Notes to Medieval Theories of Obligationes

1. See De Rijk [1974], [1975], [1976]; Stump [1982].

2. See, e.g., Weisheipl [1966], pp. 163–65.

3. Contrary to Dumitriu [1977], vol. 2, p. 167, and vol. 4, p. 171.

4. The former is cited in the late Copulata tractatuum parvorum logicalium, quoted in English in Boehner [1952], p. 18. The latter is cited in an Obligationes appended to editions by the Cologne Thomists of Peter of Spain's Syncategoremata, as translated in Mullally [1964], p. 117.

5. Martin [1993], p. 358.

6. The anonymous Obligationes Parisienses edited in De Rijk [1975], pp. 26–54, at p. 52 lines 10–11. My translation.

7. The opening lines of the anonymous Tractatus Emmeranus de impossibili positione edited in De Rijk [1974], pp. 117–23, at p. 117 lines 28–31. My translation.

8. Martin [1993], pp. 358–59. Martin [1993], pp. 359–63, provides much interesting information on the history of impossible positing into the twelfth century, including discussion of Boethius. Kukkonen [2002] and Kukkonen [2005] look at the Aristotelian tradition of per impossibile arguments in Arabic philosophy as it influenced Latin medieval thought.

9. For the Obligationes Parisienses, see De Rijk [1975]. Burley's text is edited in Green [1963]; cf. §0.02. For Ockham, see William of Ockham [1974], III-3, 39, lines 12-13. The nomenclature varied somewhat. “Let it be doubted” (dubitetur) is often called “doubting” (dubitatio); “the truth of the matter” (rei veritas) is also called “let it be true” (sit verum) or “let it be the truth of the matter” (sit rei veritas); “institution” (institutio) is frequently called “imposition” (impositio). While authors into the early-fourteenth century tended to have a relatively large number of kinds of obligationes, later authors frequently reduce this number to three or even fewer. (See Paul of Venice [1988], p. 37 n. 11.) The “standard” three were: positing, counterpositing, and imposition (positio, depositio, impositio).

10. See Spade [1977], §§18–20, Spade [1980], §3, Spade [1978], §5.

11. See for example:

  • The Tractatus Emmeranus as cited in n. 7 above.
  • A text sometimes attributed to William of Sherwood, edited in Green [1963], §§1.82–1.87. The correct attribution of this text has been questioned. See Spade and Stump [1983]. On the other hand, see the counterarguments in Martin [1993], p. 362. The text will hereafter be cited as the “putative Sherwood.”
  • Walter Burley's Obligationes, edited in Green [1963], §§3.179–3.186.
  • William of Ockham [1974], III-3, 42.

For reasons that remain unclear, impossible positio seems to have fallen into decline after Ockham. It is occasionally seen thereafter, but not regularly or even often. Impossible positio was never developed in as much logical detail as what we shall see below. Perhaps it is better regarded as a separate and additional kind of obligatio.

12. The early treatises edited in De Rijk [1974] and [1975] do not systematically recognize “I doubt it” as an allowable response, although they do sometimes recognize a response “Prove it” (proba!). See Spade [1982b], p. 5 n. 17. Later authors, among them Ockham, sometimes allow the response “I distinguish” if the propositum is ambiguous. In such a case the respondent then goes on to distinguish the various senses of the propositum, and to concede, deny, or doubt it in each of those senses separately. See Spade [1982b], p. 5. Note that “positum” and “propositum” are distinct notions, and that “admitting” is not the same as “conceding.” (It is the positum that is admitted, but the propositum that is perhaps conceded.) Nevertheless, these terminological distinctions were not always rigorously observed.

13. The putative Sherwood's theory is in all important respects the same as Burley's. Burley's treatise was written in 1302. The date of the putative Sherwood's treatise is not certain, but it was probably earlier, perhaps by several decades.

14. See Spade [1982b], p. 6, and Spade [1993], pp. 236–37.

15. See Spade [1993], p. 237 n. 15. The Logica magna attributed to Paul of Venice acknowledges other, more alarming ways to end the obligatio. One is if some “disturbance” interrupts the proceedings, as “often happens.” Another is if either the opponent or the respondent “should cease to exist.” (Paul of Venice [1988], p. 22.) Presumably the latter case just means that one of them dies. One wouldn't want the poor respondent to be “obligated” ever after just because the opponent happened to die before he could say “Cedat tempus”! It is more difficult to see what awkwardness would arise for the opponent should the respondent die before the disputation was over.

16. With the remainder of this section on Burley, see Spade [1982b], pp. 7–8. For the sake of simplifying this discussion of “consistency,” we can conveniently ignore the distinction between conceding a propositum and denying its contradictory. Whenever the one is required at a given step of a positio, the other would have been required if the propositum's contradictory had been proposed instead at that step.

17. See the texts cited in n. 4 above.

18. Burley recognizes this fact and does not appear to think it is a problem. See his text in Green [1963], §§1.136–1.137.

19. Barring a change in the world. If an irrelevant propositum (e.g., ‘The sun is behind a cloud.’) is proposed at one step of a disputation and then again at a later step, a change in the weather may require a change in the appropriate response. It would not do so on Burley's theory.

20. For support of these claims, see Spade [1982b], pp. 28–30.

21. For example, Kilvington [1990a] and [1990b], sophisma 47. See the discussion of this sophisma in Spade [1982b], pp. 19–28, 31. A related but not identical theory is found in Kretzmann and Stump [1985].

22. With the following discussion, see Spade [1982b], pp. 1–2.

23. See Spade [1982b]. Note that the question concerns counterfactual reasoning, not counterfactual propositions. (I stress this point in Spade [1992].) Latin has a refined sense of counterfactual propositions, marked by imperfect or pluperfect subjunctive forms of verbs. Nevertheless, nowhere in the obligationes literature are such counterfactual propositions in evidence. No one, for instance, remarks that, because we have a positio disputation with positum p and conceded propositum q, we have somehow established or supported the proposition “If it were the case that p, it would be the case that q.” Perhaps it would be better not to speak in terms of “counterfactuals” at all, whether reasonings or propositions, but in terms of “thought experiments.” (See King [1991].)

24. For details, see Spade [1982b], especially pp. 11–13.

25. See Spade [1992]. Gelber [2004] provides a wealth of examples in theology. See also Martin [1990].

26. For details, see Spade [1993].

27. See, for example, Burley in Green [1963], §§4.01–4.25.

28. See Burley in Green [1963], §§5.01–5.23.

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