Hume on Free Will
But to proceed in this reconciling project with regard to the question of liberty and necessity; the most contentious question of metaphysics, the most contentious science… —David Hume (EU, 8.23/95)
David Hume is widely recognized as providing the most influential statement of the “compatibilist” position in the free will debate — the view that freedom and moral responsibility can be reconciled with (causal) determinism. The arguments that Hume advances on this subject are found primarily in the sections titled “Of liberty and necessity”, as first presented in A Treatise of Human Nature (2.3.1–2) and, later, in a slightly amended form, in the Enquiry concerning Human Understanding (sec. 8). Although there is considerable overlap in content between these two statements of Hume's position, there are also some significant differences. This includes, for example, some substantial additions in the Enquiry discussion as it relates to problems of religion, such as predestination and divine foreknowledge. While these differences are certainly significant they should not be exaggerated. Hume's basic strategy and compatibilist commitments in both works remain the same in their essentials
It has become common practice to treat the two sections “Of liberty and necessity” as self-standing contributions that can be fully understood more or less in isolation from Hume's philosophical commitments and principles as found outside these sections. (Many anthologies present one or other of these sections as complete statements of Hume's position on this subject.) There is, nevertheless, an intimate and complex relationship between what Hume has to say in the sections “Of liberty and necessity” and his moral psychology and philosophical system as a whole. Neglect of these features has led to some serious misunderstanding concerning the character and content of Hume's compatibilism. Having said this, it is equally important to acknowledge that the established or “classical” interpretation of Hume's views on this subject has served as the foundation for the subsequent development of compatibilist strategy over the past two centuries — especially as found in various prominent representatives of the 20th century empiricist tradition (e.g., Ayer, Schlick, et al.).
This article will be arranged around a basic contrast between two alternative interpretations of Hume's compatibilist strategy: the “classical” and “naturalistic” interpretations. According to the classical account, Hume's effort to articulate the conditions of moral responsibility, and the way they relate to the free will problem, should be understood primarily in terms of his views about the logic of our concepts of “liberty” and “necessity”. Free and responsible action, it is said, must be caused by the agent. There is, therefore, no incompatibility between free will and determinism. On the contrary, free and responsible action (logically) requires causal necessity. So interpreted, Hume's arguments involve (a priori) observations about the logical relations that hold between the key concepts involved in this dispute. In contrast with this, the naturalistic approach maintains that what is essential to Hume's account of the nature and conditions of responsible conduct is his description of the role that moral sentiment plays in this sphere. That is to say, it is one of Hume's primary objectives to describe the circumstances in which people are felt to be responsible. When we read Hume's arguments in these terms, not only does this alter the way we understand his general theory of responsibility, it also changes the way that we interpret his core arguments relating specifically to the free will debate (i.e. as presented in the two sections titled “Of liberty and necessity”). This contrast between the classical and naturalistic interpretations is of fundamental importance not only for our general understanding of Hume's philosophical system but also for any adequate assessment of the contemporary value and relevance of his views on this subject. In the final section of this article I consider the way in which Hume's discussion of free will relates to his wider and more general irreligious philosophical intentions, as presented throughout his philosophy
- 1. Two Kinds of “Liberty”: The Basics of the Classical Interpretation
- 2. Hume's “New Light”: Necessity Without Force
- 3. The Naturalism of Hume's “Reconciling Project”
- 4. Hume's Naturalism and Strawson's “Reconciling Project”
- 5. Voluntarism and “the Morality System”
- 6. Moral Sense and Moral Capacity
- 7. Free Will and Hume's Philosophy of Irreligion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Lying at the heart of Hume's compatibilism are three conclusions that constitute the core of his compatibilist position on this subject as generally understood:
- Actions that are subject to moral evaluation are not distinguished from those that are not by an absence of cause but rather by a different type of cause. Responsible or morally free actions are caused by our own willings, whereas unfree actions are brought about by causes external to the agent. Let us call the argument that seeks to establish this conclusion the “spontaneity argument”
- A liberty which means “a negation of necessity and causes” (T, 22.214.171.124/407) has no existence and would make morality impossible. Let us call the argument which seeks to establish this conclusion the “antilibertarian argument”.
- Necessity, properly understood, is the constant conjunction of objects and the inference of the mind from one object to the other (T, 126.96.36.199/400; EU, 8.5/82). Let us call the argument which seeks to establish this conclusion the “necessity argument”.
Taken together these three arguments serve as the basis of Hume's compatibilist strategy. All three arguments appear in some relevant form in both the Treatise and Enquiry in the sections “Of liberty and necessity”. The spontaneity and antilibertarian arguments serve to distinguish two rival views of moral freedom, providing a defence of one and a refutation of the other. These two arguments may be referred to jointly as the “liberty arguments”. A number of commentators take the view that the “liberty arguments” constitute the main thread of Hume's compatibilist strategy (Stroud, 1977: 144–6). Let us begin, therefore, with Hume's views on “liberty”.
In the Treatise Hume draws a fundamental distinction between two kinds of liberty.
Few are capable of distinguishing betwixt the liberty of spontaneity, as it is call'd in the schools, and the liberty of indifference; betwixt that which is oppos'd to violence, and that which means a negation of necessity and causes. The first is even the most common sense of the word; and as ‘tis only that species of liberty, which it concerns us to preserve, our thoughts have been principally turn'd towards it, and have almost universally confounded it with the other. (T, 188.8.131.52/407–8)
Hume's key point here is that free actions are those that are caused by the agent's willings and desires. We hold an agent responsible because it was his desires or willings that were the determining causes of the action in question. Action caused in this way is voluntary and involuntary when caused in some other way. There is, therefore, no incompatibility between an action being causally necessitated and it being a free action for which the agent is responsible. On the contrary, morally free and responsible action requires that an agent caused his actions through his willings. If an action is the result of “violence” or constraint of some kind, then, although it may be necessitated or caused, it is not the result of the agent's will, and so cannot be attributed to him (T, 184.108.40.206/411). In these circumstances, the agent is forced or compelled to act, and, therefore, he is not responsible for his actions. In short, the spontaneity argument seeks to establish that free action is to be distinguished from unfree action not by the absence of cause (as is suggested by conceptions of liberty of indifference) but rather by a different type of cause.
Hume's account of liberty is complicated by his related but distinct definition of “liberty” in the Enquiry. In this context he drops his distinction between liberty of “spontaneity” and “indifference” and offers the following in its place:
By liberty, then we can only mean a power of acting or not acting, according to the determinations of the will; that is, if we choose to remain at rest, we may; if we choose to move, we also may. Now this hypothetical liberty is universally allowed to belong to every one who is not a prisoner and in chains. (EU, 8.23 /95)
Although this definition of “hypothetical liberty” also serves Hume's compatibilist purposes, it is not exactly the same as “liberty of spontaneity”. More specifically, a person may enjoy “liberty of spontaneity” but still lack “hypothetical liberty”. (For example, while you may choose to remain in a room rather than leave it, it may still be the case that if you chose to leave you could not because the door is locked.) Clearly, then, liberty of spontaneity does not always secure hypothetical liberty. The particular importance of this distinction for the free will debate is that “hypothetical liberty” provides compatibilism with a (plausible) account of alternate possibilities — something that is generally assumed we need for any acceptable theory of moral freedom and responsibility.
Hume's antilibertarian argument draws on, or develops out of, several of the basic features of the spontaneity argument. The antilibertarian argument purports to have found a fatal flaw in the libertarian position. Liberty of indifference, as we have noted, is “that which means a negation of necessity and causes”. Such a libertarian view holds that it is a necessary condition of moral responsibility that the act was not necessitated or caused. But such a freedom, claims Hume, is nothing on which moral responsibility could rest. If one removes necessity from actions, then one thereby removes causes as well, and this “is the very same thing with chance” (T, 220.127.116.11/407; cf. EU, 8.25/96 and T, 18.104.22.168/171). It seems clear that we cannot hold someone responsible for an action which just happened, an action he contributed nothing to. Where actions “proceed not from some cause in the character and disposition of the person who performed them”, says Hume, “they can neither redound to his honour, if good, nor infamy, if evil” (EU, 8.29/98; cp. T, 22.214.171.124/411). For the libertarian, therefore, there is a serious difficulty in giving a plausible account of the mechanism or source of responsibility.
According to the classical interpretation, these two arguments (i.e. the liberty arguments) are principally concerned with the logic of our concepts of moral freedom and responsibility. Hume is understood to be claiming that it would be illogical to say that an agent did not cause this action but that it is free and the agent is responsible for it. It is, therefore, illogical to say that either an uncaused action or an action that is caused by factors external to the agent is an action for which the agent may be justly held responsible. Granted that a responsible action must be determined by the will of the agent, it is unreasonable to hold an agent responsible for actions that are due to indifference or external violence. This account of the liberty arguments serves as the foundation of the classical interpretation of Hume's compatibilist strategy.
There are a number of well-known incompatibilist objections to the spontaneity argument. The first and most obvious is that “liberty of spontaneity” is a wholly inadequate conception of moral freedom. Kant, famously, describes this account of moral freedom as a “wretched subterfuge” and suggests that a freedom of this kind belongs to a clock that moves its hands by means of internal causes. If our will is itself determined by antecedent natural causes, then we are no more accountable for our actions than any other mechanical object whose movements are internally conditioned. Individuals who enjoy nothing more than a liberty of this nature are, the incompatibilist claims, little more than “robots” or “puppets” subject to the play of fate. This general line of criticism against the spontaneity argument leads directly to two further important criticisms.
The incompatibilist maintains that if our willings and choices are themselves determined by antecedent causes then we could never choose otherwise than we do. Given the antecedent causal conditions, we must always act as we do. We cannot, therefore, be held responsible for our conduct since, on this account, we have no “genuine alternatives” or “open possibilities” available to us. Moreover, incompatibilists do not accept that Hume's notion of “hypothetical liberty”, as presented in the Enquiry, can deal with this objection. It is true, of course, that hypothetical liberty leaves room for the truth of conditionals that suggest that we could have acted otherwise if we had chosen to do so. However, it still remains the case, the incompatibilist argues, that the agent could not have chosen otherwise given the actual circumstances. Responsibility, they claim, requires categorical freedom to choose otherwise in the same circumstances. Hypothetical freedom alone will not suffice. One way of expressing this point in more general terms is that the incompatibililst holds that for responsibility we need more than freedom of action, we also need freedom of will — understood as a power to choose between open alternatives. Failing this, the agent has no ultimate control over his conduct.
The spontaneity argument also suffers from further difficulties related to this. More specifically, according to the spontaneity argument, the distinction between free and unfree (i.e. compelled) action should be understood in terms of the difference between internal and external causes. Critics of compatibilism argue that this—attractively simple—distinction is impossible to maintain. It seems obvious, for example, that there are cases in which an agent acts according to the determinations of his own will but is nevertheless clearly unfree. There are, in particular, circumstances in which an agent may be subject to, and act on, desires and wants that are themselves compulsive in nature (e.g., as with a drug addict or kleptomaniac). Desires and wants of this kind, it is claimed, limit and undermine an agent's freedom no less than external force and violence. Although it may be true that in these circumstances the agent is acting according to his own desires or willings, it is equally clear that such an agent is neither free nor responsible for his behaviour. It would appear, therefore, that we are required to acknowledge that some causes “internal” to the agent may also be regarded as compelling or constraining. This concession, however, generates serious difficulties for the classical compatibilist strategy. It is no longer evident, given this concession, which “internal” causes should be regarded as “constraining” or “compelling” and which should not. Lying behind this objection is the more fundamental concern that the spontaneity argument presupposes a wholly inadequate understanding of the nature of excusing and mitigating considerations.
The spontaneity argument, as Hume presents it, is generally thought to contain the seeds of an essentially forward-looking and utilitarian account of moral responsibility. That is, Hume, following thinkers like Thomas Hobbes, points out that rewards and punishments serve to cause people to act in some ways and not in others and that this is clearly a matter of considerable social utility (T, 126.96.36.199/410; EU, 8.2897–98). Hume's brief remarks on this subject have been further developed by other compatibilists with whom Hume is often closely identified (e.g., Moritz Schlick and J.J.C. Smart) This sort of forward-looking, utilitarian account of responsibility has been subject to telling criticism. The basic problem with this account, it is argued, is that it is entirely blind to matters of desert and thus lacks the required (backward-looking) retributive element demanded in this sphere. Moreover, such a theory of responsibility, critics claim, is at the same time both too wide and too narrow. It is too wide because it would appear to make children and animals responsible; and it is too narrow insofar as it would appear to deny that those who are dead, or beyond the reach of the relevant forms of “treatment”, can be judged responsible for their actions. In short, all efforts to interpret responsibility along these forward-looking, utilitarian lines seem to be plagued with difficulties.
The account of Hume's compatibilist strategy provided so far has been almost entirely concerned with the significance of the liberty arguments. On this view of things, Hume's distinction between two kinds of “liberty” is what is central to his overall strategy. If this is correct, then there is not much that is really new about his general approach, as the liberty arguments are familiar features of earlier compatibilist writings (e.g., those of Hobbes). Contrary to this view, however, Hume makes clear in his Abstract of the Treatise that it is his views about “necessity” that puts “the whole controversy in a new light” (TA, 34/661). For this reason we need to turn to the necessity argument and consider more carefully what role it plays in Hume's compatibilist strategy.
Hume's claim to put the free will controversy “in a new light by giving a new definition of necessity” is certainly consistent with his statement in the Enquiry, “that a few intelligible definitions would immediately… put an end to the whole controversy” (EU, 8.2/81). Although the “verbal” aspect of this dispute is not emphasized in the Treatise in the way that it is in the Enquiry, Hume nevertheless makes clear in the Treatise what he takes the “verbal” aspect of the dispute to be. At the end of Treatise 2.3.1 he states:
I dare be positive no-one will ever endeavour to refute these reasonings otherwise than by altering my definitions… if anyone alters the definitions, I cannot pretend to argue with him, ‘till I know the meaning he assigns to these terms [viz. ‘cause’, ‘effect’, ‘necessity’, ‘liberty’, and ‘chance’] (T, 188.8.131.52/407).
Hume's subsequent remarks in this section make it clear that it is the term “necessity” that has been the major stumbling block to progress on this subject.
Hume's discussion in both Treatise 3.2.1–2 and Enquiry sec. 8 begin with an account of what he takes “necessity” to be. According to Hume “two circumstances form the whole of that necessity, which we ascribe to matter” (EU, 8.5/82). These two circumstances are the constant conjunction of like objects and the inference of the mind from one object to another. If we allow that “these two circumstances take place in the voluntary actions of men and in the operations of mind” (EU, 8.6/83), then we must accept that the moral realm is governed by necessity. Hume proceeds to show, first, that there is constant conjunction in the moral realm and, second, that given the very nature of society and morality, we must make inferences in the moral realm.
Hume believes that the question of whether or not there is constant conjunction in the moral realm is amenable to empirical resolution. It is just a matter of fact that there is constant conjunction in the moral realm as well as the natural realm. Hume admits that there are apparent irregularities and uncertainties in both the natural and moral realms, but these can be attributed to “imperfect knowledge” and can be accounted for by contrary causes (T, 184.108.40.206–3/403–4; EU, 8.13–5/86–88).
Thus it appears, not only that the conjunction between motives and voluntary actions is as regular and uniform as that between the cause and effect in any part of nature; but also that this regular conjunction has been universally acknowledged among mankind, and has never been the subject of dispute, either in philosophy or common life. (EU, 8.16/88)
In this way, Hume proceeds to try to show that this “regular conjunction” between motive and action allows for inference in the moral realm by “determining us to infer the existence of one from that of another” (T, 220.127.116.11/404). Hume's arguments here are based on what he claims are two incontestable facts about mankind: “that men always seek society” (T, 18.104.22.168/402) and that men regard other people as objects of praise or blame—that is, they hold them responsible.
These two arguments establishing that people must make inferences in the moral realm are closely related. For people to live in society, they must be able to infer the actions of others from their character, and—in the opposite direction but parallel to this—for people to regard one another as responsible, they must be able to infer character from actions. Hume proceeds to demonstrate that we draw inferences concerning motives and actions even though “it may seem superfluous to prove” this.
The mutual dependence of men is so great in all societies that scarce any human action is entirely complete in itself, or is performed without some reference to the actions of others, which are requisite to make it answer fully the intention of the agent… . In all those conclusions [expectations concerning the actions of others] they take their measures from past experience, in the same manner as in their reasonings concerning external objects; and firmly believe that men, as well as all the elements, are to continue, in their operations, the same that they have ever found them. (EU, 8.17/89)
Our inferences in the moral realm seem no less certain than those in the natural realm. “Moral evidence is”, Hume says, “nothing but a conclusion concerning the actions of men, deriv'd from the consideration of their motives, temper and situation” (T, 22.214.171.124/404). This sort of reasoning “runs thro’ politics, war, commerce, economy, and indeed mixes itself so entirely in human life, that ‘tis impossible to act or subsist a moment without recourse to it” (T, 126.96.36.199/405).
To the extent that the moral realm is subject to liberty of indifference (i.e. the absence of regularity and inference), so to that extent we would find that society would be made impossible. It is still not clear, however, why the two kinds of liberty have been “almost universally confounded” with each other, a confusion that leads many to embrace a mistaken view of liberty as indifference. Hume's successors, adopting the classical strategy, have interpreted the necessity argument as providing an answer to this question. More specifically, Hume's suggestion that causation and necessity seem “to imply something of force, violence, and constraint, of which we are not sensible” (T, 188.8.131.52/407) is taken to explain this fundamental (incompatibilist) mistake. The idea of necessity seems to imply some sort of compulsion or constraint, Hume suggests, because we erroneously believe that we have some idea of necessity as it exists in matter beyond that of constant conjunction and inference.
I may be mistaken in asserting, that we have no idea of any other connexion in the actions of body… . But sure I am, I ascribe nothing to the actions of the mind, but what must readily be allow'd of. Let no one, therefore, put an invidious construction on my words, by saying simply, that I assert the necessity of human actions, and place them on the same footing with the operations of senseless matter. I do not ascribe to the will that unintelligible necessity, which is suppos'd to lie in matter. But I ascribe to matter, that intelligible quality, call it necessity or not, which the most rigorous orthodoxy does or must allow to belong to the will. I change, therefore, nothing in the receiv'd systems, with regard to the will, but only with regard to material objects. (T, 184.108.40.206/410; my emphasis; cf. EU, 8.27/97)
In this way, Hume's remarks suggest that traditional “metaphysical” theories of causation have encouraged a fundamental confusion between the notion of an event being caused and that of an event being compelled. On the basis of such an erroneous conception of causation, many philosophers have arrived at the equally mistaken conclusion that there must be an incompatibility between determinism and freedom. The regularity theory of causation, it is argued, identifies and removes the source of this confusion in the free will dispute by way of challenging the deep-seated assumption that there is something more to causation than mere constant conjunction and the accompanying inference of the mind.
The significance of Hume's necessity argument for the liberty arguments seems clear in light of this. Free, responsible action, it is claimed, must be both caused (i.e. by the agent's willings) and uncompelled. Traditional, metaphysical theories of causation, however, confuse or conflate causation and compulsion and thus generate an ineradicable conflict between the positive and negative requirements of freedom and responsibility. It is, therefore, the great merit of Hume's regularity theory that it shows how the positive and negative requirements of freedom and responsibility can be reconciled and how the (“verbal”) confusion generated by traditional theories of causation can be overcome.
Hume's suggestion that metaphysical or nonregularity conceptions of causation lead us to confuse causation and compulsion has become a salient and established feature of the classical compatibilist strategy as developed throughout the 20th century. What are we to make of this aspect of the classical compatibilist strategy? Considered as an attempt to strengthen the liberty arguments, it must be deemed a failure. The line of reasoning advanced gives credence to the view that if there were some stronger “bond” or “tie” between cause and effect, beyond that of mere regularity, then causes would (somehow) compel or constrain their effects. A close examination of the spontaneity argument, however, reveals that this assumption is itself confused. The distinction that is fundamental to the compatibilist position is that between those actions which have external causes (i.e. compelled or constrained actions) and those which have causes internal to the agent. This crucial distinction between actions that originate from the agent and those that do not is not compromised by “metaphysical” (i.e. nonregularity) views of causation. What is relevant to whether an action was compelled or not is the nature of the cause (i.e. the object), not the nature of the causal relation. Nothing about the metaphysical conception of cause when applied to human action need suggest that we do not act according to our own will and could not act otherwise if we so willed. Clearly, therefore, proponents of the line of reasoning under consideration are mistaken when they suggest that metaphysical theories of causation would pose a threat to the (classical) compatibilist strategy. To concede this point to the incompatibilist is to be confused about the very force or significance of the spontaneity argument itself.
When we examine Hume's effort to reinterpret the causal relation and explain its relevance to the free will dispute, it becomes apparent that there is a deep ambivalence in the classical compatibilist strategy in respect of this issue. That is, the compatibilist, on the one hand, seems to argue that were we to remove “causal necessity” from the from the relation that holds between agent and action then we will thereby remove the basis on which attributions of responsibility are founded. In these circumstances there would be nothing to connect any agent with any action. On the other hand, compatibilists also argue (in light of Hume's remarks) that we must remove “metaphysical” necessity from our conception of the causal relation so as to rid it of all suggestion of compulsion and constraint. In this way, we find that the compatibilist strategy has sought to find an account of the causal relation that has to be “weak” enough to avoid implying compulsion and “strong” (robust) enough to connect agent and action. The regularity theory of causation, evidently, is thought to allow the (classical) compatibilist to travel this middle path. However, it may be argued, against this view, that the regularity theory in fact constitutes something of an Achilles' heel for the compatibilist position. That is, the regularity theory, we may argue, not only fails to strengthen the compatibilist position, as I have already suggested, but—what is even more disconcerting — it eats away at the metaphysical underpinnings of the compatibilist position. In order to understand these difficulties, we must consider, again, the relations between the liberty arguments and the necessity argument.
The liberty arguments presuppose that any adequate theory of responsibility must establish that agents produce or determine their actions and are, thereby, connected with their deeds. The necessity argument suggests that there exist only constant conjunctions between these objects (i.e. willings and actions). These “objects” — like all objects that we have any experience of — remain “entirely loose and separate” (EU, 7.26/73–4). Insofar as we may suppose that these causes do possess some power or agency and are, thereby, connected with their effects, this is only because the mind fails to distinguish between an (acquired) association of ideas and a perceived power or connexion in the objects themselves. In general, on Hume's account, in so far as we have any knowledge of “causal connections” they are always subjective (i.e. in the mind of the observer) and never objective (i.e. discovered in the objects themselves). The fact that we suppose that the objects themselves, qua cause, possess a power or efficacy by which they are connected with their effects is entirely due to the influence of experience or “custom” on the human mind; there are no (known) corresponding features in these objects (see, e.g., T, 220.127.116.11–25/162–7; cp. EU, 8.26–30/74–9). Given this, Hume's account of liberty of spontaneity seems vulnerable to the very same objections that the antilibertarian argument raised against the libertarian position. That is, given the necessity argument, we still have no reason to believe that such agents are (really) connected with their actions, although our subjective experience may make us feel that they are.
We may conclude that Hume's account of necessity not only fails to strengthen the liberty arguments, it weakens them both. Since we never discover any (real) causal connections between any objects both the antilibertarian argument and the spontaneity argument rest on a demand that can never be met — the demand that agent's can somehow be “connected” to their actions in some relevant (i.e. robust and objective) sense. While metaphysical conceptions of causation serve these purposes very well, Hume's (sceptical) views about (objective) causal connections undermine all such demands. In light of these difficulties, one of two things must be true of Hume's “reconciling project”. Either what he took to be its greatest source of strength, the necessity argument, generates awkward and serious difficulties for this “reconciling project”, or his liberty arguments have been misunderstood. I will show that it is indeed the case that Hume's liberty arguments have been misunderstood in important respects.
As I have noted, Hume maintains that for men to live in society they must be able to infer the actions of others from their character. Without inferences of this kind, based on perceived regularities, all reasonings and practices concerning politics, war, commerce, and so on would be impossible. In the opposite direction but parallel to this, Hume also maintains that for people to regard one another as responsible they must be able to infer character from action. Why should inference to character have any importance or significance for morality? The following three points must be kept in mind:
- Only a person can be the object of love and hate.
- Approval and disapproval are calm forms of love and hatred.
- To hold someone responsible is to regard him as an object of approval or disapproval.
The constant and universal object of hatred or anger is a person or creature endowed with thought and consciousness; and when any criminal or injurious actions excite that passion, it is only by their relation to the person or connection with him.
… and where they [sc. actions] proceed not from some cause in the character and disposition of the person, who performed them …it is impossible he can, upon its account, become the object of punishment and vengeance (T, 18.104.22.168//411).
Evidently it is only a person, a character or a thinking being who is an object of hatred and anger. Holding an agent responsible is, for Hume, a matter of simply regarding him as an object of the moral sentiments of approval or disapproval. These sentiments are calm forms of the indirect passions of love or hatred. In his discussion of the indirect passions of love and hatred Hume says:
One of these supposition, viz. that the cause of love and hatred must be related to a person or thinking being in order to produce these passions, is not only provable, but too evident to be contested. Virtue and vice, when considered in the abstract … excite no degree of love and hatred, esteem or contempt towards those who have no relation to them (T, 22.214.171.124/331).
Once it is appreciated that in Hume's view approbation and blame are “nothing but a fainter and more imperceptible love or hatred” (T, 126.96.36.199/614) it is clear why “they must be related to a person or thinking being”.
Hume notes that the causes of the indirect passions vary greatly in number and kind (T, 188.8.131.52/281). Different and varied as they may be, however, they must be “either parts of ourselves, or something nearly related to us” (T, 184.108.40.206/285). Hume distinguishes four broad categories of objects or features of ourselves which give rise to the indirect passions: our wealth, external goods, or property; our immediate relatives or those people who are closely related to us on another basis; our bodily qualities or attributes; and, most important, our qualities of mind, or character traits (T, 220.127.116.11; 18.104.22.168–5/279, 294f; DP, 146–53). Those character traits or mental qualities that produce an independent pleasure in ourselves or others also, in consequence of this, give rise to pride or love. Character traits or qualities of mind of this nature are virtues. Similarly, those mental qualities or character traits which produce pain, also, in consequence of this, produce humility or hate, and, as such, they are deemed to be vices (see, e.g., T, 22.214.171.124/574–75; cf. T, 126.96.36.199/473; DP, 146–47, 155–56) Clearly, then, virtue and vice, by means of the general mechanism of the indirect passions, give rise to that “faint and imperceptible” form of love and hatred which constitutes the moral sentiments. It is, in other words, this “regular mechanism” which is, on Hume's account, essential to all ascriptions of responsibility.
In order to know anyone's character we require inference — from their actions to their character. Without knowledge of anyone's character no sentiment of approbation or blame would be aroused in us. Therefore, without inference no one would be an object of praise or blame — that is to say, no one would be regarded as responsible for their actions. Accordingly, praising and blaming would be psychologically impossible if there were no inferences from action to character. Without this necessity morality would become a psychological impossibility. It is also clear that external violence, like liberty of indifference, makes it impossible to regard someone as an object of praise or blame. For in such circumstances we could not make any inference from the action to the agent's character. As the action is caused by external forces we are led away from the agent's character.
… liberty [sc. of spontaneity] … is also essential to morality, and … no human actions, where it is wanting, are susceptible of any moral qualities, or can be the objects either of approbation or dislike. For as actions are objects of our moral sentiment, so far only as they are indications of the internal character, passions, and affections; it is impossible that they can give rise either to praise or blame, where they proceed not from these principles, but are derived altogether from external violence (EU, 8.31/99).
Only when an action is, or is believed to be, determined by the will of an agent is that agent regarded as an object of praise or blame — this is a matter of psychological fact for Hume. Actions that are either uncaused or caused by external factors cannot render the agent responsible not because it would be unreasonable to hold him responsible, but rather because it would be psychologically impossible to hold him responsible.
The salient features of Hume's naturalistic compatibilism can be summarized under the following points:
- Approval and disapproval are essential to morality.
- Only character traits or mental qualities arouse our moral sentiments of approval or disapproval.
- Knowledge of a person's character traits or mental qualities requires inference.
- A person or thinking being is held responsible if we regard her as an object of a moral sentiment.
- Regarding an agent as responsible is, therefore, a matter of feeling not judgment.
- Without inference to character (i.e. necessity), no such feeling could, as a matter of psychological fact, be aroused in us, and therefore no one could be regarded as responsible.
- Therefore, it is an (empirical) psychological fact that without necessity, morality would be impossible.
Hume's discussion of liberty and necessity can be shown, on this reinterpretation, to be closely connected with his discussions of the passions and moral evaluations. These connexions are not apparent in the Enquiries, where no lengthy or detailed discussion of the passions appears. This may in part account for misinterpretations of Hume's argument. However, as has been argued above, the necessity argument is also of great importance to any adequate understanding of what Hume has to say about liberty and necessity. The presentation in the Treatise rather obscures these connexions in Hume's argument—there being a gap of over two hundred pages between his discussion of the idea of necessary connexion and that of liberty and necessity. This quite serious flaw is remedied by the first Enquiry but only at the cost of leaving the reader somewhat puzzled as to why Hume put his discussion of “liberty and necessity” in Book II of the Treatise in the first place. The naturalistic interpretation, however, shows that Hume's discussion of liberty and necessity is intimately connected with his discussion of the passions in Book II of the Treatise and cannot be fully understood without reference to it.
I have referred to this interpretation of Hume's compatibilist strategy as being “naturalistic”. In what sense are Hume's arguments “naturalistic”? There are, I think, two quite different senses of “naturalism” which can appropriately be applied to Hume's discussion of liberty and necessity. The first and most important sense is that it involves applying the experimental method of reasoning to this “long disputed question”. As we have seen, Hume is concerned to describe the circumstances under which people are felt to be responsible (i.e. describe the “regular mechanism” which generates the moral sentiments). In this way, Hume's compatibilist strategy must be understood within the general context of his effort to “introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects”. This aspect of Hume's “general strategy” goes completely unnoticed on the classical interpretation (which presents Hume's discussion as involving pure conceptual enquiry antecedent to any application of the “experimental method”).
The second sense in which Hume's reconciling project may be said to be naturalistic is that it stresses the role of feeling, as opposed to reason, in resolving this dispute. An appreciation of this sort of naturalism in Hume's philosophy is, as a number of distinguished commentators have argued, of great importance if we are to get a balanced and complete picture of Hume's philosophy. (Kemp Smith, 1941) On the one hand, Hume is clearly anxious to show the limitations of human reason and is, in particular, anxious to show that reason alone is incapable of resolving the various philosophical problems that he comes to consider in the course of the Treatise. There is, on the other hand, a “positive”, non-sceptical aspect to Hume's teaching that argues for the important role of feeling in human life, and that it this is essential for solving some the basic philosophical problems that we are presented with — including the free will problem.
The naturalistic interpretation, clearly, pursues very different avenues of thought. Necessity is psychologically essential to ascriptions of responsibility, because in the absence of the relevant regularities and inferences, the regular mechanism which produces our moral sentiments would simply fail to function. Similarly, liberty of spontaneity is (psychologically) essential to responsibility for action because it is only in these circumstances (i.e. in which we discover constant conjunctions between motives and actions) that it is possible for us to draw the specific kinds of inferences required to generate the moral sentiments. If conduct is produced by external violence, no moral sentiment is aroused and, thus, we do not (as a matter of fact) hold the person responsible. On the naturalistic interpretation, Hume's concern with the nature and significance of moral freedom and how it relates to ascriptions of responsibility must be understood primarily in terms of what he has to say about the role of moral sentiment in this sphere. Any account of Hume's position that ignores these features of his discussion fundamentally misrepresents not only his general account of responsibility but also his overall effort to resolve the “free will dispute” by means of his alternative definition of necessity.
If asked to pass quick judgment on Hume's “reconciling project”, as interpreted along the naturalistic lines outlined in the previous section, many contemporary philosophers would probably be inclined to say that it appears to be, quite simply, anachronistic, eighteenth-century psychology. So considered, it is of little or no relevance to contemporary issues. Indeed, some philosophers may take the view that the philosophical interest—if not the philosophical substance—of Hume's compatibilism has been entirely removed. Surely, any attempt to describe the circumstances in which certain sentiments are aroused in us is hopelessly irrelevant to our present-day concerns and based wholly on assumptions that have long since been rejected. In particular, we can hardly take seriously an enterprise that asks us to understand the complex issue of moral responsibility in terms of feelings.
The first thing to be said in reply to this assessment of the contemporary relevance of the naturalistic interpretation is that it overlooks the limitations of the classical interpretation. More specifically, insofar as Hume continues to be read as holding to the classical compatibilist position, it may be argued that his views on this subject are now somewhat dated and passé. Contemporary compatibilist thinking has now advanced well beyond the confines of the (familiar and basic) distinctions drawn by Hume's liberty arguments and is now much more sensitive to the difficulties posed by incompatibilist criticism. Moreover, few, if any, contemporary compatibilists would accept the suggestion, as suggested by the classical reading of Hume's necessity argument, that incompatibilism is simply a product of conceptual confusion between causation and compulsion.
True as these observations may be, however, none of this serves to show that Hume's naturalistic commitments are themselves of any greater interest or relevance from a contemporary perspective — much less that the moral psychology and (empiricial) methodology of Hume's naturalism is an advance on the classical strategy. In this section I show that the best way to respond to these doubts about the value of the naturalistic interpretation for the contemporary debate is by way of highlighting the striking affinities between Hume's approach and P.F. Strawson's views on this subject.
Strawson's “Freedom and Resentment” (hereafter FR) is arguably the most important and influential paper on free will written in the second half of the twentieth century. The argument of this paper is presented as a bold effort to “reconcile” the traditional disputants in the free will problem (FR, 63–4–60). Strawson labels the principal opponents “optimists” and “pessimists”. Optimists take what is essentially the classical compatibilist position. They hold that the concept of moral responsibility, and associated practices such as punishing and blaming, “in no way lose their raison d'etre if the thesis of determinism is true”—indeed, they may even require the truth of this thesis (FR, 63). The optimist, Strawson says, typically draws attention to “the efficacy of the practices of punishment, and of moral condemnation and approval, in regulating behaviour in socially desirable ways” (FR, 64; cf. FR, 79). In other words, the optimist embraces and defends an essentially forward-looking, utilitarian conception of responsibility (FR, 79). (The only optimist Strawson cites is Patrick Nowell-Smith, but the general position described is shared by many prominent 20th-century, empiricist-minded compatibilists—most notably, Schlick.)
The pessimist takes a libertarian position and finds the optimist's account of freedom and responsibility wholly inadequate. Whereas the optimist construes moral freedom as simply the absence of constraint or compulsion (i.e. “negative freedom” or liberty of spontaneity), the pessimist insists that we require the sort of freedom that implies the falsity of determinism. We require, that is, some kind of “contra-causal” or “metaphysical” freedom (FR, 81; cf. FR, 64). Without this (metaphysical) freedom, the pessimist claims, there is no adequate foundation for moral responsibility (FR, 79). Justified punishment, blame, and condemnation require that the person who is the object of these practices or judgments really deserves it (FR, 65). The optimist's narrow concern with matters of social utility, therefore, “leaves out something that is vital” to our conception of moral responsibility and the justification of the practices associated with it. This gap is to be filled, according to the pessimist, with the general metaphysical thesis of indeterminism.
Strawson rejects both optimist and pessimist accounts, but he hopes to bring them together through “a formal withdrawal on one side in return for a substantial concession on the other” (FR, 64). Strawson agrees with the pessimist that something is missing in the optimist's account. It is a mistake, however, to think that this gap can be filled by the obscure and panicky metaphysics of libertarianism (FR, 83). On the contrary, optimist and pessimist alike are missing or overlooking what is really essential to moral responsibility; a proper recognition of the role that “reactive attitudes and feelings” play in this sphere. It is, says Strawson, “a pity that talk of the moral sentiments has fallen out of favour. The phrase would be quite a good name for that network of human attitudes in acknowledging the character and place of which we find, I suggest, the only possibility of reconciling these disputants to each other and the facts” (FR, 81). Strawson proposes, therefore, that we fill the “lacuna” in the optimist's account by making appropriate reference to the essential role that the moral sentiments play in the sphere of responsibility. In return, however, we require that the pessimist “surrender his metaphysics” (FR, 81).
Strawson argues that both optimist and pessimist make a similar mistake:
Both seek, in different ways, to over-intellectualize the facts. Inside the general structure or web of human attitudes and feelings of which I have been speaking, there is endless room for modification, redirection, criticism, and justification. But questions of justification are internal to the structure or relate to modifications internal to it. The existence of the general framework of attitudes itself is something we are given with the fact of human society. As a whole, it neither calls for, nor permits, an external ‘rational’ justification. Pessimist and optimist alike show themselves, in different ways, unable to accept this. (FR, 81–79)
Strawson expands on these points in his more recent work Skepticism and Naturalism (hereafter SN). In this context, he draws explicitly on Hume's naturalism. He observes that all efforts to supply a justifying ground for our moral attitudes and judgments by way of “defending the reality of some special condition of freedom or spontaneity or self-determination” have not been “notably successful” (SN, 32). All such attempts, he maintains, are misguided.
They are misguided also for the reasons for which counter-arguments to other forms of scepticism have been to be misguided; i.e. because the arguments they are directed against are totally inefficacious. We can no more be reasoned out of our proneness to personal and moral reactive attitudes in general than we can be reasoned out of our belief in the existence of body… . What we have, in our inescapable commitment to these attitudes and feelings, is a natural fact, something as deeply rooted in our natures as our existence as social beings. (SN, 32–33)
Earlier in Skepticism and Naturalism, in a passage concerned with our “natural disposition to belief”, Strawson suggests that we might “speak of two Humes: Hume the sceptic and Hume the naturalist; where Hume's naturalism … appears as something like a refuge from his skepticism” (SN, 12). He continues,
According to Hume the naturalist, skeptical doubts are not to be met by argument. They are simply to be neglected (except, perhaps, insofar as they supply a harmless amusement, a mild diversion to the intellect). They are to be neglected because they are idle; powerless against the force of nature, of our naturally implanted disposition to belief. This does not mean that Reason has no part to play in relation to our beliefs concerning matters of fact and existence. It has a part to play, though a subordinate one: as Nature's lieutenant rather than Nature's commander. (SN, 13–14)
Although Strawson plainly has Hume prominently in mind when discussing the relationship between scepticism and naturalism, nowhere does he give us any indication of the exact place or role of naturalism in Hume's writings on the subject of free will. It is left unclear, therefore, where, according to Strawson, Hume stands in relation to the naturalistic arguments that Strawson has advanced on the issue of freedom and responsibility. More specifically, it is not clear whether Strawson views Hume as one of the “optimists” whom he seeks to refute or as a naturalistic ally from whom he is drawing his own arguments and strategy.
If we read Hume along the lines of the classical interpretation, then his position on these issues looks as if it accords very closely with the typical “optimist” strategy associated with such thinkers as Schlick. The classical interpretation, however, entirely overlooks the role of moral sentiment in Hume's reconciling strategy. It emphasizes the relevance of the (supposed) confusion between causation and compulsion in order to explain the more fundamental confusion about the nature of liberty (i.e. why philosophers tend to confuse liberty of spontaneity with liberty of indifference). With these features of Hume's position established, the classical interpretation points to Hume's remarks concerning the social utility of rewards and punishments and the way in which they depend on the principles of necessity. From this perspective, Hume's discussion of freedom and necessity clearly constitutes a paradigmatic and influential statement of the “optimist's” position. So interpreted, Hume must be read as thinker, like Schlick, who has “over-intellectualized the facts” on the basis of a “one-eyed-utilitarianism”; one who has ignored “that complicated web of attitudes and feelings” which Strawson seeks to draw our attention to. In this way, we are encouraged to view Hume as a prime target of Strawson's attack on the “optimist” position.
The naturalistic interpretation, by contrast, makes it plain that any such view of Hume's approach and general strategy is deeply mistaken. Hume, no less than Strawson, is especially concerned to draw our attention to the facts about human nature that are relevant to a proper understanding of the nature and conditions of moral responsibility. More specifically, Hume argues that we cannot properly account for moral responsibility unless we acknowledge and describe the role that moral sentiment plays in this sphere. Indeed, unlike Strawson, Hume is much more concerned with the detailed mechanism whereby our moral sentiments are aroused, and thus he is particularly concerned to explain the relevance of spontaneity, indifference, and necessity to the functioning of moral sentiment. To this extent, therefore, Hume's naturalistic approach is more tightly woven into his account of the nature of necessity and moral freedom. In sum, when we compare Hume's arguments with Strawson's important and influential discussion, it becomes immediately apparent that there is considerable contemporary significance to the contrast between the classical and naturalistic interpretations of Hume's reconciling strategy.
The overall resemblance between Hume's and Strawson's strategy in dealing with issues of freedom and responsibility is quite striking. The fundamental point that they agree about is that we cannot understand the nature and conditions of moral responsibility without reference to the crucial role that moral sentiment plays in this sphere. This naturalistic approach places Hume and Strawson in similar positions when considered in relation to the views of the pessimist and the optimist. The naturalistic approach shows that, in different ways, both sides of the traditional debate fail to properly acknowledge the facts about moral sentiment. Where Hume most noticeably differs from Strawson, however, is on the question of the “general causes” of moral sentiment. Strawson largely bypasses this problem. For Hume, this is a crucial issue that must be settled to understand why necessity is essential to responsibility and why indifference is entirely incompatible with the effective operation of the mechanism that responsibility depends on.
We have noted that the classical and naturalistic interpretations differ in how they account for the relationship between freedom and responsibility. According to the classical interpretation responsibility may be analysed directly in terms of free action, where this is understood simply in terms of an agent acting according to her own will or desires. While classical compatibilists reject the incompatibilist suggestion that free and responsible action requires indeterminism or any special form of “moral causation” they are, nevertheless, both agreed that a person can be held responsible if and only if she acts freely. On the naturalistic interpretation, however, Hume rejects this general doctrine, which we may call “voluntarism”.
There are two related claims that are especially relevant to this issue. First, Hume maintains that it is a matter of “the utmost importance” for moral philosophy that action must be indicative of durable qualities of mind if a person is to be held accountable for it (T, 188.8.131.52/575). This claim is part of Hume’s more general claim that our indirect passions (including our moral sentiments) are aroused and sustained only when the pleasurable or painful qualities concerned (e.g. the virtues and vices) stand in a durable or constant relation with the person who is their object (T, 184.108.40.206/292–3; DP, 2.11). In the case of actions, which are “temporary and perishing”, no such lasting relation is involved unless action is suitably tied to character traits of some kind. Second, Hume also notes that we may be able to infer a person’s character through some medium other than their voluntary, intentional actions. A person may, for example, reveal their character through their “wishes and sentiments”, gestures, mannerism, carriage and countenance, even though this is not done voluntarily and is not intentional (T, 220.127.116.11, 18.104.22.168/317, 575; EU, 8.9, 8.15/85, 88). In these circumstances we may still find such mental qualities pleasant or painful and they will, accordingly, generate moral sentiments in us. On the naturalistic reading, therefore, it is a mistake to suppose that Hume is committed to the simple voluntarist understanding of the relationship between responsibility and freedom. Acting freely is, in itself, neither a sufficient nor a necessary condition for being held responsible.
These observations regarding Hume and the doctrine of voluntarism are of considerable relevance to the contemporary ethical debate as it concerns what Bernard Williams has described as “the morality system” (Williams, 1985: Chp. 10). Although Williams’ (hostile) account of the morality system is multifaceted and defies easy summary, its core features are clear enough. The concept that Williams identifies as fundamental to the morality system is its special notion of obligation. Flowing from this special concept of obligation are the related concepts of right and wrong, blame and voluntariness. When agents voluntarily violate their obligations they do wrong and are liable to blame and some measure of retribution. To this extent the morality system, so conceived, involves what Williams calls “the blame system”, which focuses on particular acts (Williams, 1985: 194). According to Williams there is pressure within the blame system “to require a voluntariness that will be total and will cut through character and psychological or social determinism, and allocate blame and responsibility on the ultimately fair basis of the agent’s own contribution, no more and no less” (Williams, 1985: 194).
One reason why the morality system places great weight on the importance of voluntariness is that it aspires to show that morality — and moral responsibility in particular — somehow “transcends luck” (Williams, 1985: 195). This is required to ensure that blame is allocated in a way that is “ultimately fair”. Despite the obvious challenges this requirement poses, compatibilists have typically tried to satisfy these aspiration of the morality system by way of offering a variety of argument to show that compatibilist commitments do not render us vulnerable to the play of fate or luck in our moral lives (e.g. Dennett, 1984). Hume, however, makes little effort to satisfy these aspirations. (A point that Williams notes in Williams, 1995: 20n12.) Most importantly, Hume makes clear that although our qualities of character may typically be expressed by means of our voluntary and intentional conduct, for the most part our character is not acquired through our choices or decisions. This issue is addressed in the context of Hume’s discussion of our natural abilities, where he observes that it is “almost impossible for the mind to change its character in any considerable article, or cure itself of a passionate or splenetic temper, when they are natural to it (T, 22.214.171.124/608). Our will has no more influence over our moral virtues, which include our natural abilities, than it does over our ”bodily endowments“ (T, 126.96.36.199/606–07). In the final analysis, Hume claims, just as every body or material object ”is determin’d by an absolute fate to a certain degree and direction of its motion, and can no more depart from that precise line, in which it moves, than it can convert itself into an angel, or spirit, or any superior substance“ (T, 188.8.131.52/400), so too our conduct and character is similarly subject to an ”absolute fate“ as understood in terms of the inescapable ”bonds of necessity“ (T, 184.108.40.206/408). In these fundamental respects, therefore, Hume takes the view, along with Williams, that morality does not elude either fate or luck. (It is important to note, however, that Hume’s views on moral luck are complex and require some further qualifications. For this see Russell, 1995: 130–33).
Many compatibilists hold, of course, that while our character may well be mostly unchosen or involuntarily acquired, we can, nevertheless, be properly held responsible only for what we do voluntarily. As we have already noted, Hume explicitly rejects this view as well. Although it is primarily through intentional actions (i.e. as guided by forethought and design: T, 220.127.116.11/349) that we express our character or manifest our qualities of mind, there are other ways in which our character may be involuntarily and unintentionally expressed. Hume’s views about the natural abilities are particularly relevant to this issue. More specifically, Hume claims that the voluntary/involuntary distinction does allow us to explain ”why moralists have invented“ the distinction between natural abilities and moral qualities. Natural abilities, unlike moral qualities, ”are almost invariable by any sort of art or industry“ (T, 18.104.22.168./609). By contrast, moral qualities, ”or at least, the actions, that proceed from them, may be chang’d by the motives or rewards and punishments, praise and blame (T, 22.214.171.124/ 609). We cannot, in other words, make people intelligent, imaginative, and so on, by the application of rewards and punishments, but we can (in some measure) regulate their voluntary actions and thus direct their conduct with respect to moral virtues, such as justice. In this way, according to Hume, the significance of the voluntary/involuntary distinction is largely limited to our concern to regulate conduct in society. To this extent, this distinction does serve as the relevant boundary for the appropriate application of rewards and punishments, with a view to guiding future conduct, but it does not serve as the relevant boundary of moral evaluation.
From a critical perspective, it may be argued that there remains a significant gap in Hume’s scheme as have so far described it. Even if we discard the aspirations of the morality system, any credible naturalistic theory of moral responsibility needs to be able to provide some account of the sorts of moral capacity involved in exempting conditions, whereby we deem some individuals and not others as appropriate targets of moral sentiments or “reactive attitudes”. As it stands, what Hume has to say on this subject is plainly inadequate. According to Hume, it is an ultimate inexplicable fact about our moral sentiments (qua calm forms of the indirect passions of love and hate) that they are always directed at people, either ourselves or others. This account leaves us unable say why some people are not appropriate objects of moral sentiments (e.g. children, the insane, and so on). There are, however, several available proposals for dealing with this gap. Perhaps the most influential proposal is to adopt some general theory of reason-responsiveness or rational self-control. According to accounts of this kind, responsible agents need to have control over their actions, where this involves performing “those actions intentionally, while possessing the relevant sorts of normative competence: the general ability to grasp moral requirements and to govern one’s conduct by light of them” (Wallace, 1994: 86). While proposals of this general kind help to plug a large gap in Hume’s theory, they also suggest a particular understanding of moral responsibility that is not entirely in keeping with Hume’s own account.
There are two points of divergence that are especially significant with respect to to issue. First, rational self-control may be explained, as it is on Wallace’s account, in terms of specifically Kantian conceptions of practical reason and moral agency (Wallace, 1994: 12–17). Even if commitments of this kind are avoided, theories of this kind are still too narrowly based on moral capacity as it relates solely to actions and intentions. On Hume’s account, moral capacity must be related to wider patterns and dispositions of feeling, desire and character. The scope of moral evaluation should not reduced or limited to concern with (fleeting and momentary) acts of will modelled after legal paradigms. Moral capacity must be exercised and manifest in a larger and more diverse set of propensities and abilities that make up moral character, including the operation of moral sentiment itself.
Second, and related to the previous point, although Hume does not provide any substantial or robust theory of moral capacity, it is possible to find, within what he provides, material that suggests a less “rationalistic” understanding of moral capacity. It may be argued, for example, that on Hume’s system there is an intimate and important relationship between moral sense and virtue. Our moral sense should be understood in terms of our general capacity to feel and direct moral sentiments at both ourselves and at others. Hume points out that children acquire the artificial virtues, involving the conventions of justice, by way not only of learning their advantages but also learning to feel the relevant moral sentiments when these conventions are violated (T, 126.96.36.199/500–01). The mechanism of the moral sentiments both cultivates and maintains the artificial virtues. Hume has less to say about the role of moral sentiment in relation to the natural virtues but similar observations would seem to apply. As children grow up and mature they become increasingly aware that their qualities of character affect both others and themselves and that these will inevitably give rise to moral sentiments in the people they will deal with. This entire process of becoming aware of the moral sentiments of others, and “surveying ourselves as we appear to others” (T, 188.8.131.52, 184.108.40.206, 220.127.116.11, 18.104.22.168/576–7, 589, 591, 620; EM, 9.10,, App. 4.3/276, 314) surely serves to develop the natural as well as the artificial virtues. Along these lines, Hume maintains that this disposition to “survey ourselves” and seek our own “peace and satisfaction” is the surest guardian of every virtue (EM, 9.10/276). Any person who entirely lacks this disposition will be shameless and will inevitably lack all the virtues that depend on moral reflection for their development and stability.
If this conjecture regarding the intimate or internal relationship between virtue and moral sense is correct, then it does much to explain and account for the range of exemptions that are required in this area. Hume’s understanding of the operation of moral sentiment is not simply a matter of enjoying pleasant and painful feelings of a peculiar kind (T, 22.214.171.124/472). On the contrary, the moral evaluation of character involves the activity of both reason and sentiment. The sort of intellectual activities required include, not only learning from experience the specific pleasant and painful tendencies of certain kinds of character and conduct, as well as the ability to distinguish accurately among them, but also the ability to evaluate character and conduct from “some steady and general point of view” (T, 3.3..15/581–2; EM, 5.41–2/227–8). Clearly, then, insofar as the cultivation and stability of virtue depends on moral sense, it also requires the intellectual qualities and capacities involved in the exercise of moral sense. Given this, an animal, an infant, or an insane person will lack the ability to perform the intellectual tasks involved in the production of moral sentiment. We cannot, therefore, expect virtues that are dependent on these abilities and intellectual activities to be manifest in individuals who lack them, or when they are damaged or underdeveloped.
Interpreting Hume in these terms not only goes a long way to filling what looks to be a large gap in his naturalistic program, it also avoids distorting his own wider ethical commitments by imposing a narrower, rationalistic conception of moral capacity into his naturalistic framework. Beyond this, interpreting moral capacity in these more sentimentalist terms is both philosophically and psychologically more satisfying and plausible. On an account of this kind, there exists a close and essential relationship between being responsible, where this is understood in terms of being an appropriate target of moral sentiments or reactive attitudes, and being able to hold oneself and others responsible, where this is understood as the ability to experience and entertain moral sentiments. It is a merit of Hume’s system, so interpreted, that it avoids “over-intellectualizing” not only what is involved in holding a person responsible, but also what is involved in being a responsible agent.
In the Treatise, Hume argues that one of the reasons “why the doctrine of liberty [of indifference] has generally been better receiv'd in the world, than its antagonist [the doctrine of necessity], proceeds from religion, which has been very unnecessarily interested in this question” (T, 126.96.36.199/409). He goes on to argue “that the doctrine of necessity, according to my explication of it, is not only innocent, but even advantageous to religion and morality”. When Hume came to present his views afresh in the Enquiry (Sec. 8), he was less circumspect about his hostile intentions with regard to “religion”. In the parallel passage (EU, 8.26/96—97), he again objects to any effort to refute a hypothesis “by a pretence to its dangerous consequences to religion and morality” (my emphasis). He goes on to say that his account of the doctrines of liberty and necessity “are not only consistent with morality, but are absolutely essential to its support” (E, 8.26/97; my emphasis). By this means, he makes it clear that he is not claiming that his position is “consistent” with religion. In the final passages of the Enquiry discussion of liberty and necessity (EU, 8.32–6/99—103) — passages which do not appear in the original Treatise discussion — Hume makes it plain exactly how his necessitarian principles have “dangerous consequences for religion”.
Hume considers the following objection:
It may be said, for instance, that, if voluntary actions be subjected to the same laws of necessity with the operations of matter, there is a continued chain of necessary causes, pre-ordained and pre-determined, reaching from the original cause of all to every single volition of every human creature… . The ultimate Author of all our volitions is the Creator of the world, who first bestowed motion on this immense machine, and placed all beings in that particular position, whence every subsequent event, by an inevitable necessity, must result. Human action, therefore, either can have no moral turpitude at all, as proceeding from so good a cause; or if they have any turpitude, they must involve our Creator in the same guilt, while he is acknowledged to be their ultimate cause and author. (EU, 8.32/99–100)
In other words, the doctrine of necessity produces an awkward dilemma for the theological position: Either the distinction between (moral) good and evil collapses, because everything is produced by a perfect being who intends “nothing but what is altogether good and laudable” (EU, 8.33/101), or we must “retract the attribute of perfection, which we ascribe to the Deity” on the ground that he is the ultimate author of moral evil in the world.
Hume treats the first horn of this dilemma at greatest length. He draws on his naturalistic principles to show that the conclusion reached (i.e. that no human actions are evil or criminal in nature) is absurd. There are, he claims, both physical and moral evils in this world that the human mind finds naturally painful, and this affects our sentiments accordingly. Whether we are the victim of gout or of robbery, we naturally feel the pain of such evils (EU, 8.34/101–2). No “remote speculations” or “philosophical theories” concerning the good or perfection of the whole universe will alter these natural reactions and responses to the particular ills and evils we encounter. Hence, even if we were to grant that this is indeed the best of all possible worlds—and Hume clearly takes the view that we have no reason to suppose that it is (D, 113–4; EU, 11.15–22/137–42)—this would do nothing to undermine the reality of the distinction we draw between good and evil (i.e. as experienced on the basis of “the natural sentiments of the human mind”: EU, 8.35/103).
What, then, of the alternative view, that God is “the ultimate author of guilt and moral turpitude in all his creatures”? Hume offers two rather different accounts of this alternative—although he does not distinguish them properly. He begins by noting that if some human actions “have any turpitude, they must involve our Creator in the same guilt, while he is acknowledged to be their ultimate cause and author” (EU, 8.32/100; my emphasis). This passage suggests that God is also blameworthy for criminal actions in this world, since he is their “ultimate author”. At this point, however, there is no suggestion that the particular human agents who commit these crimes (as preordained by God) are not accountable for them. In the passage that follows this is the position taken.
For as a man, who fired a mine, is answerable for all the consequences whether the train he employed be long or short; so wherever a continued chain of necessary causes is fixed, that Being, either finite or infinite, who produces the first, is likewise the author of all the rest, and must both bear the blame and acquire the praise which belong to them. (EU, 8.32/100)
Hume goes on to argue that this rule of morality has even “greater force” when applied to God, since he is neither ignorant nor impotent and must, therefore, have intended to produce those criminal actions which are manifest in the world. Granted that such actions are indeed criminal, it follows, says Hume, “that the Deity, not man, is accountable for them” (EU, 8.32/100; cf. EU, 8.33/101).
It is evident that Hume is arguing two points. First, if God is the creator of the world and preordained and predetermined everything that happens in it, then the (obvious) existence of moral evil is attributable to him, and thus “we must retract the attribute of perfection” which we ascribe to him. Second, if God is indeed the ultimate author of moral evil, then no individual human being is accountable for the criminal actions he performs. The second claim does not follow from the first. Moreover, it is clearly inconsistent with Hume's general position on this subject. As has been noted, in this same context, Hume has also argued that no speculative philosophical theory can alter the natural workings of our moral sentiments. The supposition that God is the “ultimate author” of all that takes place in the world will not, on this view of things, change our natural disposition to praise or blame our fellow human beings. Whatever the ultimate causes of a person's character and conduct, it will (inevitably) arouse a sentiment of praise or blame in other humans who contemplate it. This remains the case even if we suppose that God also deserves blame for the “moral turpitude” we find in the world. In general, then, Hume's first formulation of the second alternative (i.e. that God must share the blame for those crimes that occur in the world) is more consistent with his naturalistic principles.
What is crucial to Hume's polemical purpose in these passages is not the thesis that if God is the author of crimes then his human creations are not accountable for them. Rather, the point Hume is concerned to make (since he does not, in fact, doubt the inescapability of our moral accountability to our fellow human beings) is that the religious hypothesis leads to the “absurd consequence” that God is the ultimate author of sin in this world and that he is, accordingly, liable to some appropriate measure of blame. Hume, in other words, takes the (deeply impious) step of showing that if God exists, and is the creator of the universe, then he is no more free of sin than human beings are. According to Hume, we must judge God as we judge human beings, on the basis of his effects in the world, and we must then adjust our sentiments accordingly. Indeed, there is no other natural or reasonable basis on which to found our sentiments toward God. In certain respects, therefore, we can make better sense of how we (humans) can hold God accountable than we can make sense of how God is supposed to hold humans accountable (i.e. since we have no knowledge of his sentiments, or even if he has any; cf. D, 58,114,128–9; ESY, 594; but see also LET, I/51). It is, of course, Hume's considered view that it is an egregious error of speculative theology and philosophy to suppose that the universe has been created by a being that bears some (close) resemblance to humankind. The question of the origin of the universe is one that Hume plainly regards as beyond the scope of human reason (see, e.g., EU, 1.11–2;11.15–23;11.26–7;12.2634/11–13, 137–42, 144–47, 165; D, 36–8,88–9,107). Nevertheless, Hume's point is plain: On the basis of the (limited) evidence that is available to us, we must suppose that if there is a God, who is creator of this world and who orders all that takes place in it, then this being is indeed accountable for all the (unnecessary and avoidable; D, 107) evil that we discover in it.
Although it is evident that Hume’s discussion of free will in the first Enquiry is part of his wider critique of the Christian religion, it is nevertheless widely held that Hume’s earlier discussion “Of liberty and necessity” in the Treatise carries none of this irreligious content or significance. This view is itself encouraged by a more general understanding of the relationship between the Treatise and the first Enquiry which maintains that the Treatise lacks any significant irreligious content (because Hume “castrated” his work and removed most passages of this kind, perhaps including the passages at EU, 8.32–6). On this view of things, the elements of Hume’s discussion that are common to both Treatise 2.3.1–2 and Enquiry 8 are themselves without any particular religious or irreligious significance. To fully appreciate why this view is mistaken we would require a more detailed account of Hume’s fundamental irreligious intentions throughout the Treatise. (For this see Russell, 2008.) For our present purposes, however, it will suffice to provide a brief summary of the way in which Hume’s views on the subject of “liberty and necessity”, as presented in the Treatise, are themselves laden with irreligious significance.
According to the irreligious interpretation of Hume’s Treatise, the constructive or “positive” side of Hume’s thought in this work — his “science of man” — must be understood in terms of his concern to establish a secular, scientific account of moral and social life. Hume models his project on the same plan as Hobbes, who had pursued a similar project in The Elements of Law and the first two parts of Leviathan. The structural parallels that hold between Hobbes’s work and Hume’s Treatise are indicative of the fundamental similarity of their projects. Both Hobbes and Hume agree that moral and political philosophy must proceed upon the same scientific methodology that is appropriate to the natural sciences (although they disagree about the nature of that methodology), and they agree that this scientific investigation of morals and must begin with an examination of human understanding and the passions. The metaphysical basis of this project is their shared naturalistic and necessitarian conception of human beings.
The destructive or critical side of the philosophy of the Treatise is simply the other side of the same irreligious, anti-Christian coin. That is to say, in order to clear the ground to build the edifice of a secular, scientific account of moral life, Hume had to undertake a sceptical attack on the theological doctrines and principles that threatened such a project. The varied and apparently disparate sceptical arguments that he advances in the Treatise are in fact largely held together by his overarching concern to discredit and refute Christian metaphysics and morals. An especially prominent target of these sceptical arguments is the philosophy of Clarke (the best known and most influential critic of Hobbes's “atheism”). Among the various specific doctrines Hume was especially concerned to refute was that of (libertarian) free will — a doctrine that most prominent Christian moralists (e.g., Clarke, Butler, and many of Hume's early critics, including William Warburton, Thomas Reid and James Beattie) maintained was essential to both religion and morality.
The irreligious account of Hume's fundamental intentions in the Treatise puts his discussion of free will in a new light. Hume's necessitarianism is both metaphysically and methodologically a core part of his entire (Hobbist) project in this work. Beyond this, one of the central lessons of Hume's discussion “Of liberty and necerssity” in the Treatise, along with his more extended views about the nature and conditions of moral responsibility, is that these are issues that we can make sense of only within the fabric of human nature and human society. The metaphysics required by religious doctrine, Hume suggests, obscures and misrepresents the real character of human freedom and moral responsibility, and the way that they are grounded and structured in human motivation and passions. It is precisely this secular perspective and the extension of scientific naturalism to the study of (human) moral life that Clarke and other Christian critics of Hobbes found to be especially “dangerous” for religion and morality.
Throughout his writings, Hume’s philosophical interests and concerns were very largely dominated and directed by his fundamental irreligious aims and objectives. A basic theme in Hume's philosophy, so considered, is his effort to demystify moral and social life and release it from the metaphysical trappings of “superstition”. The core thesis of Hume's Treatise — indeed, of his overall (irreligious or “atheistic”) philosophical outlook — is that moral and social life neither rests upon nor requires the dogmas of Christian metaphysics. Hume's naturalistic framework for understanding moral and social life excludes not only the metaphysics of libertarianism (e.g., modes of “moral” causation by immaterial agents) but also all further theologically inspired metaphysics that generally accompanies it (i.e. God, the immortal soul, a future state, and so on). The metaphysics of religion, Hume suggests, serves only to confuse and obscure our understanding of these matters and to hide their true foundation in human nature. Hume's views on the subject of free will and moral responsibility, as presented in the sections “Of liberty and necessity” and elsewhere in his writings, are the very pivot on which this fundamental thesis turns.
In the entry above, we follow the convention given in the Nortons' Treatise and Beauchamp's Enquiries: we cite Book. Part. Section. Paragraph; followed by references to the Selby-Bigge/Nidditch editions. Thus T,188.8.131.52/ 34: will indicate Treatise Bk.1, Pt.2, Sec.3, Para.4/ Selby-Bigge pg.34. References to Abstract [TA] are to the two editions of the Treatise mentioned above (paragraph/page). In the case of the Enquiries I cite Section and Paragraph; followed by page reference to the Selby-Bigge edition. Thus EU, 12.1/ 149 refers to Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Sect.12, Para. 1 / Selby-Bigge pg. 149.
|T||A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge,
2nd ed. revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
|EU||Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, in Enquiries
concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of
Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by
P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
|EM||Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, in
Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the
Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition
revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1998
|ESY||Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary, rev. ed. by E.F. Miller (Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1985).|
|DP||“A Dissertation on the Passions” , reprinted in A Dissertation of the Passions & The Natural History of Religion, edited by T.L.Beauchamp. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007.|
|D||Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (1779) in: Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, ed. by J.A.C. Gaskin (Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).|
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The above citations may be used as the basis for further reading on this subject in the following way. Influential statements of the classical interpretation of Hume's intentions can be found in Flew (1962), Penelhum (1975) and Stroud (1977). Prominent statements of 20th century classical compatibilism that are generally taken to follow in Hume's tracks include Schlick (1939), Ayer (1954) and Smart (1961). Davidson (1963) provides an important statement of the causal theory of action based on broadly Humean principles. A complete statement of the naturalistic interpretation is provided in Russell (1995), esp. Part I. For a critical response to this study see Penelhum (1998; 2000a), and also the earlier exchange between Russell (1983, 1985) and Flew (1984). The contributions by Botterill (2002) and Pitson (2002, 2006) follow up on some the issues that are at stake here. For an account of Hume's views on punishment – a topic that is closely connected with the problem of free will – see Russell (1990) and Russell (1995 – Chp. 10). For a general account of the 18th century debate that Hume was involved in see Harris (2005). See also O'Higgins introduction [in Collins (1717)] for further background. The works by Hobbes, Locke, Clarke and Collins, as cited above, are essential reading for an understanding of the general free will debate that Hume was involved in. Smith (1759) is a valuable point of contrast in relation to Hume's views, insofar as Smith develops a naturalistic theory of responsibility based on moral sentiment (which Strawson follows up on). However, Smith does not discuss the free will issue directly (which is itself a point of some significance). In contrast with this, Reid (1788) is perhaps Hume's most effective and distinguished contemporary critic on this subject and his contribution remains of considerable interest and value. With respect to Hume's views on free will as they relate to his more general irreligious intentions see Russell (2008 – esp. Chp. 16). Similar material is covered in Russell (forthcoming). The relevance of Hume's views on free will to his “Hobbist” project in the Treatise is discussed in Russell (1985) and, in further detail, in Russell (2008 – esp. Chps. 6,16,18). Garrett (1997) provides a lucid overview and careful analysis of Hume's views on liberty and necessity, which includes discussion of the theological side of Hume's arguments and concerns. Helpful introductions discussing recent developments in compatibilist thinking, which are of obvious relevance for an assessment of the contemporary value of Hume's views on this subject, can be found in McKenna (2004) and Kane (2005). Among the various points of contrast not discussed in this article, Frankfurt (1971) is an influential and important paper that aims to advance the classical compatibilist strategy beyond the bounds of accounts of freedom of action. However, as noted in the main text of this article, the work of P.F. Strawson (1962, 1985) is of particular importance in respect of the contemporary significance and relevance of Hume's naturalistic strategy. Various recent responses to Strawson's naturalism can be found in McKenna and Russell (2008). For important and insightful statements of the Strawsonian or naturalistic approach to issues of free will and moral responsibility see Wallace (1994), McKenna (2012), and Shoemaker (forthcoming).
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I am grateful to Joe Campbell for his comments and suggestions.