Notes to Public Health Ethics

1. This SEP entry draws heavily on Powers and Faden, particularly in the sections so identified.

2. This line of reasoning is also comparable to the “set ground-rules for the sciences, then go where they take you” approach to the question of how to set limits for scientific inquiry.

3. Again, this is similar to the case of the free market: yes, by and large it is preferable to have free markets than not to have them, but this does not render specific aspects of its operations immune to criticism and reform from an ethical point of view.

4. An example could be outbreak of measles in Manhattan and other locations as a result of parents refusing the vaccine for their children. (Omer, Salmon, Orenstein, deHart, & Halsey 2009; Thompson et al. 2007)

5. This is a version of the “internal minorities” problem that plagues communitarianism in political philosophy. See for example (Kymlicka 1992)

6. The claim that smokers impose economic harms on the rest of us, and thus that reducing smoking saves society money, is empirically questionable. Within the health care system there may be some cost savings, but people who would have died in late middle age of smoking-related illnesses are likely now to live into their 70s and beyond, with ailments that will continue to impose costs on the health care system, perhaps exceeding the costs of what would have been their smoking-related causes of death. Similarly, costs to the social security system increase (because non smokers live longer), while revenues from taxes on smoking products decrease. (Cohen, Neumann, & Weinstein 2008; L. Russell 2009; L. B. Russell 1986)

7. Ignorance and false beliefs are not usually sufficient to make a preference subject to interference, and generally require supplementing by stronger considerations such as age or cognitive disability or harm to others (e.g. one’s child) on the basis of one’s own ignorance or false beliefs. In the normal course of things, we all have at least some preferences based on ignorance and false beliefs that proponents of soft paternalism nonetheless do not think can legitimately be interfered with unless there is some compelling reason to impute impairment of rationality beyond, say, weakness of will.

8. A humorous but poignant illustration of this is Aesop’s fable about the fox and the grapes: upon realizing he cannot jump high enough to reach the grapes he desperately wants, the fox decides he did not want the grapes to begin with. Notwithstanding the lightness of this example, the real significance of adaptive preferences is when they are formed in tragic circumstances of poverty and discrimination, where individuals convince themselves that they do not want the benefits of health or education or equal treatment and so on because of the excruciating difficulty of continuing to prefer what is out of one’s reach. Thus, individuals modify their preferences to their circumstances. In such cases, one arguably cannot take those preferences to indicate underlying values or decisions that ought not be interfered with.

9. This is often accompanied by a much stronger view of the legitimacy of external judgments about what is really in a person’s interest, and a stronger likelihood to question individuals’ own assessment of their best interests than alternative, softer versions of paternalism.

Copyright © 2010 by
Ruth Faden <>
Sirine Shebaya <>

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