Ordinary Objects

First published Thu Dec 8, 2011

Our everyday experiences present us with a wide array of objects: dogs and cats, tables and chairs, trees and their branches, and so forth. These sorts of ordinary objects may seem utterly unproblematic in comparison to entities like numbers, propositions, tropes, holes, points of space, and moments of time. Yet, on closer inspection, they are at least as puzzling, if not more so. Reflection on Michelangelo's David and the piece of marble of which it is made threatens to lead to the surprising conclusion that these would have to be two different objects occupying the same location and sharing all of their parts. Reflection on the availability of microphysical explanations for events that we take to be caused by ordinary objects threatens to lead to the conclusion that ordinary objects—if they do exist—never themselves cause anything to happen. And reflection on the possibility of alternative conceptual schemes, which “carve up the world” in radically different ways, makes our own conception of which objects there are seem intolerably arbitrary. Taken together, the various puzzles that arise in connection with ordinary objects make a powerful case for their elimination. And, in many cases, what seem to be the best responses to these puzzles require the postulation of legions of objects that we fail to notice despite their being right before our eyes.

In §1, I articulate a variety of ways of departing from our ordinary conception of objects, either by eliminating ordinary objects or by permitting more objects than we would ordinarily take to exist. In §§2–6, I examine the puzzles and arguments that are meant to motivate these departures. In §7, I examine some arguments in defense of the ordinary conception.

1. Ordinary and Revisionary Conceptions

1.1 The Ordinary Conception

We find ourselves naturally inclined to make certain judgments about which objects are before us in various situations. Looking at a pool table just before the break, we are naturally inclined to judge there to be sixteen pool balls on the table, perhaps various parts of the individual balls (their top and bottom halves), and no other macroscopic objects. Looking at my nightstand, I am naturally inclined to judge there to be an alarm clock, a lamp, their various parts (light bulb, buttons, cords), and nothing else. These sorts of judgments comprise what I will call the ordinary conception of objects.

Giving an adequate general characterization of the ordinary conception or of ordinary objects is no easy task. Very roughly, ordinary objects are objects belonging to kinds that we are naturally inclined to regard as having instances on the basis of our perceptual experiences: dog, tree, table, and so forth. Extraordinary objects, by contrast, are objects that belong to kinds that we are not ordinarily inclined to regard as having instances, and whose instances—if they do have any—are highly visible. (More on these in §1.3.)

Revisionary conceptions are conceptions of which objects there are that depart in one way or another from the ordinary conception. These include both eliminative conceptions, on which there are fewer ordinary objects than are recognized by the ordinary conception, and permissive conceptions, on which there are more highly visible objects than are recognized by the ordinary conception. I hasten to add that it is a matter of controversy whether various departures from what I am calling the ordinary conception deserve to be called “revisionary”. As we shall see in §7.1, many eliminativists and permissivists take their views to be entirely compatible with common sense and ordinary belief.

Our target question—namely, which highly visible objects exist—may be distinguished from related but independent questions concerning the nature of ordinary objects. Some views on these matters may seem to be at odds with common sense, for instance, the view that ordinary objects can't survive the loss of any of their parts, or that ordinary objects are all mind-dependent. But these views are entirely compatible with the ordinary conception, as characterized above, because they do not (or at least need not) have any revisionary implications regarding which objects there are at a given place and time. As we shall see, however, questions about the nature of ordinary objects are intimately connected with questions about which objects exist, insofar as certain views about the nature of these objects (including those just mentioned) provide the resources for resisting some of puzzles and arguments that motivate revisionary conceptions.

In what follows, I use ‘object’ in its narrow sense, which applies only to individual material objects and not to other sorts of entities like numbers or events, and I use ‘part’ in its ordinary sense, on which it is not true—or at least not trivially true—that things are parts of themselves.

1.2. Eliminative Conceptions

Eliminativists take there to be fewer ordinary objects than are recognized by the ordinary conception. Eliminativism is not the view that ordinary objects are not fundamental, or that they are “nothing over and above” their atomic parts, or that they do not count as “genuine substances”. It may be that such views also deserve the label ‘eliminativism’, but these are not the views that are motivated by the puzzles and arguments discussed below. Those puzzles and arguments purport to establish a much stronger claim about ordinary objects: that there are none.[1]

One way of distinguishing among the different varieties of eliminativism is by looking at the conditions under which they take some objects to together compose a further object. This is known as “the special composition question”. Nihilism is the thesis that there are no composite objects: every object is mereologically simple (i.e., partless). Together with the plausible assumption that ordinary objects (if they exist) are all composite objects, nihilism entails that there are no ordinary objects. Nihilists typically accept that there are countless microscopic objects: although there are “simples arranged dogwise” and “simples arranged statuewise”, there are no dogs or statues. But nihilism is also compatible with existence monism—the thesis that there is a single, all-encompassing simple (the cosmos, a.k.a. “the blobject”)—as well as the extreme nihilist thesis that there are no objects whatsoever.[2]

Since many of the arguments for eliminativism fall short of establishing that composition never occurs, it is open to eliminativists to reject nihilism. Indeed, eliminativists may allow that composition occurs at least as often as we ordinarily suppose (if not more often). They may, for instance, deny that there are statues without denying that there is a highly visible mass of clay occupying the exact location where we take the statue to be.[3]

Alternatively, non-nihilistic eliminativists may countenance only a special class of composites. Eliminativists often make an exception for persons and other organisms. Some, for instance, accept organicism, the thesis that some objects compose something just in case the activities of those objects constitute a life. In other words, organisms are the only composite objects. This leads to a somewhat less severe restriction on composition than nihilism, one which permits apple trees and mountain lions, but not apples or mountains.[4]

The motivations for making an exception for organisms vary. Van Inwagen (1990: Ch. 12) accepts organicism on the grounds that it yields the best answer to the special composition question that allows for one's own existence and physicality, while at the same time escaping various problems that arise for competing accounts. Merricks (2001: Ch. 4)—though he does not himself endorse organicism—argues that persons and some other composites must be recognized on account of their nonredundant causal powers. Making such exceptions naturally gives rise to concerns about the stability of the resulting positions, either because the reasoning behind allowing the exceptions threatens to generalize to all ordinary objects or because the arguments for eliminating ordinary objects threaten to generalize to the objects one wishes to permit.[5]

1.3 Permissive Conceptions

Permissivists take there to be more objects than are recognized by the ordinary conception. The different forms of permissivism may be divided into two broad categories: those that permit extraordinary objects, and those that permit a greater number of ordinary objects than are recognized by the ordinary conception.

Universalism—also known as conjunctivism or unrestricted mereological composition (or UMC)—is the thesis that, for any plurality of non-overlapping objects, those objects compose something. (‘Non-overlapping’ because ‘composition’ is typically defined in such a way that objects that share parts, like the left two-thirds of your body and the right two-thirds of your body, cannot count as composing something: the xs compose y iffdef the xs are parts of y and no two of the xs overlap and every part of y overlaps at least one of the xs.) Accordingly, universalists will typically accept that there are such extraordinary objects as trout-turkeys, where a trout-turkey is a single object composed of the undetached front half of a trout and the undetached back half of a turkey. These will be objects that have both fins and feathers and whose finned parts are typically a good distance from their feathered parts. However, universalism is also compatible with non-nihilistic eliminativist views according to which there are lots of composites but none of them count as trout, turkeys, fins, or feathers. This sort of hybrid view would still permit objects composed entirely of the contents of the scattered regions that we would ordinarily take to be occupied by the front half of a trout and the back half of a turkey.[6]

Diachronic universalism is the permissivist thesis that, for any times and any function from those times to sets of objects that exist at those times, there is an object that exists at just those times and has exactly those parts at those times. Roughly: there is an object corresponding to every filled region of spacetime. So, assuming that your kitchen table and living room table both exist, there also exists a klable—an object that's entirely made up of your kitchen table every day from midnight till noon and is entirely made up of your living room table from noon till midnight. This is an object which, twice a day, instantly and imperceptibly shifts its location.[7]

The doctrine of plenitude is the permissivist thesis that, for every function from worlds to filled regions of spacetime, there is an object that exists at just those worlds and that occupies exactly those regions at those worlds (cf. Hawthorne 2006: 53). Roughly: if the empirical facts don't directly rule out there being an object with a given modal property in a given location, then there is an object in that location with that modal property (cf. Eklund 2008: §4). When there is a red car parked in the garage, the empirical facts (e.g., that there is nothing blue there) do directly rule out there being an object in the exact location of the car which is necessarily blue. But they do not directly rule out there being an object there which is necessarily inside the garage: an incar. This is an extraordinary object which, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, cannot exist outside of a garage. As you begin to back out, the incar (if such a thing exists) shrinks and comes to be co-located with the part of the car that is still inside the garage. When you have finished pulling out, the incar has ceased to exist altogether.[8]

One further way of being a permissivist is by permitting a multitude of parts of ordinary objects that we are not naturally inclined to judge them to have. For instance, one might hold that, in addition to ordinary parts like arms and legs, you have extraordinary parts like leg complements, where your left-leg complement is an object made up of all of you except for your left leg. Together with some natural assumptions (e.g., about regions of space), leg complements and a legion of other extraordinary parts will be delivered by the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts—or DAUP—the thesis that for any material object o, if r is the region of space occupied by o, and if r′ is an occupiable sub-region of r, then there exists a material object that exactly occupies r′ and which is part of o. (Roughly: for every region of space within the boundaries of a given a object, that object has a part that exactly fills that region.)[9]

Next, let us consider some permissivist conceptions which permit a greater number of ordinary objects than are recognized by the ordinary conception.

Ordinary objects are constituted by (or made up out of) aggregates of matter. A gold ring is constituted by a certain piece of gold. Clay statues are constituted by lumps of clay. We are naturally inclined to regard the statue and the lump of clay that constitutes it as being a single object which simply belongs to multiple kinds (statue and lump of clay). Constitutionalism is the thesis that ordinary objects are typically (if not always) distinct from the aggregates of matter that constitute them. So constitutionalists will typically deny that the statue is in fact identical to the lump. (‘Typically’ because, in rare cases in which the ordinary object and the aggregate come into existence at the same time and cease to exist at the same time, some constitutionalists will take the ordinary object to be identical to the aggregate.)[10]

Same-kind permissivism is the thesis that in at least some cases (if not all cases) in which there seems to be a single object belonging to a certain familiar kind at a certain location, there are in fact a plurality of objects of that kind, partially or entirely co-located with it. So, for instance, where there appears to be a single ship in the harbor, there are multiple—perhaps countless—overlapping ships. Some endorse moderate varieties of same-kind permissivism on which, in special cases, ordinary objects are partially or entirely co-located with objects of the same kind. Others endorse a more radical version according to which ordinary objects are typically (if not invariably) partially co-located with objects of the same kind.[11]

2. Vagueness and Sorites Arguments

2.1 Kind Membership

Sorites arguments proceed from a premise to the effect that minute differences cannot make a difference with respect to whether some property F (or kind K) is instantiated to the conclusion that nothing (or everything) is F (or a K). Here is a sorites argument for the elimination of stones:

Every stone is composed of a finite number of atoms.
It is impossible for something composed of fewer than two atoms to be a stone.
For any number n, if it is impossible for an object composed of n atoms to be a stone, then it is impossible for an object composed of n+1 atoms to be a stone.
So there are no stones.

‘Atoms’ may be understood here as denoting chemical atoms (silicon, iron, carbon), as opposed to mereological atoms (a.k.a. simples). Premises A2 and A3 together entail that, for any finite number of atoms, nothing made up of that many atoms is a stone. But this, together with A1, entails that there are no stones.[12]

Similar arguments may be given for the elimination of individual ordinary objects. One can construct a sorites series of contiguous bits of matter, running from a bit of matter, mk, at the peak of Kilimanjaro to a bit of matter, mp, in the surrounding plains. From the sorites premise that a bit of matter that's n inches along the path from mp to mk is part of Kilimanjaro iff a bit of matter that's n+1 inches along the path is part of Kilimanjaro (for any number n), together with the fact that mp is not part of Kilimanjaro, we reach the absurd conclusion that mk isn't part of Kilimanjaro. So, by reductio, we may conclude that Kilimanjaro does not exist.[13]

Why accept A3? Imagine a series of cases, beginning with a case involving a single atom and terminating with a case involving what would seem to be a paradigm stone, where each case differs from the preceding case only by the addition of a single atom. It seems highly implausible that there should be adjacent cases in any such series where there is a stone in one case but not in the other. Rejecting A3 would look to commit one to just such a sharp cut-off.

But one can deny that A3 is true without accepting that there is a sharp transition from stones to non-stones in such series, that is, without accepting that there is some specific object in the series which definitely is a stone and whose successor definitely is not a stone. For one may instead hold that there are a range of cases in which it is vague whether the object in question is a stone.[14]

Here is an illustration of how that sort of strategy might go. Let S be some object in the series that clearly seems to be a stone, let NS be an object that clearly seems to be a non-stone, and let BS be an object that seems to be a borderline case of being a stone. One might suggest that ‘stone’ is vague as result of there being a range of candidate precise meanings (or “precisifications”) for the word ‘stone’,

all of which apply to S,
none of which apply to NS,
some but not all of which apply to BS, and
none of which is definitely the meaning of ‘stone’.

S is a stone’ is true because S falls under all of these precisifications of ‘stone’. ‘NS is a stone’ is false because NS doesn't fall under any of them. And ‘BS is a stone’ is neither true nor false because BS falls under some but not all of the precisifications. And then A3 itself turns out to be false: on every precisification of ‘stone’, there is some object in the series such that it but not its successor falls under that precisification. (This is sometimes known as a “supervaluationist” account.)[15]

2.2 Composition

It is natural to suppose that objects sometimes do, and other times do not, compose a further object. When a hammer head is firmly affixed to a handle, they compose something, namely, a hammer. When they're on opposite ends of the room, they don't compose anything. The following argument—commonly known as “the argument from vagueness” or “the vagueness argument”—purports to show that this natural assumption is mistaken.

If composition sometimes does and sometimes does not occur, then there can be a sorites series for composition.
Necessarily, every sorites series for composition contains either borderline cases of composition or a sharp cut-off with respect to composition.
There cannot be sharp cut-offs with respect to composition.
There cannot be borderline cases of composition.
So composition either always occurs or never occurs.

If the argument is sound then either universalism or nihilism must be correct, though which of them is correct would have to be decided on independent grounds.[16]

A sorites series for composition is a series of cases running from a case in which composition doesn't occur to a case in which composition does occur, where adjacent cases are extremely similar in all of the respects that one would ordinarily take to be relevant to whether composition occurs (e.g., the spatial and causal relations among the objects in question). Understood in this way, B1 should be unobjectionable. If it's true that a hammer head and handle compose something only once the hammer is assembled, then a moment-by-moment series of cases running from the beginning to the end of the assembly of a hammer would be just such a series. Premise B2 is trivial: any such series obviously must contain some transition from composition not occurring to composition occurring, and there either will or won't be a determinate fact of the matter about where exactly that transition occurs in any given series.

B3 is plausible as well. If composition occurs in one case but not in another, then surely there must be some explanation for why that is. In other words, the facts about composition are not “brute”. Yet the sorts of differences that one finds among adjacent cases in a sorites series for composition—for instance, that the handle and head are a fraction of a centimeter closer together in the one than in the other—can't plausibly explain why composition occurs in one case but not in the other.[17]

Certain sorts of eliminativists are well-positioned to resist B3 without having to accept that compositional facts are brute. Suppose, for instance, that one accepts a view on which conscious beings are the only composite objects. Such eliminativists will deny that there is a sorites series for composition running from the beginning to the end of the assembly process, since they will deny that anything is composed of the handle and head (or that there are a handle and head) even at the end of the series. Every sorites series for composition, by their lights, will have to run from a case in which there is some number of conscious beings to a case in which there is some other number of conscious beings. And assuming that that there can't be borderline cases of consciousness, every such series will contain a sharp cut-off with respect to the presence of the additional subject of consciousness. This, in turn, would serve to explain why composition occurs in the one case but not the other.[18]

Why, though, should anyone accept B4? On the face of it, it seems just as clear that there can be borderline cases of composition (e.g., when the hammer head is just beginning to be affixed to the handle) as it is that there can be borderline cases of redness and baldness. This is not, however, “just another sorites,” to be blocked in whichever way one blocks the sorites arguments in §2.1. That's because questions about when composition occurs look to be intimately bound up with questions about how many things exist. This suggests the following line of argument in defense of B4, no analogue of which is available for other sorts of sorites arguments.[19]

If there can be borderline cases of composition, then it can be indeterminate how many things exist.
It cannot be indeterminate how many things exist.
So, there cannot be borderline cases of composition.

To see the motivation for C1, notice that if the handle and head do compose something then there are three things: the handle, the head, and a hammer. If they don't, then there are only two things: the handle and head. And if it is vague whether they do, then it will be vague whether there are two things or three. As for C2, notice that one can specify how many things there are using what would seem to be entirely precise vocabulary. For any finite number, one can produce a “numerical sentence” saying that there are exactly that many concrete objects. Here, for instance, is the numerical sentence for two: ‘∃xy(xy & Cx & Cy & ∀z(Cz→(x=zy=z)))’. (The restriction to concrete objects ensures that numerical sentences aren't trivially false simply on account of there being infinitely many numbers, sets, and so forth.) And since these numerical sentences contain no vague vocabulary, it would seem to follow that it cannot be indeterminate how many things there are.

C1 can be resisted by denying that composition affects the number of things in the way suggested. For instance, one might contend that even before the handle and head definitely come to compose something, there exists an object—a “proto-hammer”—located in the region that the two of them jointly occupy. The proto-hammer definitely exists, but it is a borderline case of composition: it is indeterminate whether the handle and head compose the proto-hammer or whether they instead compose nothing at all (in which case the proto-hammer has no parts).[20]

Alternatively, one might resist C2 by pinning the vagueness on the quantifiers in the numerical sentence. After all, what seems to be vague is whether the handle and head are everything that there is and whether there is something other than the handle and head. But it is difficult to see how the quantifiers can be vague and, in particular, how their vagueness could be accounted for on the sort of precisificational account of vagueness discussed in §2.1.[21]

3. Puzzles about Identity

3.1 Material Constitution

The puzzles of material constitution reveal a tension between our intuitions about certain features of ordinary objects and our intuitions about which ordinary objects are identical to which. Here is one such puzzle. Let ‘Goliath’ name a certain clay statue and let ‘Lumpl’ name the lump of clay that constitutes it. What is puzzling is that all of the following seem true:

Goliath exists and Lumpl exists.
If Goliath exists and Lumpl exists, then Goliath = Lumpl.
Goliath has different properties from Lumpl.
If Goliath has different properties from Lumpl, then Goliath ≠ Lumpl.

The motivation behind D2 is that Goliath would seem to have exactly the same location and exactly the same parts as Lumpl. So ‘Goliath’ and ‘Lumpl’ are plausibly just different names for the same thing. The motivation behind D3 is that Lumpl and Goliath seem to have different modal properties: Lumpl is able to survive being flattened and Goliath isn't. D4 follows from the Principle of the Indiscernibility of Identicals (a.k.a. Leibniz's Law): ∀xy(x=y → ∀P(Px iff Py)). In other words, if x and y are identical, then they had better have all the same properties. After all, if they are identical, then there is only one thing there to have or lack any given property.[22]

The puzzles are sometimes taken to motivate eliminativism, since eliminativists can simply deny D1: there are no statues (and perhaps no lumps either).[23]

More often, however, the puzzles are taken to motivate constitutionalism. Constitutionalists will reject D2: clay statues are not identical to the lumps of clay that constitute them. Constitutionalists may deny that having the same parts at a given time suffices for identity, or they may instead deny that the statue and the lump have all of the same parts. Some constitutionalists— particularly those who accept that objects have temporal parts—opt for an alternative account of the puzzle if we suppose that Goliath and Lumpl are created simultaneously and then destroyed simultaneously. One of the main problems facing the constitutionalist solution is the grounding problem: the modal differences between Goliath and Lumpl (e.g., that the one but not the other can survive being flattened) as well as their difference in kind (viz., that the one is a statue and the other is not) seem to stand in need of explanation and yet there seems to be no further difference between them that is poised to explain, or ground, these differences.[24]

Defenders of the constitutionalist solution to these puzzles may, by similar reasoning, be led to accept a same-kind permissivist account of certain special cases. Suppose, for instance, that Bruce writes a letter to Bertha on one side of a piece of stationery and Bertha writes her reply on the other side. Since the letters were written at different times and convey different messages, the same sort of reasoning that leads one to reject D2 underwrites an argument that these letters are not identical. In other words, there are two exactly co-located objects, both of which are letters.[25]

Another option—which does not require embracing eliminative or permissive conceptions—would be to deny D3. For instance, one might deny that Lumpl and Goliath have different persistence conditions on the grounds that Goliath, like Lumpl, can survive being flattened. Or one might deny that they have different persistence conditions on the grounds that neither can survive being flattened: upon being flattened, Lumpl would cease to exist and a new lump would come into existence. Or one might deny that they have different persistence conditions, while conceding that Lumpl is able to survive being flattened and that Goliath is not able to survive being flattened, by postulating an equivocation on ‘able to survive being flattened’. (This is sometimes known as an “Abelardian” account.)[26]

3.2 Indeterminate Identity

A wooden ship is constructed and christened ‘Theseus II’. As planks come loose over the years, they are discarded and replaced. After three hundred years, the last of the original planks is replaced. Call the resulting ship ‘the mended ship’. The descendents of the original owners have been collecting the discarded original planks, and—three hundred years after the christening—they obtain the last of the original planks and construct a ship that is indistinguishable from the original ship. Call the resulting ship ‘the reconstructed ship’. Which, if either, of these two ships is identical to Theseus II? It is natural to suppose that there is no fact of the matter: it is indeterminate which of the two ships is Theseus II.

But those who wish to allow that this is a case of indeterminate identity face the following puzzle:

It is indeterminate whether Theseus II = the mended ship.
If so, then Theseus II has the property of being indeterminately identical to the mended ship.
The mended ship does not have the property of being indeterminately identical to the mended ship.
If Theseus II has this property and the mended ship lacks this property, then  Theseus II ≠ the mended ship.
If Theseus II ≠ the mended ship, then it isn't indeterminate whether Theseus II = the mended ship.

E2 through E4 together entail that Theseus II is not identical to the mended ship. This, together with E5, contradicts E1. So one of E1 through E5 has to go. Those who do not find themselves gripped by this particular example may replace it with an example involving “fission”, for instance, of an amoeba dividing in two.[27]

Eliminativists will reject E1. There are no ships, in which case ‘Theseus II’ and ‘the mended ship’ fail to refer to anything at all. If so, then ‘Theseus II = the mended ship’ is false (or, at least, untrue) on account of containing non-referring expressions. So E1 is false: it is not indeterminate but rather false that Theseus II = the mended ship. (Other claims, e.g., E3, will come out false for the same reason.)[28]

One might instead maintain that it is indeterminate which of various objects ‘Theseus II’ picks out. If that's right, then E2 is arguably false. One cannot infer the existence of an individual who is indeterminately identical to Sue from the fact that it is indeterminate whether Sue (or rather Morgan) is Harry's best friend. Analogously, one cannot infer the existence of an individual that is indeterminately identical to the mended ship from the fact that it is indeterminate whether Theseus II is the mended ship.[29]

The prima facie problem with this response is that there do not seem to be multiple objects such that it's indeterminate which one ‘Theseus II’ picks out. After all, when ‘Theseus II’ was first introduced, there was only one ship around to receive the name! One can address this problem by embracing same-kind permissivism and maintaining that, despite appearances, two ships were present at the christening: one that would later be composed of entirely different planks and another that would later be reassembled from a pile of discarded planks. What is indeterminate is which of these two temporarily co-located ships was christened ‘Theseus II’.[30]

Other responses are available which do not commit one to eliminative or permissive conceptions. One might reject E1 on the grounds that the object christened ‘Theseus II’ ceases to exist as soon as the first plank is discarded, either because ships have all of their parts essentially, or because the ship that existed at the time of the christening is not identical to any ship that exists at any earlier or later time. Or one might deny E2 on the grounds that there is no such property as the property of being indeterminately identical to Theseus II. Or one might resist E3 on the grounds that E3 doesn't actually follow the fact that it's not indeterminate whether Theseus II = Theseus II. Or one might deny E4 by denying that one may infer the distinctness of Theseus II and the mended ship from the fact that they do not share this property.[31]

4. Arguments from Strange Kinds

4.1 Arbitrariness

Arguments from arbitrariness turn on the observation that there would seem to be no ontologically significant difference between certain ordinary and extraordinary objects, that is, no difference between them that can account for why there would be things of the one kind but not the other. Here is an example (drawn from Hawthorne 2006: vii):

Islands exist.
There is no ontologically significant difference between islands and incars.
If there is no ontologically significant difference between islands and incars, then islands exist iff incars exist.
So incars exist.

The idea behind F2 is that islands and incars (see §1.3) would seem to be objects of broadly the same sort, namely, objects that cease to exist when their constitutive matter undergoes a certain sort of extrinsic change—being submerged at high tide in the one case, leaving a garage in the other. The idea behind F3 is that, if there truly are islands but no incars, then this is something that would seem to stand in need of explanation: there would have to be something in virtue of which it's the case. To think otherwise would be to take the facts about what exists to be arbitrary in a way that they plausibly are not.

Similar arguments may be used to establish the existence of leg-complements (on the grounds that there's no ontologically significant difference between them and legs) and trout-turkeys (on the grounds that there's no ontologically significant difference between them and scattered objects like solar systems).[32]

Eliminativists may of course resist the argument by denying F1.[33]

The argument may also be resisted by denying F2 and identifying some ontologically significant difference between islands and incars. For instance, according to conventionalists (a.k.a. constructivists, conceptualists, anti-realists), which objects there are is largely determined by which objects we take there to be. Accordingly, the very fact that we take there to be islands but not incars marks an ontologically significant difference between them.[34]

One may instead attempt to resist the claim that there is no ontologically significant difference between the strange and familiar kinds without endorsing conventionalism. In the case at hand, one might resist F2 by insisting that islands have importantly different persistence conditions from incars. Incars are meant to cease to exist when their matter undergoes some extrinsic change (ceasing to be inside a garage). But islands, contra hypothesis, do not cease to exist when they are completely submerged; they merely cease to be islands.[35]

How about F3? Part of why it seems arbitrary to countenance islands but not incars is that one would seem to be privileging islands over incars by virtue of taking them to exist. For this reason, proponents of certain deflationary ontological views are well-positioned to deny F3. Relativists, for instance, may maintain that islands exist and incars do not exist—relative to our conceptual scheme, that is. Relative to other possible schemes, incars exist and islands do not. Quantifier variantists, who maintain that there are counterparts of our quantifiers that are on a par with ours and that range over things that do not exist—but rather exist*—may maintain that islands exist but do not exist* while incars exist* but do not exist. On such views, islands and incars receive a uniform treatment at bottom; islands are not getting any sort of “special treatment” that cries out for explanation.[36]

4.2 Debunking Arguments

The arguments from arbitrariness raise metaphysical concerns about the ordinary conception of objects. But reflection on strange kinds also gives rise to epistemological concerns about the ordinary conception. We can easily imagine communities of intelligent beings who find it entirely natural to “carve up the world” into leg-complements or incars, just as we find it natural to carve up the world into legs and islands. These imaginative exercises are meant to call to our attention certain facts (“defeaters”) which, once we become aware of them, threaten to undermine our perceptual and intuitive justification for accepting the ordinary conception in the first place. Such debunking arguments do not purport to establish any particular revisionary theses. But if they are successful, they lend powerful support to those theses, by effectively neutralizing any reasons we might take ourselves to have for resisting the conclusions of the arguments for them.[37]

One common style of debunking argument turns on the claim that the biological and cultural factors that are responsible for our beliefs about which objects there are are entirely divorced from the facts about which objects there are. Let us say that the ultimate explanation of why one has the belief that p is alethic just in case the fact that p enters into the explanation of why one has that belief. The argument then runs as follows:

If the ultimate explanation for my belief that various ordinary objects exist is not alethic, then I am not justified in believing that they exist.
The ultimate explanation for my belief that various ordinary objects exist is not alethic.
So, I am not justified in believing that those objects exist.

G1 reflects a prima facie plausible constraint on justification. If there indeed is the envisaged sort of disconnect between the subject matter of a belief and the factors that lead us to the belief, then evidently it could only be by coincidence (or luck) if the belief turned out to be correct; but this realization plausibly undermines one's original justification. G2 is meant to be motivated by the aforementioned imaginative exercises. Had we been part of a community which spoke of incars rather than cars when confronted with atoms arranged carwise, we would surely have believed in incars rather than cars. This in turn is meant to motivate the claim that we believe in ordinary objects and not extraordinary objects because we are born into a culture in which is it customary to take there to be these things rather than those. Our belief in cars is explained entirely in terms of encounters with atoms arranged carwise together with the convention of taking there to be cars in such situations; the existence of cars does not enter into the explanation.[38]

Proponents of sufficiently permissive conceptions seem well-positioned to deny G1. They can admit that we could easily have come to have slightly or radically different conventions, and that we would then have judged there to be various kinds of extraordinary objects. But our beliefs are nonetheless safe: whichever conventions we had ended up with, our judgments about the existence of the relevant objects would still have been correct. The extraordinary objects are all already out there waiting to be noticed; all that our conventions do is determine which ones we do notice.[39]

Conventionalists and deflationists (see §4.1) will also reject G1. Conventionalists will maintain that our conventions are an excellent guide to which kinds exist, since these very conventions determine which kinds exist. Relativists will maintain that our conventions are an excellent guide to which kinds exist relative to the operative conceptual scheme, since our conventions determine which scheme is operative. Opponents of conventionalism may still wish to endorse a restricted version of the former strategy, insofar as they accept that creative intentions play a role in determining which kinds of artifacts exist.[40]

One might instead reject G2, by maintaining that the explanation of our beliefs about ordinary objects is alethic. For instance, one may maintain that the ultimate explanation for our experiences makes reference to the ordinary objects themselves, not just to their microscopic parts. Or one may maintain that the intuitions that underwrite these beliefs are responsive to the relevant facts about composition and kind membership: we have the intuition that atoms arranged carwise compose cars and not incars precisely because atoms arranged carwise compose cars and not incars. Or one may maintain that our beliefs correctly track which objects there in fact are as a result of our having been intelligently designed.[41]

5. Causal Overdetermination

Overdetermination arguments aim to establish that ordinary objects of various kinds do not exist, by way of showing that, if they exist, they don't do any distinctive causal work. Here is one such argument:

Every event either is or is not caused by atoms arranged baseballwise.
If an event is caused by atoms arranged baseballwise, then it isn't caused by a baseball.
If an event isn't caused by atoms arranged baseballwise, then it isn't caused by a baseball.
If no events are caused by baseballs, then there are no baseballs.
So there are no baseballs.

H1 through H3 together entail that no events are caused by baseballs, which together with H4 entails that baseballs do not exist. For the purposes of this argument, ‘atoms’ may be understood as a placeholder for whichever microscopic objects or stuff feature in the best microphysical explanations of observable reality. These may turn out to be the composite atoms of chemistry, they may be mereological simples, or they may even be a nonparticulate “quantum froth”.[42]

The argument for H2 runs as follows:

If an event is caused by atoms arranged baseballwise then: a baseball causes that event only if that event is overdetermined by the baseball and atoms arranged baseballwise.
No event is overdetermined by a baseball and atoms arranged baseballwise.
So, if an event is caused by atoms arranged baseballwise, then it isn't caused by a baseball.

Let us say that an event e is overdetermined by o1 and o2 just in case:

o1 causes e,
o2 causes e,
o1 is not causally relevant to o2's causing e,
o2 is not causally relevant to o1's causing e, and

This is best regarded this as a stipulation about how ‘overdetermined’ is to be understood in the argument, thus preempting nebulous debates about whether satisfying these five conditions “really” suffices for overdetermination. To say that o­1 is causally relevant to o2's causing e is to say that the complete causal explanation of how o2 causes e to occur makes reference to o­1. o1 might enter into such an explanation in a variety of ways: by causing o2 to cause e, by being caused by o2 to cause e, by jointly causing e together with o­2, or—where o2 is a plurality of objects—by being one of them.[43]

Can J1 be resisted? The idea would have to be that, although some events are caused both by atoms and by baseballs composed of those atoms, those events are not overdetermined (in the indicated sense). But if they are not overdetermined, then which of the five conditions for overdetermination do the baseball and the atoms fail to meet? This line of response takes for granted that (i) and (ii) are satisfied. And it is extremely plausible that (iii) and (iv) would be satisfied as well. However it is that baseballs “get in on the action”, it isn't by entering into the causal explanation of how the atoms manage to cause things. For instance, baseballs plainly don't cause their atoms to shatter windows; nor do their atoms cause them to shatter windows. So those who would deny J1 will need to deny that condition (v) is satisfied, by taking the baseball to be identical to the atoms. See §7.3 below for discussion of the thesis that objects are identical to their various parts.

But why accept J2? In certain cases (e.g., postulating “vital forces” even after accepting that all biological facts have a complete mechanistic explanation), overdetermination strikes us as an overt violation of Ockham's Razor: do not multiply entities beyond necessity. But given the intimate connection between baseballs and their atoms, it is natural to feel that even if these do count as cases of overdetermination (in the indicated sense), this isn't an especially objectionable sort of overdetermination. One may then attempt to resist J2 by articulating a further condition which distinguishes problematic from unproblematic cases of overdetermination. For instance, one might hold that overdetermination is unproblematic so long as o1 and o2 aren't entirely independent.[44]

Even supposing, however, that the line between objectionable and unobjectionable sorts of overdetermination can be drawn in some satisfactory way, there would still be pressure to accept J2. For suppose that the debunking arguments in §4.2 above are successful. In that case, we have no perceptual reasons for believing in baseballs and, a fortiori, no perceptual reasons for believing that baseballs shatter windows. Nor would there be any explanatory need to posit baseballs, if indeed there is a complete causal explanation for all of the relevant events wholly in terms of the activities of the atoms. But then we would seem to have no reason whatsoever to accept that there are baseballs, in which case we ought to accept J2.[45]

How about H3? To deny H3 would require maintaining that some things that are caused by baseballs are not also caused by their atoms. On one way of developing this line of response, baseballs “trump” their atoms: atoms arranged baseballwise can't collectively cause anything to happen so long as they're parts of the baseball. On another, there is a “division of causal labor”: baseballs cause events involving macroscopic items like the shattering of windows, while their atoms cause events involving microscopic items like the scatterings of atoms arranged windowwise. Both strategies, however, look to be in tension with the plausible claim that there is a complete causal explanation for every physical event wholly in terms of microphysical items. Moreover, this line of response would seem to require that baseballs have emergent properties—causally efficacious properties that cannot be accounted for in terms of the properties of their atomic parts—which may seem implausible.[46]

Premise H4 can be motivated in much the same way as J2. If baseballs don't cause anything to happen, and if (as the debunking arguments purport to show) we have no other good reasons for taking them to exist, then we have no good reason to believe in them, in which case we should accept H4. One might also give a more direct defense of H4 by appealing to the controversial Eleatic Principle (a.k.a. Alexander's Dictum), according to which everything that exists has causal powers. Together with the plausible assumption that if baseballs don't cause anything it's because they can't cause anything, the Eleatic Principle entails H4.[47]

6. The Problem of the Many

The office appears to contain a single wooden desk. The desk is constituted by a single hunk of wood whose surface forms a sharp boundary with the environment, without even a single cellulose molecule coming loose from the others. Call this hunk of wood Woodrow. Now consider the object consisting of all of Woodrow's parts except for a single cellulose molecule, Molly, making up part of Woodrow's surface. Call this further, ever-so-slightly smaller hunk of wood Woodrow-minus. Because Woodrow-minus is extraordinarily similar to Woodrow, there is considerable pressure to accept that Woodrow-minus is a desk as well. This, in short, is the problem of the many.

Woodrow is a desk iff Woodrow-minus is a desk.
If so, then it is not the case that there is exactly one desk in the office.
There is exactly one desk in the office.

K1 and K2 straightforwardly entail that K3 is false; one of these claims has to go.[48]

K1 is plausible. Woodrow-minus seems to have everything that it takes to be a desk: it looks like a desk, it's shaped like a desk, it's got a flat writing surface, and so forth. Accordingly, it would be arbitrary to suppose that Woodrow but not Woodrow-minus is a desk. Moreover, if Molly were removed, Woodrow-minus would certainly then be a desk. But since Woodrow-minus doesn't itself undergo any interesting change when Molly is removed (after all, Molly isn't even part of Woodrow-minus), it stands to reason that Woodrow-minus must likewise be a desk even while Molly is attached to it.

One might deny K1 on the grounds that being a desk is a maximal property, that is, a property of an object that cannot be shared by large parts of that object. Since Woodrow is a desk, and since Woodrow-minus is a large part of Woodrow, Woodrow-minus is not a desk.[49]

But this style of response can be rendered unavailable by introducing an element of vagueness into our story.[50] Suppose now that Molly has begun to come loose from the other molecules, in such a way that it is naturally described as being a borderline part of the desk in the office. Let Woodrow-plus be the aggregate of cellulose molecules that definitely has Molly as a part. K1 can then be replaced with K1′:

Woodrow-plus is a desk iff Woodrow-minus is a desk.

Woodrow-plus and Woodrow-minus each seem to have everything that it takes to be a desk, and neither seems to be a better candidate than the other for being a desk. K2 would then be replaced with K2′:

If Woodrow-plus is a desk iff Woodrow-minus is a desk, then: it is not the case that there is exactly one desk in the office.

K1′ may be resisted by proponents of the supervaluationist strategy sketched in §2.1 above. The vague term ‘desk’ has multiple precisifications, some of which apply to Woodrow-plus, some of which apply to Woodrow-minus, but none of which applies to both. Accordingly, K1′ is false on every precisification, and therefore false simpliciter.[51]

Constitutionalists can deny both K2 and K2′. Regarding the original story, they may insist that neither Woodrow nor Woodrow-minus is a desk. Each is a mere hunk of wood, and no mere hunk of wood is a desk. Rather, there is exactly one desk, it is constituted by Woodrow, and while Woodrow-minus would constitute that desk if Molly were removed, as things stand it constitutes nothing at all. Regarding the revised story, constitutionalists may again say that there is exactly one desk, neither Woodrow-plus nor Woodrow-minus is a desk, and it is simply indeterminate whether it is Woodrow-plus or Woodrow-minus that constitutes that desk. So K2′ is false: it's true that each is a desk iff the other is—since neither is a desk—but it doesn't follow that there's more than one or fewer than one desk.[52]

Finally, one might deny K3, either by accepting an eliminativist view on which there is no desk in the office or by accepting a same-kind permissivist view on which there are at least two desks in the office. Proponents of the latter response will end up committed to far more than two desks, however. By parity of reason, there will also be a desk composed of all of the cellulose molecules except Nelly (≠ Molly). Likewise for Ollie. And so on. So there will be at least as many desks as there are cellulose molecules on the surface of the desk.[53]

7. Against Revisionary Conceptions

We have examined a variety of arguments for revisionary conceptions, as well as a variety of strategies for resisting those arguments. But why resist them? What reason is there to accept the ordinary conception in the first place?

7.1 Arguments from Counterexamples

Many of the revisionary theses that we have discussed seem to be open to counterexamples. Here is an argument from counterexamples against universalism:

If universalism is true, then there are trout-turkeys.
There are no trout-turkeys.
So universalism is false.

In other words, the front halves of trout and the back halves of turkeys are a counterexample to the universalist thesis that any plurality of non-overlapping objects compose a single object. Similar arguments may be lodged against many of the other theses under discussion. The various forms of eliminativism wrongly imply that there are no statues; the doctrine of plenitude wrongly implies that there are incars; the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts wrongly implies that there are leg-complements; and so forth.

Such arguments are commonplace—and plausibly underwrite the widespread resistance to various revisionary theses—though it is admittedly rare to see them characterized in terms of “counterexamples”. Counterexamples are normally expected to take proponents of the counterexampled views by surprise, whereas defenders of revisionary conceptions are already well aware of the purported counterexamples. Perhaps for this reason, the objections are more commonly articulated in terms of tensions with common sense, intuitions, experience, what people are pre-theoretically inclined to say and believe, or what we find plausible or obvious. (See Williamson 2007: §7.1 on “psychologizing the data”.) The underlying thought seems to be that revisionary views are meant to be in tension with things that, for one reason or another, ought to be regarded as part of the data for philosophical inquiry. And this is what these arguments share in common with paradigmatic arguments from counterexamples.

Compatibilist accounts of the apparent counterexamples take the cited data to be compatible with the relevant revisionary views. Such accounts often take the form of assimilating recalcitrant ordinary utterances to some familiar linguistic phenomenon that is known to be potentially misleading. For instance, when an ordinary speaker looks in the fridge and says ‘there's no beer’, she obviously doesn't mean to be saying that there is no beer anywhere in the universe. Rather, she is tacitly restricting her quantifier to things that are in the fridge. Universalists often suggest that something similar is going on when ordinary speakers say ‘there are no trout-turkeys’ (or more realistically: ‘there's nothing that has both fins and feathers’). Speakers are tacitly restricting their quantifiers to ordinary objects, and what they are saying is entirely compatible with there being extraordinary finned-and-feathered things like trout-turkeys. Universalists may then hold that the argument from counterexamples rests on an equivocation. If the quantifiers are meant to be restricted to ordinary objects, then L2 is true, but L1 is false: universalism does not entail that any ordinary things have both fins and feathers. If on the other hand the quantifiers are meant to be entirely unrestricted then L2 is false; but in denying L2, one is not running afoul of what we are inclined to say or believe or intuit.[54]

This is only one of many compatibilist strategies that have been deployed in defense of revisionary conceptions. Universalists have also invoked an ambiguity in ‘object’ to explain the appeal of ‘there is no object that has both fins and features’. Eliminativists have claimed that ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are instances of “loose talk” or that they are context-sensitive. Constitutionalists have maintained that the ‘is’ in ordinary utterances like ‘the lump is now a statue’ is not an ‘is’ of identity but rather an ‘is’ of constitution. Permissivists of various stripes have defended views according to which ordinary utterances about how many things there are still manage to come out true. Others contend that ontologists are (perhaps unwittingly) using their quantifiers in a special sense, and still others advocate a “revolutionary” strategy which involves stipulating that one's quantifiers are being used in a special technical sense.[55]

One common complaint about compatibilist accounts is that these proposals about what we are saying and what we believe are linguistically or psychologically implausible. For instance, when ordinary speakers are speaking loosely or restricting their quantifiers, they will typically balk when their remarks are taken at face value. (“Uncooked rice literally lasts forever?” “There's no beer anywhere in the world?”) But this sort of evidence seems just to be missing in the cases at hand. (“You literally think there are statues?” “There's nothing at all with both fins and feathers?”)[56]

Revisionaries may instead wish to give an incompatibilist account of the putative counterexamples, according to which revisionary conceptions are indeed incompatible with ordinary belief (ordinary discourse, common sense, intuition, etc.). Such accounts are meant to show that, although the ordinary beliefs are mistaken, the mistakes can be explained or excused. For instance, revisionaries may contend that the false beliefs are nevertheless justified, so long as one is not aware of the defeaters that undercut our usual justification. Or one may contend that ordinary speakers are not especially committed to these beliefs, which may in turn suggest that they do not deserve to be treated as data for purposes of philosophical inquiry. Or they may call attention to some respect in which the ordinary utterances and beliefs are “nearly as good as true”.[57]

7.2 Arguments from Charity

One way of approaching the question of whether there are statues is by asking whether the correct interpretation of the English language is one according to which ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ come out true. The interpretation of populations of speakers is plausibly governed by a principle of charity which prohibits the gratuitous ascription of false beliefs and utterances to populations of speakers. Such a principle—which is independently motivated by reflection on how it is that utterances come to have the meanings that they do—can be put to work in arguments for the existence of ordinary objects and for the nonexistence of extraordinary objects. For example:

The most charitable interpretation of English is one on which ‘there are statues’ comes out true.
If so, then ‘there are statues’ is true.
If ‘there are statues’ is true, then there are statues.
So, there are statues.

Call this the argument from charity.[58]

To see the idea behind M1, notice that both eliminativists and defenders of the ordinary conception can agree that there are atoms arranged statuewise. The question is whether the English sentence ‘there are statues’ should be interpreted in such a way that the existence of such atoms suffices for it to come out true. Let us call interpretations of ‘there are statues’ on which the existence of atoms arranged statuewise suffices for its truth liberal, and interpretations on which that does not suffice for its truth demanding. Given the availability of both liberal and demanding interpretations, the principle of charity would evidently favor the former. The idea behind M2 is that, since the liberal interpretations are otherwise on a par with the demanding interpretations, charity wins out and ‘there are statues’ is true. M3 looks to be a straightforward application of a plausible disquotation principle: if sentence S says that p, and S is true, then p.

One might resist M1 on the grounds that, while the liberal interpretations are charitable in some respects, they are uncharitable in others. After all, the puzzles and arguments discussed in §§2–6 seem to show that no interpretation can secure the truth of everything that we are inclined to say about ordinary objects. For instance, the liberal interpretations on which D1 comes out true (‘Goliath and Lumpl exist’) must, on pain of contradiction, make at least one of D2 through D4 come out false. But then some other intuitively true claim—perhaps, ‘Goliath and Lumpl (if they exist) are identical’—will come out false. The demanding interpretations on which D1 comes out false do better than the liberal interpretations on this score, since they can make all of D2 through D4 come out true. This gain in charity might then be held to counterbalance the loss in charity from rendering D1 false. Unless there is reason to think that it is more charitable to interpret ‘Goliath exists’ as true than to interpret ‘Goliath = Lumpl’ as true, we would seem to have no reason to accept M1.[59]

One might also challenge M1 on the grounds that the principle of charity, properly understood, demands only that the utterances and beliefs of ordinary speakers be reasonable, not that they be true. Since it looks to ordinary speakers as if there are statues, and since they have no reason to believe that appearances are misleading (having never encountered the arguments for eliminativism), their utterances and beliefs would be reasonable even if false. The principle of charity, so understood, would not favor liberal interpretations over demanding interpretations. This line of response might be contested on the grounds that the demanding interpretations interpret speakers as making basic a priori or conceptual errors—insofar as eliminativism is meant to be a priori if true—and that imputing such errors is highly uncharitable.[60]

Another strategy for resisting the argument is to maintain that there are constraints beyond charity which favor the demanding interpretations. Charity, after all, is not the only factor involved in determining the meanings of our utterances. Certain puzzles about content determination have been thought to show that the content of an expression or utterance cannot be determined solely by which sentences we are inclined to regard as true; it is also partly a matter of the relative “naturalness” or “eligibility” of candidate contents. One who accepts this sort of account may maintain that the demanding interpretations, although less charitable, nevertheless assign more natural contents to English sentences than the liberal interpretations, for instance, by assigning a more natural meaning to the quantifiers. This suggestion will be rejected by quantifier variantists (see §4.1) who maintain that the different candidate quantifier meanings are all on a par.[61]

Finally, M3 may be resisted by certain compatibilists (see §7.1), according to whom what ordinary speakers are saying is compatible with the eliminativist's claim that statues do not exist. Since ontological discussions (including this very article) are not carried out in ordinary English or ordinary contexts, one cannot infer that there are statues from the fact that ordinary speakers can truly say ‘there are statues’, any more than I can infer that I am on the moon from the fact that an astronaut truly utters ‘I am on the moon’.

Moreover, the argument from charity may be “turned on its head” as an argument for compatibilist accounts:

Ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are true.
If ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are incompatible with the nonexistence of statues, then ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are false.
So, ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are compatible with the nonexistence of statues.

The motivation for N1 is more or less the same as the motivation for M1 and M2: charity favors interpretations on which ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ come out true, and nothing overrides the presumption of charity. N2 may then be defended by appeal to the arguments discussed in §§2–6 above, which purport to show that there are no ordinary objects.[62]

7.3 Arguments from Entailment

Arguments from entailment purport to establish that eliminativism is self-defeating, insofar as certain things that eliminativists affirm entail the existence of the very ordinary objects that they wish to eliminate. Here is a representative argument from entailment:

There are atoms arranged statuewise.
If there are atoms arranged statuewise, then there are statues.
So, there are statues.

Most eliminativists will accept O1 and deny O2. (Existence monists will reject O1, but structurally identical arguments—concerning the way the cosmos is at various places—arise for them as well.) Below, I consider two arguments for O2: the argument from identity and the argument from application conditions.

The argument from identity proceeds from the assumption that ordinary objects are identical to the smaller objects of which they are composed. The statue, for instance, is identical to its atomic parts. Accordingly, by affirming that there are atoms arranged statuewise, eliminativists let into their ontology the very things that they had intended to exclude.[63]

However, the view that composites are identical to their parts is highly controversial. One common objection is that the identity relation simply isn't the sort of relation that can hold between a single thing and many things. Another common objection is that ordinary objects have different persistence conditions from their parts. For instance, the atoms arranged statuewise, unlike the statue, will still exist if the statue disintegrates and the atoms disperse. It would then seem to follow by Leibniz's Law (see §3.1) that the atoms are not identical to the statue.[64]

The argument from application conditions arises out of some general considerations about how it is that kind terms refer to what they do. Suppose an archaeologist uncovers an unfamiliar artifact, gestures towards it, and introduces the name ‘woodpick’ for things of that kind. Yet there are numerous things before her: the woodpick, the woodpick's handle, the facing surface of the woodpick, etc. Furthermore, the woodpick itself belongs to numerous kinds: woodpick, tool, artifact, etc. So how is it that ‘woodpick’ came to denote woodpicks rather than something else? (This is an instance of what is known as the qua problem.) It must be because the speaker associates certain application conditions and perhaps other descriptive information with the term ‘woodpick’, which single out woodpicks—rather than all tools or just the facing surfaces of woodpicks—as the denotation of the term. And the same is plausibly so for already-entrenched kind terms like ‘statue’: their reference is largely determined by the application conditions that speakers associate with them.[65]

Armed with this account of reference determination, one might then argue for O2 as follows: The application conditions that competent speakers associate with ‘statue’—together with facts about the distribution of atoms—determine whether it applies to something. But these applications conditions are fairly undemanding: nothing further is required for their satisfaction than that there be atoms arranged statuewise. Accordingly, so long as there are atoms arranged statuewise, ‘statue’ does apply to something, from which it trivially follows that there are statues.[66]

This argument may be resisted on the grounds that the application conditions that ordinary speakers associate with ‘statue’ aren't quite so undemanding. It's not enough simply that there be atoms arranged statuewise. Rather, there must be an object that is composed of the atoms—and (eliminativists might go on to insist) there are no such objects. However, those who are moved by the qua problem might respond that ‘object’ itself must be associated with application conditions, which are likewise sufficiently undemanding as to be satisfied so long as there are atoms arranged statuewise.[67]


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