Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Related Issues

Davidson's philosophy is extraordinarily systematic and innovative, and Anomalous Monism is only one of his fundamental contributions to the philosophical landscape. In this supplement, we look at issues that have arisen in considering how Anomalous Monism relates to two of the other pillars of his work: the rejection of conceptual relativism and its underlying dualism between conceptual scheme and uninterpreted empirical content, which Davidson refers to as the “third dogma of empiricism”, and the semantic externalist thesis that the determinants of linguistic meaning and mental content lie in the external world rather than on the surfaces of, or even further within, persons' bodies. There are interesting questions about the relationship between each of these doctrines and Anomalous Monism.

1. Anomalous Monism and Scheme-Content Dualism

Davidson (1974a) argued against a traditional distinction underlying modern and much contemporary philosophy between concepts or conceptual schemes and empirical content—intuitions or uninterpreted sensory events. The argument turns largely on the connection between those ideas and the notion of an untranslatable language. Davidson argued that this notion must be rejected, and that doing so largely eliminated the threat of conceptual relativism, providing a sort of guarantee that our most fundamental beliefs are by and large true. The details of the argument will not concern us here. However, a number of critics have claimed that Davidson's rejection of conceptual relativism and its underlying dualism between conceptual scheme and empirical content is inconsistent with one or another premise in his argument for anomalous monism. McDowell suggested that the cause-law principle was in tension with it. Manuel di Pinedo has more recently argued that both the cause-law principle as well as Davidson's related extensionalism about events—and therefore his token-identity theory of mind—are inconsistent with it. And Solomon early on suggested that mental anomalism conflicts with it (Solomon 1974). In this section we look briefly at these issues.

McDowell suggested that Davidson's commitment to the cause-law principle was in tension with Davidson's rejection of scheme-content dualism—the so-called “third dogma” of empiricism (McDowell 1985; Davidson 1974a)—and in effect constituted a fourth dogma of empiricism. McDowell does not think the cause-law principle is needed for a minimal version of materialism, and claims that without the need to justify materialism there is no rationale for it in Davidson's framework.

One way of parsing McDowell's idea is that the only plausible rationale for the requirement of strict covering laws for singular causal relations is based on the Humean claims, first, that we can't perceive singular causal relations, and, second, that therefore the only way to distinguish between events that are causally related and those that stand in a relation of mere temporal succession is to bring in the concept of regular succession, with its close ties to the notion of a strict covering law. Scheme-content dualism supposedly enters into Hume's argument with the idea that the concept of necessary connection stands distinct from the content of the experience of singular events (McDowell 1985, 398). As we have already seen (3.2–3), however, Davidson's argument in support of the cause-law principle does not appeal to any such claim, and so while it may well be true that this principle bears some relation to the third dogma, how it does isn't apparent in Davidson's actual thinking. The mere fact that Davidson is arguing in favor of the cause-law principle does not itself entail a commitment to the Humean view of the content of the experience of singular events that invites the worry. As McDowell himself notes, Davidson is not offering a reduction or analysis of singular causal statements in terms of the principle, but is merely stating a necessary condition for such statements. It is not at all obvious that insisting on such a condition forces a position either way on scheme-content dualism.

De Pinedo (2006) offers one way to clarify the supposed relation between the cause-law principle and the third dogma, by focusing on Davidson's metaphysics of events. In particular, de Pinedo emphasizes that Davidson's argument for monism depends upon the extensionalist view that the same event can be described in different vocabularies. As we saw in 1, Davidson had pointed out that Hume's covering law requirement is not committed to the idea that the vocabulary in which the singular events are picked out must be the vocabulary in which the covering law is formulated, and from this together with the extensionalist assumption moved to the monistic conclusion that anomic mental events have physical descriptions that instantiate strict laws. De Pinedo argues that this extensionalism is in direct conflict with Davidson's rejection of the third dogma, because it entails that the events variously described are “noumenal” (di Pinedo 2006, 86–90, using Kant's term for things in themselves, independent of conceptualization), and that positing them depends upon a “schemeless method” for individuating events (de Pinedo 2006, 87)—one that “allows us to say that the same event is both the one described by the nomological vocabulary of physics and by the normative vocabulary of psychology”. And he claims that Davidson's criterion for event-individuation—that two events are identical if and only if they share all causes and effects—is precisely an attempt to provide such a method (de Pinedo 2006, 83–84). Since the ideas of “noumenal” events and “schemeless” individuation methods seem so intimately caught up with the third dogma, di Pinedo claims that their source—extensionalism—and bounty—token-identity—must both be rejected.

Extensionalist criteria (whether it is Davidson's earlier causal or later spatiotemporal version) are supposed to be a “schemeless” method because they apply indiscriminately to all events, no matter how they are described. Davidson needs such an indiscriminate criterion in order to derive monism, but according to de Pinedo is not entitled to it precisely because of the basis for mental anomalism—that the constitutive criteria for the mental and the physical are distinct. de Pinedo asks:

From where does Davidson get his token-identities then? What area of our picture of reality can simultaneously capture nomological and anomalous features of the same event? …the identities…do not fit any of our conceptual devices. Davidson is defenseless against the accusation that that such identities are noumenal. (de Pinedo 2006, 89)

De Pinedo's objection seems to be that any particular claim that this mental event is token-identical to that physical event cannot be made from the perspective of either the mental or the physical explanatory schemes, and there is no other explanatory scheme from which to make such a claim. So it can only be made from a schemeless perspective—which makes it noumenal and thus in conflict with Davidson's rejection of the third dogma. As de Pinedo says,

which entities get related to which other entities cannot be postulated independently of the conceptual framework needed to make sense of such relations. But, famously, that framework excludes laws connecting mental and physical predicates. (di Pinedo 2006, 83)

This presumably is behind de Pinedo's related point that Davidson's distinction between causal relations and causal explanations is also in conflict with his rejection of the third dogma because of its basis in the extensionalist view of events (di Pinedo 2006, 83).

Three points need to be addressed in response to di Pinedo. First, extensionalism by itself does not entail that there are possible correct descriptions of events that are radically different from the familiar descriptions of our current scheme or some conservative extension of it. It is only if such descriptions—ones that are not translatable—are possible that the conclusion might follow that the events are “noumenal”. And, most importantly, there is nothing in the extensionalist picture itself that entails this, and Davidson's own argument that tells against their possibility. This shows that Davidson's extensionalism and rejection of the third dogma are fully consistent with each other.

Second, de Pinedo appears to think that for something to be an explanatory framework it must issue in strict laws. If this were true, then the most basic sorts of event-identity claims—for instance, between the most newsworthy event of the day and the bridge's collapse—would have to be rejected because belonging to distinct frameworks. Furthermore, an explanatory scientific framework relating specific physical and mental properties does exist (see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism). The fact that it can't issue in exceptionless laws relating the two does not mean it is illusory—Davidson himself is clear on this in allowing for ceteris paribus relations between the mental and physical schemes. And while there may be philosophical and empirical problems concerning how to justify particular claims of token-identities, we have seen that they don't affect Davidson's considered view of monism (5.2).

Third, as we have seen, Davidson's monism is not in any case based in particular identifications of mental and physical events, but rather in an a priori argument. So de Pinedo's questions above must be understood to be concerned with the perspective from which such a priori philosophical claims generally are made, because they typically are made about explanatory frameworks and not within them—for instance, the question of how the mental and physical frameworks relate to each other, and the question whether we can make sense of alternative conceptual schemes. These sorts of questions arise from within our general conceptual scheme, when we look at its various commitments and explore their consistency. One of philosophy's central tasks has always been to probe the foundations and relations between explanatory frameworks.

Davidson made a related point to a related concern expressed early on by Robert Solomon, who asked how Davidson's rejection of conceptual relativism could be squared with his assertion of mental anomalism and its claim that the mental and physical schemes are incommensurable (Solomon 1974, 66). Solomon assumed that Davidson's rejection of conceptual relativism entailed that all explanatory schemes must be commensurable—inter-translatable—and thus mutually reducible. Davidson replied by pointing out that his rejection of conceptual relativism and incommensurability concerns an entire language—

nothing… can be left out that is needed to make sense of the rest….Psychological concepts…cannot be reduced…to others. But they are essential to our understanding of the rest. (Davidson 1974c, 243–44)

Davidson's point is that the incommensurability posited by mental anomalism holds between subparts of one full-blown language, not between two such languages. Psychological concepts are essential to understanding language because of the ineliminable role they play in communication and interpretation. One key point Davidson is making here, which is relevant to the previous discussion of de Pinedo, is that our conceptual scheme already contains ceteris paribus laws relating the mental and the physical that we rely upon in understanding each other. Scientific investigation into the relation between mental and physical events is a refinement of an already existing framework—limited, according to mental anomalism, but nonetheless explanatory and fruitful.

2. Mental Anomalism and Semantic Externalism

Semantic externalism holds that the meanings of linguistic expressions and/or the contents of mental states and events are constituted, at least in part, by objects and events in the external world. In this section we look at Davidson's commitment to this doctrine and its relationship to mental anomalism. In some ways, formulating the issues in terms of mental content and thoughts makes the philosophical stakes clearer: according to semantic externalism, without an external world, there would be no mental content to thoughts. And mental anomalism is in the first instance formulated in mental rather than linguistic terms. However, the issues carry over without significant remainder for Davidson. For ease of exposition, our discussion will, depending on context, be alternately framed in terms both of meaning, utterances or expressions and in terms of content and thoughts. As we have seen (4.3), the causal definition argument interprets mental anomalism as flowing from Davidson's independent commitments concerning the casual nature of mental concepts. Semantic externalism is essentially a thesis about the casual constitution of mental content by external objects and events. So it provides additional support for the causal definition argument's approach to mental anomalism.

Davidson argues that mental contents are determined by their external, environmental causes—“water” refers to H2O because H2O is the systematic cause of tokenings of “water” during its period of acquisition by an agent. Another agent could mean, and therefore think, something different by “water”—the substance XYZ instead—because of differences in the environment and history of acquisition of their concept. Davidson claims that this entails psychophysical anomalism. He argues that two agents could be in identical internal physical conditions while thinking different thoughts expressed by “water”, and thus realizing different mental properties, because their respective histories of causal interaction and acquisition of the relevant concepts are different. If this is the case, then semantic externalism rules out the possibility of strict laws of the form ‘P1 → M1’ (Davidson 1987a, 1995b).

A natural response to this argument is that if the environments of the two agents are different, and this is responsible for their semantic divergence, then that environmental difference simply needs to be folded into the relevant laws, which are of course massively underdescribed anyway (clearly more than P1 by itself is needed to guarantee any effect, and thus M1). Thus, in the H2O world, ‘P1 & P2 → M1’ would hold, while in the XYZ world, ‘P1 & P3 → M2’ would hold, with ‘P1’ and ‘P2’ in each law representing the semantically relevant environmental differences of the two worlds. This maneuver would effectively block counterexamples of the kind suggested by Davidson's argument by preventing the same antecedents of laws—which only as a set guarantee the consequent—from being met by two individuals with different histories of acquisition, and thus different concepts. This response would thereby do away with any exceptions to the laws based on semantic externalism. It would thereby block Davidson's argument from semantic externalism to mental anomalism.

However, there are externalist thought experiments intended to show that two individuals could be in globally physically indiscernible circumstances and yet still be mentally distinct—either with different thoughts, or with one thinking thoughts and the other having no thoughts at all. Davidson develops the latter sort of case (1987a, 443–44), in which a creature is imagined emerging ex nihilo, with no causal history at all, yet physically identical to another individual. In this case, Davidson claims that the new creature would simply lack all thought content because of lack of any history of acquisition. In the former sort of case (see Boghossian 1989), an agent from one world is transported to the other world, retaining her original thought contents because of the history of acquisition condition, and therefore constituting a counterexample to that new world's laws. Both cases would effectively prevent the maneuver of folding environmental differences into the relevant laws so as to block the counterexamples, because the global physical indiscernibility of the imagined worlds (essentially amounting to the two creatures inhabiting the same world) provides nothing on which to pin the semantic divergence. If such cases are convincing, then no strict psychophysical laws with mental consequents would be possible, because of the possibility of such counterexamples to any laws relating physical antecedents to mental consequents. (For discussion of these issues, see Shea 2003.)

Many questions arise concerning these thought experiments, primarily regarding the nature of or need for a history of acquisition condition and its bearing across worlds. But many other aspects of these cases are controversial, not the least of which is the basic externalist doctrine that the contents of thoughts and meanings of expressions derive essentially from distal environmental causes, as opposed to sensory surface stimulations or even internal brain processing. But we have at least seen how Davidson conceives of the relation between mental anomalism and semantic externalism, and how it illustrates the causal definition argument's key claim that it is due to the causal nature of mental states that strict psychophysical laws are impossible.

A different connection between semantic externalism and mental anomalism in Davidson's thinking has been explored by Yalowitz (1998a,b), who lays out the framework of an extended debate between Davidson and Quine over the nature of language and thought and the scientific status of psychology. According to Yalowitz's reading, they share three key assumptions in that debate. First, that the scientific status of an explanatory framework depends upon its potential for delivering strict laws (this is largely definitional). Second, that the most promising approach to semantics is a causal theory, which in broad stroke holds that the objects or events that cause an utterance to be tokened by an agent determine the meaning of that utterance. And third, that there is a puzzle about whether strict causal laws are consistent with a coherent semantic theory. The puzzle is that any adequate semantic theory must be able to make sense of the notion of mistaken usage of an expression or tokening of a mental content, because meanings/contents are individuated by their conditions of correct usage—what makes “water” mean or apply to what it does is determined by conditions under which “water” is correctly tokened. A first pass at a strict semantic-determining law might say something like the following: ‘for all x's, if x causes y to be tokened, then y means x’. And in holding that whatever causes a y to be tokened determines the meaning of y, no room would be made for cases of error—cases where some z causes y to be tokened, but y nonetheless counts as mistakenly applied to z. The point is that all sorts of things stand in causal relations to tokenings. There is a considerable problem of determining which of these myriad causes constitutes the conditions of correctness, rather than occasions of mistaken usage. Without such a distinction, the most basic condition of adequacy for a semantic theory will not have been met.

According to Yalowitz, Quine and Davidson diverge in how to deal with this problem of error. Quine, committed to providing a scientific framework for semantics, holds on to the requirement that semantics issue in strict semantic-determining laws, and responds to the problem of error by holding that mistaken utterances of an individual can be identified only relative to a norm established by the usage of other speakers of the same language. Individuals considered in isolation, then, cannot be assigned meanings. Individuals must share a language with others, relative to which their usage can gauged for correctness, in order for the utterances to mean something—to have conditions of correctness. Further, according to Quine, in order for semantic laws to be strict the conditions of correctness must be located proximally rather than distally, in the sensory stimulations on the bodily surfaces of individuals' bodies rather than in the external environment of objects and events shared by them. As Davidson observes, the further out one goes in the causal chain extending beyond a person's skin, the greater chance there is that the chain can be interfered with, with the result that the appropriate behavior is not triggered (Davidson 1992, 262). The proximal cause thus

has the best claim to be called the stimulus, since the more distant an event is causally the more chance there is that the causal chain will be broken. (Davidson 1989, 197)

Here Yalowitz identifies a fourth key assumption shared by Quine and Davidson: that degree of distance between cause and effect bears directly on the possibility of strict lawful relations (on which see further below). Quine therefore deals with (1) the problem of accounting for the possibility of error (2) within a scientific semantic framework by requiring both that individuals share languages with others (which responds to (1)), and that meaning is determined by proximal as opposed to distal causes (which responds to (2)).

According to Yalowitz's reading, Davidson's general approach to semantics and to the possibility of a scientific psychology is formulated largely in response to these positions of Quine's. The key divergence comes in Davidson's rejection of Quine's solution to the problem of accounting for error and thus conditions of correctness. For Davidson, this specific sort of communal solution to the problem of error leads to an objectionable sort of relativism which is inadequate for a genuinely objective notion of error (Davidson 1984, xix; 1990, 309). The possibility of error cannot be due merely to the relationship between different individuals' overlapping linguistic dispositions. Otherwise, the notion of truth will be reduced to mere agreement. It thus must be reflected directly in semantic-determining laws governing individuals' usage. The issue, then, is how to do this. Davidson goes on to reject Quine's location of the conditions of correctness that determine meaning proximally, on individuals' bodily surfaces, in response to this problem. Instead, he insists that conditions of correctness must be located in the shared external environment of individuals. We have seen that this increase in distance, according to Davidson, allows for greater possibility of interference in the chain between cause (condition of correctness) and effect (utterance). This interference thus allows for a more slack relation between conditions of correctness and utterances that in turn allows Davidson to make sense of the notion of error without appealing to a shared language community. Since, then, strict semantic laws cannot account for error, and are tied to proximal conditions of correctness, Davidson insists on distal conditions of correctness and the subsequent anomic—ceteris paribus—semantic laws expressing them, which have the slackness necessary for accounting for the possibility of error. Semantic externalism is thus motivated in large part by the key condition of adequacy for semantic theory—accounting for the possibility of error and thus conditions of correctness for meanings and concepts. And mental anomalism is claimed to be necessary for accounting for error and thus meaning and content.

Yalowitz's reading of how semantic externalism and mental anomalism are related is largely historical and reconstructive. While it makes clear contact with some of Davidson's statements concerning these issues, and highlights the significant and longstanding philosophical (and, indeed, personal) relationship between Davidson and Quine going back to Davidson's graduate study at Harvard, there is much that it doesn't account for, and many points of detail that require fleshing out. Further, as Yalowitz himself notes, it commits Davidson to a rather unconvincing argument for both mental anomalism and semantic externalism. It is clearly false that degree of distance between cause and effect is tied to the distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws. The greater possibility of interference by itself doesn't force an anomalous relation between cause and effect. It simply requires a broadening of the conditions in the antecedent of the law, leaving wide open the question of whether this broadening can be completed—fully articulated—to the point of providing a strict law. If that is not possible, and such laws are essentially ceteris paribus, this has nothing especially to do with the possibility of interference by itself. Therefore, the connection between the possibility of error, mental anomalism and semantic externalism is not as straightforward as Yalowitz's reading suggests. However, Yalowitz's framing of the debate between Davidson and Quine on these issues and its bearing on Davidson's views concerning semantic externalism and mental anomalism does have the virtue of providing for a kind of bridge between the two very different readings of the argument for mental anomalism (4.2–4.3). While it locates concerns about the causal definition of mental concepts as fundamental to that argument, its focus on the normative notion of error—mistaken usage—is intimately related to concerns about rationality. For Davidson, to be rational requires applying concepts, and concepts require conditions of correctness. Assuming a causal approach to determining such conditions, the line of argument Yalowitz reconstructs holds that both mental anomalism and semantic externalism are needed in order to make sense of concepts and therefore rationality. While perhaps not as tightly related as this reconstruction portrays, these several theses are clearly absolutely central to Davidson's philosophy of mind generally, and therefore Anomalous Monism.

Copyright © 2012 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

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