Notes to Foundationalist Theories of Epistemic Justification

1. Foundational knowledge or justified belief has also been called by foundationalists direct knowledge (justification), immediate knowledge, intuitive knowledge (justification); and the truths known have been referred to as self-evident truths, directly evident truths, self-presenting truths, and the given. This last locution “the given” is, however, ambiguous as between truths that are said to be known directly and facts or features of the world that are said to be immediately “before” consciousness.

2. For present purposes let us construe entailment broadly so that P may be said to entail Q if P formally, analytically or synthetically entails Q.

3. See, for example, Russell (1910–11) and 1913.

4. For a more detailed account and defense of an acquaintance theory of noninferential justification see Fumerton (1995). BonJour, once one of the leading coherence theorists of empirical justification, has recently moved to a version of the acquaintance theory of justification. See BonJour (2000).

5. For a further elaboration of such a view see Fumerton (1995).

6. For an excellent discussion of this issue see Russell (1948).

7. For a detailed discussion of alternative ways of defining the internalism/externalism controversy, see Fumerton (1995), Chapters 3 and 4.

8. Most of what I say here is based on the early seminal paper “What is Justified Belief.” Goldman's view changed quite dramatically in his book Epistemology and Cognition, but shortly after publishing the book he returned to the earlier account for at least one conception of justification (strong justification). See Goldman (1988).

9. We shall not concern ourselves with the difficulties that reliabilists face defining the relevant notion of reliability—as these few remarks might indicate, reliabilists will inevitably move beyond actual frequencies and turn to propensities or counterfactuals in defining the concept of a reliable belief-producing process.

10. For technical reasons, it might, perhaps, be better to require that the conjunction of the propositions believed must itself be the object of a justified belief.

11. See, for example, Armstrong's (1973) account of direct knowledge. Though more complicated that a causal theory of knowledge, Nozick's (1981) “tracking” account of knowledge also allows a distinction between beliefs which noninferentially track facts and beliefs which inferentially track facts.

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Richard Fumerton <>

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