Notes to Francisco Suárez

1. Some of the material in this entry draws from the authors' previously published work. In particular Section 1 draws from Schwartz 2012b; Section 2 from Shields 2012a, 2012b, and 2012c; Section 4 from Schwartz 2008; and Section 5 from Schwartz 2012c.

2. The biographical section is almost entirely based on the still unsurpassed Scorraille 1914; references below are from the Spanish translation: Scorraile 2005.

3. Alfonso Mendes, a Portuguese Jesuit missionary to Ethiopia, then made Patriarch of the Ethiopian Church, cites Suárez profusely in his account of the fundamentals of Catholic theology: Mendes 1692.

4. As the Polish Jesuit Thomas Ignatius Dunyn Szpot reported in his as yet unpublished Historia Sinarum, 1641–1687, f. 69v (Part III, Book I, n. 4):

… at that time, in the city of Hangzhou there was a Christian convert of the Zhu family whose name was Cosma …. He was so brilliant that, once he had understood the complexities of Philosophy and Theology from Father Martini, he wished to translate into his language the entire work of father Francisco Suárez that Martini had started to translate and explain for him in Chinese.

Cited from Martini 1998: 489–490, with thanks to Luisa Paternicò for providing the reference and translating the Latin.

5. This is slowly being rectified. See the second section of the Bibliography for a complete list of the parts of Metaphysical Disputations currently available in English translation.

6. Disputaciones metafísicas, Sergio Rábade Romeo, Salvador Caballero Sánchez, and Antonio Puigcerver Zanón (eds), Madrid: Gredos, 1960–1966, 7 vols.

7. Schopenhauer, A., Sämtliche Werke vol. 4, ed. E. Grisebach, p. 70.

8. Citations of Metaphysical Disputations (DM) follow the normal practice of dividing the work into disputation, section, and subsection within that section. So, “DM I 1.26” here, refers to the 26th sub-section of first section of the first disputation. Almost all secondary literature follows some version of this pattern.

9. The word “ontologia” was already used by Rudolf Golcenius in his Lexicon philosophicum (1613), that is, during Suárez's own lifetime. Nevertheless, it seems to have moved into broader currency only after the publication of Christian Wolff's Philosophia prima sive ontologia (1730).

10. In the preface to DM, Suárez offers the following discursive overview of the entire treatise:

The first disputation in the present work explains just what that object is; and in this disputation we explain at the same time the sublimity, usefulness, and other attributes that authors normally explain in their introductions to the sciences. After that, in the first volume we carefully discuss the broadest and most universal concept of this object—namely, that by which it is called being—along with its properties and causes. I have gone on at more length than is normal in studying the causes [of being], because I believe that this study is both very difficult and also extremely useful for all of philosophy and theology. In the second volume we have taken up the less universal concepts of this same object, beginning with the division of being into created being and uncreated being, since this division has priority and is closer to the quiddity of being, as well as being more suited to the unfolding of the present doctrine, which then proceeds through the partitions that fall under these concepts to all the genera and grades of being that are contained within the bounds or limits of this science.

11. The ubiquitous scholastic phrase per se, here rendered by “as such”, is often, as here, a bit difficult to capture in English. Sometimes, but not always, it is meant to be contrasted with per accidens, “accidentally” or “co-incidentally”. In this definition of cause, per se functions to rule out cases where x depends on y, but not insofar as y is described as y. Thus, the town winemaker is also the town baker; it is perhaps true but misleading to say that the town solicitor was made drunk by ingesting the baker's wares.

12. Pasnau 2004 collects and discusses a series of like sentiments. For a more detailed discussion of Suárez's treatment of substantial form, see Shields 2012a and 2012b.

13. O.S.D. V.7.3. See O.S.D. V.7.3.

14. Disputatio de Bello (disp. 13), from De triplici virtute theologici, in Suárez, Opera omnia XII, cited as DDB.

15. See Cajetan's commentary on Thomas Aquinas 1895: 312–313? (II–II q. 96 a. 4), transl. in Reichberg, Syse and Begby 2006: 241–244.

Copyright © 2014 by
Christopher Shields <>
Daniel Schwartz <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.