## The Validity of the Argument

That the argument is deductively valid can be seen as follows. First, let us introduce the following abbreviations:

• $$\textit{State}(x)$$: $$x$$ is a state of affairs
• $$\textit{Dying}(x)$$: $$x$$ is a state of affairs in which an animal dies an agonizing death in a forest fire
• $$\textit{Suffering}(x)$$: $$x$$ is a state of affairs in which a child undergoes lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer
• $$\textit{Bad}(x)$$: $$x$$ is intrinsically bad or undesirable
• $$\textit{Omnipotent}(x)$$: $$x$$ is omnipotent
• $$\textit{Omniscient}(x)$$: $$x$$ is omniscient
• $$\textit{MorallyPerfect}(x)$$: $$x$$ is morally perfect
• $$\textit{PreventsExistence}(x,y)$$: $$x$$ prevents the existence $$y$$
• $$\textit{God}(x)$$: $$x$$ is God
• $$\textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(x,y)$$: $$x$$ has the power to prevent the existence of $$y$$ without hereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good

The argument just set out can then be formulated as follows:

• (1) $$\exists x [ \textit{State}(x) \wedge ( \textit{Dying}(x) \vee \textit{Suffering}(x) ) \wedge \textit{Bad}(x) \wedge \forall y ( \textit{Omnipotent}(y) \rightarrow \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(y,x) ) ]$$
• (2) $$\forall x [ \textit{State}(x) \rightarrow \forall z \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(z,x) ]$$
• (3) $$\forall x \forall y [ ( \textit{Bad}(x) \wedge \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(y,x) \wedge \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(y,x) ) \rightarrow \neg ( \textit{Omniscient}(y) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(y) ) ]$$

Therefore, from (1), (2), and (3),

• (4) $$\forall x \neg [ \textit{Omnipotent}(x) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(x) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect(x)}]$$
• (5) $$\forall x [ \textit{God}(x) \rightarrow (\textit{Omnipotent}(x) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(x) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(x) )]$$

Therefore,

• (6) $$\neg \exists x [God(x)]$$

The premises here are (1), (2), (3), and (5), and they can be shown to entail the conclusion, (6), as follows.

### The Inference from (1), (2), and (3) to (4)

• (i) $$\textit{State}(A) \wedge (\textit{Dying}(A) \vee \textit{Suffering}(A)) \wedge \textit{Bad}(a) \wedge \forall y (\textit{Omnipotent}(y) \rightarrow \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(y,A))$$
From (1), via EE (Existential Elimination).
• (ii) $$\forall z \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(z,A)$$
From (2) and 1st conjunct of (i) by UE and MP.
• (iii) $$\textit{Omnipotent}(G)$$
Assumption for conditional proof (‘$$G$$’ arbitrary)
• (iv) $$\textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(G,A)$$
From 4th conjunct of (i), by instantiating ‘$$G$$’ and using MP.
• (v) $$\neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(G,A)$$
From (ii), by UE.
• (vi) $$\textit{Bad}(A) \wedge \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(G,A) \wedge \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(G,A))$$
Conjoin 3rd conjunct of (i) with (iv) and (v).
• (vii) $$\neg(\textit{Omniscient}(y) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))$$
From (3) and (6), by UE and MP.
• (viii) $$\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \rightarrow \neg(\textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))$$
Conditional Proof, (iii)–(vii).
• (ix) $$\neg(\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))$$
From (viii), by the equivalence of $$A \rightarrow B$$ with $$\neg(A \wedge \neg B)$$, double negation elimination, and associativity of conjunctions.
• (x) $$\forall x \neg(\textit{Omnipotent}(x) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(x) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(x))$$
From (ix), via UI (Universal Introduction), since ‘$$G$$’ was arbitrary.

### The Inference from (4) and (5) to (6)

• (i) $$\neg(\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))$$
From (4), via universal insantiation, and where ‘$$G$$’ is arbitrary.
• (ii) $$\textit{God}(G) \rightarrow (\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))$$
From (5) by universal instantiation.
• (iii) $$\neg \textit{God}(G)$$
From (i) and (ii) by modus tollens.
• (iv) $$\forall x \neg(\textit{God}(x))$$
From (iii) by universal generalization, since ‘$$G$$’ was arbitrary.
• (v) $$\neg \exists x (\textit{God}(x))$$
From (iv), by interdefinability of quantifiers.
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.