. This is a variation of Derek Parfit’s example of “The 14–Year-Old Girl”. See Parfit (1984), 358, 364.

20. See Parfit’s “same number quality claim” (principle Q) in Parfit (1984), 360; Kavka (1982), 98–99.

21. See notes 16–18 and accompanying text.

22. Even if one accepted the subjunctive-different-person understanding of harm (IV) for same number cases, this would not provide a solution in the different number cases. See Parfit (1984), part iv.

23. Further, only if this person would not be in the harmed state had the agent not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all; and furthermore, if the agent cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, does not minimize the harm (see the threshold notion of harm as introduced above in Section 3.1).

As indicated below (in Section 4. and, in particular, in 4.3) if the agent cannot avoid causing sub-threshold harm he or she should minimize the harm in accordance with a prioritarian assessment of the alternative options open to the agent.

24. Please note three points: First, in describing the disjunctive notion it is superfluous to consider the diachronic notion (I). When the subjunctive-historical notion (II) is applicable, notion (I) is applicable as well; the diachronic notion (I) is applicable when counterfactual considerations play no role in the application of notion (II).

Second, not only our (IV) as stated above fulfills this requirement. Any disjunctive notion that entails notion of harm at (III) as a necessary condition for causing harm will fulfill this requirement. Thomas Pogge suggested to me an understanding of the disjunctive notion that gives priority to the subjunctive-historical notion of harm: (IV*) Having acted in a certain way (or having forborne from acting in that way) at a time t1, we thereby harm someone only if either (II) we cause this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person would have been at t2 had we not interacted with this person at all; or this test is inapplicable and (III) we cause this person to be in a sub-threshold state of well-being, and, if we cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, do not minimize the harm. For discussion see nn. 25 and 28.

Third, it is worth pointing out that there are other reasons for preferring the disjunctive over the single notion. The disjunctive notion is compatible with the central understanding of harm and compensation as these notions are normally understood in tort law. In cases which do not involve the non-identity problem and in which the harmful act reduces the well-being of the victim to a level that is still above the threshold, the comparative notion of harm provides the relevant standard for restitution and compensation.

25. According to (IV*) (see n. 24) only one set of conditions (as specified by each reading of harm) can obtain. (IV*) might also imply that it makes a moral difference which test we cancel: It might well make a moral difference which reason we have for objecting to cancel either test. However, (IV*) will not give us two reasons for objecting to canceling pregnancy testing. Thus, we could not interpret the supposed difference in terms of there being two reasons for objecting to canceling the pregnancy testing and just one reason for objecting to canceling preconception testing.

26. It is assumed here that in the context of taking a decision on whether or not to treat the fetuses, the fetuses are actual future people (see Section 2). In other words, the treatment of the fetuses will not have compositional effects as might be induced by post-conception genetic interventions. For the feasibility of such post-conception genetic therapy and surgery and their implications for interpreting wrongful life claims, see Buchanan, Brock, Daniels, and Wikler (2000), 6 and ch. 6. If pregnancy testing leads to post-conception intervention that has compositional effects, Parfit’s two medical programs become indistinguishable with respect to the applicability of the comparative notion of harm.

27. For the distinction between and a discussion of these two versions of the No-Difference View, see Woodward (1986), sects. II and III; Parfit, (1986), 856–59.

28. Note that (IV*) (see n. 24) is also incompatible with the theoretical reading of the No-Difference View: According to (IV*) we have different (but not additional) reasons for objecting to the harming of actual people.

29. Whether we wrongfully inflict non-comparative harms on a person by causing this person’s existence is often considered a special case for which a particularly low threshold is relevant: we cause such harm by bringing a person to existence only if this person’s postnatal potential of development and his life span are drastically reduced (Kavka (1982), 105–06) and especially so if the person experiences pain (Harris (1991), 65–66; Schöne-Seifert and Krüger (1993), 257–58; Merkel (2001)). However, Shiffrin (1999) suggests that causing people to exist is prima facie objectionable regardless of the particular identity of the person (and for a similar view see Benatar (2006)): Since causing someone to exist always causes the person to have interests that will be frustrated and since the frustration of some of these interests is attributable to the act that caused the person’s existence, causing a person to exist always inflicts some non-comparative harms. In her understanding this is objectionable because the person cannot consent and these harms are not necessary to prevent a greater harm. If this is to violate the person’s right and this fact cannot be outweighed or justified by the goods that the person is also caused to have, then it is objectionable to have caused the person to exist.

30. This would be the case since equality is of intrinsic value. For discussion see Marmor (2003); Steiner (2003); and Raz’s response (2003). See also Gosepath (2004), 454–63; Holtug and Lippert-Rasmussen (2007) and the entry on equality)

31. The so-called leveling-down objection is the best known objection to monistic value egalitarianism. For a recent analysis and discussion, see Lippert-Rasmussen (2007). A monistic value egalitarianism will also have unacceptable implications when applied to contemporaries: the state of affairs in which all have lives barely worth living is to be preferred to in which all have good or very good lives but some are better off than others.

32. See Section 4.4 below on Rawls’ savings principle. Rawls (2001), 159, proposes a duty to save positively “to make possible the conditions needed to establish and to preserve a just basic structure over time.”

33. Compare, penultimate paragraph of subsection 4.2. This can be an implication of both the priority view and the position of weak sufficientarianism even if the number of people to be considered is fixed; thus, it can arise in situations involving contemporaries only, as noted by Casal for the priority view in her (2007), 319–20; and see Mulgan (2006), 66–79.

34. The most promising approach for justifying a priority threshold can be seen in relying upon the distinction between needs and (mere) wishes. Here a short sketch of the argument may suffice (see also Benbaji (2005), 324–326): If person X has the need for something (needs something) that person Y wishes to have but does not need, then, prima facie, we ought to fulfil the needs of person X. But how do we distinguish between needs and mere wishes? Whether a need deserves the moral priority as indicated depends entirely upon whether the needy person would be not well off if the need in question were not fulfilled. Thus, an interpretation of the moral significance of needs suggests the commitment to a morally privileged priority line of well-being. If person X has the need for something that person Y wishes to have but does not need—in the sense that person X would not be well off if his need were not fulfilled but person Y would still be well off if his wish were not fulfilled—, then fulfilling the need of person X is prima facie more important than fulfilling the wish of Y. Of course, we would have to defend the argument as sketched against a good number of objections. Additionally, we would have to show that the argument would justify a substantial threshold that has absolute priority.

35. On the notion of well-ordered (liberal) societies, see Rawls (2001), 8–9, and Rawls (1999), part I.—It is a different matter whether the oft-cited reasons for a sufficientarian understanding of global justice (see entry on international distributive justice) are relevant to an understanding of intergenerational relations and whether they, in fact, speak more strongly on behalf of an sufficientarian conception of intergenerational relations than on behalf of such a conception of international relations.

36. But see Rawls (rev. edition 1999), 140–41. Rawls already alludes to a sufficientarian understanding by claiming not only that the parties of the original position would rationally prefer average utility over the classical (sum-maximizing) principle but would “agree to some sort of floor to hold up average welfare” (ibid., 141).

37. Rawls (1971), 291. For a critique of this claim see Gosseries (2001), 318–19. For a critique of Rawls’s related claim, namely, that the difference principle is inapplicable in the transnational context (Rawls (1999), 113–20), see Pogge, (1994), especially 211–14.

38. Rawls (1993), 274, fn. 12. For criticisms of his proposal in (1971), see Hubin (1976/77), 70–83; English, (1977), 91–104; Heyd (1992), 41–51.

39. Rawls does not discuss the question of whether, and in what ways, the just savings principle might be sensitive to the number of people who will live in the future—however, how many people will live in the future seems clearly to matter for determining how much we should save. See Heyd (1992), 47; Dasgupta (1994); Casal and Williams (1995); Barry (1999), 107–11; Gosseries (2001), 330–33. The just savings principle could indirectly be sensitive to the number of future people: it would at the very least be unjust to choose those further futures in which more people exist than there are resources for just institutions. By not discussing the relevance of the number of future people for the specification of the just savings rate, Rawls might best be understood to have bracketed the non-identity problem. Nor has Rawls addressed the question of how we should respond to the impact of past generations’ not having saved at just rates. See Dasgupta (1994), 107–08.

40. See n. 29 above.

41. However, this will depend upon the substantive content of the conception of non-comparative harm. One can hold the view that currently living people’s concerns for the well-being of actual future people are fully captured by the substantive content of the conception of non-comparative harm. But see Section 4.

42. I do not exclude the possibility of people standing under some obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of actual (presently living or future) people. Also, admittedly, it is hard to imagine that we could ever be in a position in which we relate to future life on earth simply as a matter of our procreational choice without there being interests of actual future people to be taken into account. One reason is that to date in many, if not most cases procreation is not the consequence of choice.

43. For the claims of descendants of slaves in the USA see, for example, Bedau (1972); Boxill (1992); Brooks (1999), parts 6 and 7; Soyinka (1999), 44–69; Fullinwider (2000); Lyons (2004b); Miller and Kumar (2007). For an analysis of the relevance of historical injustice for claims of groups to political self-determination or autonomy see, for example, Buchanan (1991); Brilmayer (1991); Thompson (1990); Kymlicka (1999); Gans (2001); Miller and Kumar (2007).

44. People can be harmed by events, say, by a natural catastrophe. The following reasoning applies when such an event occurs before the person who makes the claim to being compensated owing to the event comes into existence.

45. We cannot rely on the diachronic notion at (II) either. It presupposes that we can attribute a state of well-being to the descendant at the time his or her ancestors are being wronged. However, currently living African Americans might well have just claims to compensation based on the subjunctive-historical notion of harm because harm done to them or to their more recent ancestors. See Lyons’ analysis of continuing discrimination against African Americans in Lyons (2004a).

46. The relevance and importance of the forward-looking assessment of the normative significance of past wrongs has been stressed by, for example, Lyons (1977); Waldron (1992b); Ackerman (1992), 72–73; Ackerman (1997). For a theory of justice that grounds our obligations in backward-looking reasoning see Nozick ((1974), 152–53). The theory relies upon counterfactual reasoning. For critique see Lyons (1977); Sher (1981); Waldron (1992b). For epistemic reasons only, Nozick proposes Rawls’s difference principle—a forward-looking principle, specifying what the future should be like—as a “rough rule of thumb for rectifying” historical injustice ((1974), 231). This idea does not address the problem of the inapplicability of a non-comparative notion of harm as discussed in the text. For alternative impersonal interpretations of how the past matters normatively, see Vallentyne (1988); Hill (1990/91); Feldman (1997), chs. 1, 4.

47. Assuming we could know what that state would be. See Sher (1981).

48. Here we are not concerned with pragmatic reasons for, e.g., the statutes of limitations and the doctrine of adverse possession. See Marmor (2004), 326–29.

49. Or, as Lyons puts it in (1977), 370: “property rights themselves, and not just their exercise or contents, are relative to circumstances”.

50. See Waldron (1992b), 24; Waldron (2004), 67–71. The supersession thesis concerns the ongoing effect of past injustices only. Claiming that injustices are superseded implies neither that the past unjust violations of rights were not unjust nor that they should no longer be considered unjust. Even if certain injustices are superseded, we may well stand under obligations to publicly acknowledge the wrongs committed and to provide, say, symbolic reparations toward the victims. See sects. 5.3 and 5.4 below.

52. “Das vergangene Unrecht ist geschehen und abgeschlossen. Die Erschlagenen sind wirklich erschlagen.” In a letter to Walter Benjamin 1937, as quoted in Tiedemann (1983), 107.

53. Partridge (1981a), 259–61, discusses the example of Alfred Nobel and defends a rule-utilitarian reading of death-bed promises.

54. For a comparison of the memorials for the victims of the Shoa in Poland, Germany and Israel, see Young (1989), 1799–811. See Winter (1995) for an interpretation of the memorials of the First World War. Of course, public commemorations may be put to the use of (re-)affirming values that differ from the values that many people participating in the acts of symbolic compensation may wish to express. See, e.g., Scarre (2014).

55. Anderson (1993) provides a theory of expressive reasoning and the relation between expressive reasoning and consequentialist reasoning.

56. “Never again!”—which is also the title of the reports of the Argentine (1984) truth commission, of the report that was secretly prepared in Brazil (1985) as well as of the Uruguayan report of non-governmental organizations (1989). See Nino (1996), 78–82; Weschler (1990), part i, and 235.

57. For example, the Roma (Gypsies) were victims of a racially motivated genocide committed by the Nazis—a truth that has been long denied with the result that most surviving victims as well as the descendants of those murdered were excluded from compensation and restitution.

58. See, e.g., Thompson (2002) who discusses the reasons for attributing such an obligation to current members of ongoing political societies (e.g., states) whose previous members committed egregious wrongs in the name of the society and with harmful consequences for currently living people.

Copyright © 2015 by
Lukas Meyer <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.