Moral Sentimentalism

First published Wed Jan 29, 2014

For moral sentimentalists, our emotions and desires play a leading role in the anatomy of morality. Some believe moral thoughts are fundamentally sentimental, others that moral facts make essential reference to our sentimental responses, or that emotions are the primary source of moral knowledge. Some believe all these things. The two main attractions of sentimentalism are making sense of the practical aspects of morality, on the one hand, and finding a place for morality within a naturalistic worldview, on the other. The corresponding challenges are accounting for the apparent objectivity and normativity of morality. Recent psychological theories emphasizing the centrality of emotion in moral thinking have prompted renewed interest in sentimentalist ethics.

1. The Many Moral Sentimentalisms

Consider the following story related by Frans de Waal in a recent book:

J. lives in a small seaside town in France, where he is known as the handyman he is. He can build an entire house with his own hands, as he is skilled in carpentry, plumbing, masonry, roof work, and so on. He demonstrates this every day at his own home, and so people naturally ask him for help. Being extremely nice, J. usually dispenses advice or lends a helping hand. One neighbor, whom he barely knew, kept asking about how to put a skylight in his roof. J. lent him his ladder for the job, but since the man kept returning, he promised to come take a look one day.

J. spent from morning until late evening with the neighbor, basically doing the job on his own (as the neighbor could barely hold a hammer, he said), during which time the neighbor's wife came, cooked, and ate lunch (the main meal in France) with her husband without offering J. anything. By the end of the day, he had successfully put the skylight in, having provided expert labor that normally would have cost more than six hundred euros. J. asked for nothing, but when the same neighbor a few days later talked about a scuba diving course, and how it would be fun to do together, he felt this opened a perfect occasion for a return gift, since the course cost about 150 euros. So J. said he'd love to go, but unfortunately didn't have the money in his budget. By now you can guess: The man went alone. (de Waal 2009: 174–175)

Assuming the story is true and leaves nothing of importance out, we're likely to have two kinds of response to it: we have a negative feeling of some sort towards the neighbour, and we think that the neighbour acted wrongly towards poor J. Roughly speaking, sentimentalists think that these two responses are intimately related, with the feeling in the driving seat. (Since different theories in the sentimentalist family make use of different responses, this entry will adopt a liberal definition of a ‘sentiment’ that comprises non-cognitive attitudes and states of all kinds—emotions, feelings, affects, desires, besires, plans, and dispositions to have them.)

There are many questions we could ask about this. One kind of question is explanatory: Why do we think that the neighbour did something wrong? Explanatory sentimentalists believe that moral thoughts are fundamentally explained by sentiments or emotions. The second kind of question is constitutive: What does our thought that the neighbour did something wrong consist in? That is, what kind of thought is it? Is it more like believing that Pluto is a planet or like wanting to hit an uncooperative computer? Judgment sentimentalists believe that moral judgments are constituted by emotional or non-cognitive responses, at least in part, or alternatively are judgments about emotional responses or the tendency of something to give rise to them. Some judgment sentimentalists are also expressivists, who believe that the meanings of moral terms must be accounted for in terms of associated non-cognitive states.

Third, assuming that we've got it right, what kind of fact if any makes our thought about the neighbour's action true? Is the wrongness of the action a projection of our sentiments? If it is a fact, is it like the fact that the square of the hypotenuse is the sum of the squares of the other sides of the triangle, or like the fact that water is H2O, or perhaps more like the fact that rotten food is disgusting? For metaphysical sentimentalists, moral facts make reference to our sentimental responses. Finally, we're pretty confident of our judgment. But even if we assume we know all the pertinent empirical facts, how do we know that what the neighbour did is wrong? What if someone disagrees? How can we justify our verdict? Epistemological sentimentalists believe that moral justification bottoms out in sentimental responses of a certain kind.

These sentimentalist views are logically independent of each other. One indication of this is that they contrast with different views. Epistemological and possibly explanatory sentimentalist views contrast with rationalist and intuitionist views, according which we can acquire moral knowledge by reasoning or intuition, respectively. Judgment sentimentalist views, in turn, contrast with some forms of cognitivism. Metaphysical sentimentalist views contrast with error theory and mind-independent moral realism in naturalist and non-naturalist variants.

2. Moral Psychology: Explanation

It is not uncommon for contemporary philosophers to see sentimentalism as a theory of moral judgment or facts. But classical sentimentalists clearly considered the primary question to be a moral psychological one: What feature of human nature—reason, sentiment, or intuition—explains why we approve of something or blame someone? (See David Hume's Treatise of Human Nature (T), 456 and Adam Smith's The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS), 312–313.) Since it is in this context of fundamentally explaining our moral judgments that they introduced some of their main arguments, it is good to start with these issues, even though they lie on the borderline of philosophy and what is now the empirical science of psychology.

2.1 Moral Sense Theories

The roots of the modern sentimentalist tradition in ethics go back to early 18th century debates in Britain. Anthony Ashley Cooper, better known by his title as the Earl of Shaftesbury, introduced the notion of a moral sense in his Inquiry Concerning Virtue, or Merit. According to Shaftesbury, the primary object of moral evaluation is the “affection” or motive behind the action. Such affections can, by reflection, become the object of a second-order affection:

In a Creature capable of forming general Notions of Things, not only the outward Beings which offer themselves to the Sense, are the Objects of the Affection; but the very Actions themselves, and the Affections of Pity, Kindness, Gratitude, and their Contrarys, being brought into the Mind by Reflection, become Objects. So that, by means of this reflected Sense, there arises another kind of Affection towards those very Affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are now become the Subject of a new Liking or Dislike. (Shaftesbury 1699–1714: 16)

Moral approval is explained by (and perhaps consists in) this sort of second-order liking, which Shaftesbury usually designates the ‘Sense of Right or Wrong’. This sense is innate or natural, and can be displaced only by “contrary habit and custom” (1699–1714: 25), although it may on occasion be overcome by “rage, lust, or any other counterworking passion” (1699–1714: 35). On Shaftesbury's view, what it approves of are natural or public affections, which are the beautiful and harmonious motives tending towards the good of the whole system of rational creatures. There is also a place for subordinate self-interested motives, since society suffers if individuals fail to preserve or defend themselves. To be virtuous, a creature must not only do the right things, but exercise its moral sense and act for the very reason that something is worthy and honest (1699–1714: 18). Shaftesbury doesn't, however, give details of how the sense of right or wrong works, or how it can guide action.

Frances Hutcheson fills in Shaftesbury's sketch to some extent. His argument for the existence of a moral sense draws on his rejection of rationalism and intuitionism (see Supplement on Anti-Rationalist Arguments). Since we don't approve of actions because of self-interest or self-evidence, something else must explain our convictions. According to him, a sense is a “determination of the mind, to receive any idea from the presence of an object which occurs to us, independent on our will” (1725: 90). There are many more such senses than traditionally acknowledged. Since moral ideas arise spontaneously, Hutcheson concludes we have a moral sense,

a determination of our minds to receive amiable or disagreeable ideas of Actions, when they occur to observation, antecedent to any opinions of advantage or loss to redound to ourselves from them. (1725: 100)

The moral sense, though not moral ideas, is innate, as can be seen from the sentiments of small children (1725: 145–146).

On Hutcheson's view, what the moral sense approves of is above all “the general calm desire of the happiness of others”, in distinction from particular benevolent passions like love and compassion (1728: 175). On this picture, in contrast to Shaftesbury, the motive of morally praiseworthy actions is benevolence and not the thought that the action is obligatory or that it would be approve of by the moral sense itself. In Hutcheson's terminology, moral sense is the source of justifying reasons, but not exciting reasons.

Some key features of these early sentimentalist theories are shared by the psychologist Jonathan Haidt's (2012) contemporary model. Haidt's starting point is an increasingly common distinction in psychology between two kinds of cognitive process. What is known as System 1 or the Intuitive System comprises of automatic, effortless, fast, often associative, parallel, affective, and modular processes. We are only conscious of their outputs, not the processes themselves. (They are thus parallel to Hutcheson's ‘senses’.) System 2 or the Reasoning System comprises of conscious, effortful, slow, memory-taxing, sometimes inferential, rational, and linear processes. As is common in psychology, Haidt uses the term ‘intuition’ for beliefs that result from the Intuitive System.

Haidt's empirical claim is that moral judgments are for the most part intuitions proximally caused by gut reactions, quick and automatic flashes of affect. In support of this, manipulating affect has been shown to make a difference to people's judgments (Wheatley and Haidt 2005), and areas of the brain associated with such affective responses found active when people make judgments (e.g., Greene and Haidt 2002; Moll, de Oliveira-Souza, and Eslinger 2003). Further, in some studies, people are easily dumbfounded when challenged on their moral views: they cannot (Haidt claims) give reasons for why they disapprove of harmless sibling incest, for example (Haidt 2001). On Haidt's somewhat pessimistic picture, the role of reason is for the most part lawyerly rationalization of the pre-existing gut reactions, in particular in a social context.

Where the early sentimentalists gesture towards divine providence when it comes to explaining why we have a moral sense and why it approves of things like benevolence, Haidt's story appeals to evolution. He believes we are pre-programmed to respond to suffering with compassion, arrogance by subordinates with contempt, cheating with anger, and impurity with disgust, for example. These culturally fine-tuned affective responses are in turn distally explained by having been evolutionary “adaptations to long-standing threats and opportunities in social life” (Haidt 2012) of our ancestors. But how can it be adaptive to risk the wrath of an aggressor in order to defend a victim that one sympathizes with, for example? Haidt's explanation appeals to the controversial notion of group selection, the idea that genes that program for individually fitness-decreasing behavior can nevertheless be naturally selected for as a result of increasing group fitness (Sober and Wilson 1998).

It's not clear whether group selection suffices to explain our approval of actions that benefit outgroup members, however. Further, as discussed below, contemporary sentimentalists who follow Hume rather than Hutcheson argue that there is no need to assume that moral reactions are innate, and some reason to assume they are not (even if our innate dispositions do play a role in explaining them). A related challenge to Haidt's account is that he does not distinguish between moral and non-moral evaluations. When talking about intuitions in his sense, he says that

the brain has a kind of gauge (sometimes called a “like-ometer”) that is constantly moving back and forth, and these movements, these quick judgments, influence whatever comes next. (Haidt and Björklund 2008: 186–187)

But we don't regard everything we dislike, or even everything that makes us angry, as morally wrong. The story is at least incomplete. (For more discussion, see the entry on Morality and Evolutionary Biology.)

Further, as a psychologist, Haidt offers no a priori arguments against the possibility of reason yielding moral verdicts. All he can claim is that people don't usually engage in reasoning first. Even if that is true, it doesn't follow that people's judgments are not shaped by reasoning (perhaps someone else's reasoning, in the case of culturally shaped dispositions) or that they are insensitive to reasons. Indeed, Daniel Jacobson (2012) points out that the evidence that people lack reasons for their judgments is in fact very thin. In Haidt's dumbfounding studies, saying that an act is unnatural, for example, doesn't count as giving a reason for one's judgment. But (rightly or wrongly), that's the sort of thing that many people take as reason for condemning certain kinds of action. Moreover, as Jacobson notes, there are also harm-based reasons to regard Haidt's harmless incest as wrong—after all, even if no problems actually result from having sex with your sister or brother, you take an enormous risk of emotional repercussions. The vibe at your sister's wedding three years later might not be quite the same. People might not be able to immediately articulate such reasons, but that doesn't show they don't have them. Rather than being mere rationalization, post hoc reasoning might be a process of trying to articulate the considerations one's intuitive judgments were responsive to. This is relevant to the epistemic status of judgments based on emotion (see Section 5.3).

2.2 Sympathy/Empathy-Based Theories

What is distinctive of Hume and Smith is that although they occasionally use the term ‘moral sense’, they do not take it to be a primitive, innate capacity, but rather aim to explain its workings in terms of more basic mechanisms, in particular what they call ‘sympathy’. In contemporary use, the term is often used for a kind of concern for another. But Hume and Smith, in different ways, used it for sharing what another feels. The contemporary term for this kind of mechanism is empathy (for the distinction between sympathy and empathy, see Darwall 1998; Sober and Wilson 1998). This section will nevertheless use the older term, since what the classical sentimentalists talk about isn't quite ‘empathy’ either, insofar as empathy involves taking on the actual feeling of another.

Following Hutcheson, Hume rejects reason or reasoning as the source of moral distinctions (understood either as judgments or facts). His motivation sceptical arguments are based on what he believes is reason's inability to move us in the way that morality does. Content sceptical arguments, in turn, aim to demonstrate that recognizably moral conclusions cannot be reached by reason alone, without sentiment-supported premises. These arguments are crucial for the case for sentimentalism. Contemporary sentimentalists have developed new versions of both arguments against Kantian counters. For a more thorough discussion, see Supplement on Anti-Rationalist Arguments.

On Hume's positive account, moral approval is caused if not constituted by pleasure of a special kind:

To have the sense of virtue, is nothing but to feel a satisfaction of particular kind from the contemplation of a character. (T 471)

(Sometimes he says that approval consists of a form of love towards an agent on account of such pleasure.) What kind of pleasure? Hume's criterion is aetiological:

'Tis only when a character is considered in general, without reference to our particular interest, that it causes such a feeling or sentiment, as denominates it morally good or evil. (T 472)

But why does contemplation of a character without reference to our own interest give us pleasure in the first place? Not because we're simply equipped with a moral sense, but because of the operation of sympathy, which, according to Hume, offers a more parsimonious and systematic explanation of the phenomena.

How does sympathy work? For Hume, the mechanism is a kind of analogical association:

When I see the effects of passion in the voice and gesture of any person, my mind immediately passes from these effects to their causes, and forms such a lively idea of the passion, as is presently converted into the passion itself. (T 576)

Similar association operates on the causes of a passion. It is by this mechanism that the pleasures and pains of others are communicated for us, so that we are ourselves pleased in a special way when contemplating those durable character traits that reliably benefit and hence please others. This special kind of pleasure ‘denominates’ the trait as virtuous or vicious. (Hume distinguishes between ‘natural’ and ‘artificial’ virtues, the latter including justice and allegiance, which are human inventions that have beneficial consequences on the whole, and approved of because of that.) Here is how Hume summarizes the view:

When any quality, or character, has a tendency to the good of mankind, we are pleased with it, and approve of it; because it presents the lively idea of pleasure; which idea affects us by sympathy, and is itself a kind of pleasure. (T 580)

This simple account needs refinement, however. Hume observes two ways in which our moral approval diverges from what causes sympathetic pleasure. First, what comes naturally to us is taking on the feelings of the near and the dear, those who are close to or similar to us and those we care about. Yet we regard a historical character renowned for being just with equal moral approval as someone with the same trait living today in our own town, for example. Second, we sometimes approve of “virtue in rags”: an honest and generous person who due to no fault of her own is incapacitated and in no position to benefit others is not considered morally worse than someone with the same traits who actually does cause pleasure for us to sympathize with. Hume's answer to these challenges is that we correct our initial responses for bias and the influence of moral luck, as well as our present disposition—not because we aim for some standard that is independent of our responses, but because of the practical problems that result from relying on “momentary appearances” (T 582).

When we judge others on the basis of self-interest or uncorrected sympathy with the near and the dear, the result is “many contradictions to our sentiments in society and conversation” (T 583). When it comes to feelings of personal liking or taste, it is no problem if different people call different people or things “enemy” or “delicious”. But when someone uses moral language and calls someone “vicious”, “odious”, or “depraved”, she “expresses sentiments, in which, he expects, all his audience are to concur with him” (Hume 1751: 260). It is this expectation of concurrence characteristic of moral sentiments that pushes us towards a “common point of view” (ibid.) in moral judging.

Hume's suggestion is that such a point of view is achieved by setting aside our own interests, current disposition, and relation to the agent or those affected by her, and varying position, and sympathizing with the effects of a person's actions on those around him:

The only point of view, in which our sentiments concur with those of others, is, when we consider the tendency of any passion to the advantage or harm of those, who have any immediate connexion or intercourse with the person possess'd of it. (T 602–3)

(More precisely, to avoid the virtue in rags problem, we look to the fitness of people's character traits for producing such effects.) Hume remarks that this sort of correction for variability and distance is common to all the senses. As Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1994) has argued, such a perspective is not one of an omniscient ideal observer, but rather a point of view we all could realistically occupy. Otherwise it couldn't be appealed to in an explanation of how we actually come to approve of certain things.

Adam Smith presents a different theory about the nature and mechanisms of sympathy and consequently moral and evaluative approval. For Smith, the key mechanism of sympathy is imaginatively placing oneself in another's position, or what would now be called simulation (Gordon 1995), rather than mere emotional contagion, association, or inference. In Smith's official definition (from which he sometimes departs), sympathy consists in a match between what one takes the other to actually feel and what one feels oneself as a result of putting oneself in the other's shoes. Approbation is the pleasant feeling that results from perceiving this coincidence (TMS 56 note a). Although this account of ‘sense of propriety’ is sometimes described as Smith's theory of moral judgment, he regards it as a perfectly general account of evaluation, encompassing belief, sense of humour, or business decisions. When it comes to judgments of moral merit or demerit, or the qualities of deserving praise or blame, what counts is our sympathy with the gratitude and resentment of those affected by the action, on the one hand, and with the agent's motives, on the other. Like Hume, Smith recognizes that moral approval requires departing from one's personal point of view:

But [resentment and gratitude], as well as all the other passions of human nature, seem proper and are approved of, when the heart of every impartial spectator entirely sympathizes with them, when every indifferent by-stander entirely enters into, and goes along with them. (TMS 81)

The figure of an impartial spectator also plays a key role in Smith's account of self-directed moral judgment or conscience. Smith argues that reflection on our own motives requires that we distance ourselves from our agential standpoint and

endeavour to view them … with the eyes of other people, or as other people are likely to view them. (TMS 128)

Our original motive for doing so is our desire for the approval of those we care about. But experience teaches us we can't please every actual spectator, so

we soon learn to set up in our own minds a judge between ourselves and those we live with. (TMS 152n)

We then judge ourselves and potentially guide our action by the imagined responses of an impartial and well-informed spectator.

Michael Slote's recent sentimentalist account picks up the thread of empathy/sympathy-based theories. Slote's claim is that moral approval is constituted and explained by empathizing with an agent's motives:

[I]f agents' actions reflect empathic concern for (the well being or wishes of) others, empathic beings will feel warmly or tenderly toward them, and such warmth and tenderness empathically reflect the empathic warmth or tenderness of the agents. … [S]uch empathy with empathy … also constitutes moral approval, and possibly admiration as well, for agents and/or their actions. (Slote 2010: 34–35)

Some people's actions exhibit empathy toward others. This empathy is a warm feeling. When we empathize with the agent, we come to share this warm feeling. And this empathetic warm feeling constitutes moral approval. In contrast, unempathetic actions manifest a coldness towards others. Since moral approval and disapproval “enter into the making of moral judgments”, Slote believes empathy can explain our intuitions and judgments. More precisely,

differences in (the strength of) our empathic reactions (or tendencies to react) to various situations correspond pretty well to differences in the (normative) moral evaluations we tend to make about those situations. (Slote 2010: 21)

For example, we naturally flinch more strongly from causing harm to someone than from allowing the same harm to happen. This, for Slote, basically accounts for the commonsense deontological distinction between the seriousness of the wrong of doing harm rather than allowing it to happen.

Slote's account has been criticized from within the sentimentalist camp. Jesse Prinz (2011) notes that the view has difficulty with disapproval: failure to empathize is not the same thing as disapprobation, nor does it have the same kind of motivational effect. Julia Driver (2011) points out that people such as autists, who are (according to some views) incapable of empathy can nevertheless morally approve or disapprove of things. Slote's view also faces challenges of both necessity and sufficiency, in that it seems possible that we approve of un-empathetic actions (such as doing something out of a sense of duty, or doing the right thing for the wrong reason), and that there are empathetic actions we don't approve of (such as empathy-motivated helping of one victim at the expense of many others who are less close or similar to the agent). Nor do all agents we disapprove of lack empathy. As Justin D'Arms (2011) observes, a stern father may disapprove of a teenage daughter's love affair without there being any coldness in her for him to catch.

Even if these criticisms of Slote are justified, empathetic feelings may enter into the explanation of moral judgment more indirectly. Shaun Nichols (2004) shares the Humean ambition of explaining moral thought without assuming an innate moral capacity or sense. Instead, Nichols assumes that normal people have a generic capacity to be guided by norms or rules of various kinds, and certain non-moral emotional dispositions, such as the disposition to have an aversive response to suffering in others. These simple features help explain various features of moral thought, Nichols believes. One explanandum is the distinction that people, including very young children, make between violations of authority-independent and universally applicable moral rules and authority-dependent and local conventional rules.

Nichols's hypothesis is that people regard a rule-violation as authority-independently wrong when the rule in question is affect-backed, that is, when it prohibits actions that we independently have a negative emotional reaction towards (Nichols 2004: 62). One important source of support for this claim is that people who lack the relevant affective response, such as psychopaths, appear to fail at distinguishing between the two kinds of rules, even though their rational capacities are intact. Moral judgments, nevertheless, are applications of rules, and do not require the presence of on-line affect. This view was anticipated by some earlier sentimentalists. Adam Smith noted that we make the “greater part of” our moral judgments on the basis of general rules, which are for him based on induction from emotional responses to particular cases (TMS 377), and Edward Westermarck held that many judgments are “applications of some accepted general rule”, whose acceptance is ultimately explained by the existence of an “emotional sanction” in the judge's mind (Westermarck 1906: 6).

Nichols believes that his sentimental rules account also offers an explanation of universality of certain norms. We do not have to assume that people have an innate tendency to regard causing harm to innocents as morally wrong. Instead, it is plausible that of the various norms that different societies have come up with, those that resonate with our non-moral emotional dispositions enjoy a higher ‘cultural fitness’ (Nichols 2004: 127) and thus become more prevalent over time. Since we can account for (nearly) pan-cultural moral rules as well as moral judgment without appeal to dedicated innate mechanisms, Nichols (2005) concludes that morality is an evolutionary by-product rather than an adaptation.

3. Moral Psychology and Language: The Nature of Moral Judgment

Sentimentalism is commonly understood as a thesis about moral judgments or concepts. Moral thought involves or refers to our sentiments. It turns out that this can mean a number of different things. Also, moral language somehow or other expresses or refers to sentiments.

3.1 Non-Cognitivist Sentimentalism

On non-cognitivist views, moral thoughts are constituted by sentiments. To think that X is wrong is, at least in part, to have a negative sentiment towards X, or perhaps to have a higher-order positive attitude towards a negative sentiment towards X. Here is the most famous argument in favour of non-cognitivism:

The Argument from Internalism

  1. Moral judgments are intrinsically but defeasibly motivating. (Weak Internalism)
  2. Only non-cognitive psychological states with a world-to-mind direction of fit are intrinsically motivating; beliefs, which have a mind-to-world direction of fit, do not alone motivate (The Humean Theory of Motivation).
  3. So, moral judgments are (at least in part) constituted by non-cognitive psychological states.

The argument is clearly related to arguments from practicality against rationalism (see the Anti-Rationalism Supplement), but the second premise and the conclusion are about moral judgments themselves rather than about the processes that result in moral judgment. The first premise postulates an internal connection between (first-personal, present-directed) moral judgment and motivation. This is now generally treated as a conceptual question about our common concept of moral judgment. Weak Internalists believe, roughly, that judging that I morally ought to stop downloading movies entails that I have some motivation to stop downloading movies. Otherwise I don't genuinely regard the action as morally wrong, although I may pay lip service to it. My moral convictions are manifest in my motivational tendencies, if not always in action.

Weak (unlike Strong) Internalists don't deny that the link between judgment and action is fallible: we suffer from weakness of the will or buckle under social pressure. But they insist that there is an essential link between judgment and motivation, even if it is sometimes indirect. The point of thinking in moral terms in the first place isn't to discover some facts about the universe, but to get ourselves to act in ways that allow us to live together and reap the benefits of cooperation. Simon Blackburn (1988) and Allan Gibbard (1990) point out that any evolutionary benefits moral thought might have depend on its practicality. Community-Wide Internalists says that even if it is conceivable that there are individuals who are entirely indifferent to their moral judgments, internalists claim that no member of a community could be credited with a genuine moral stance, if no one in the community was motivated by their judgments (Lenman 1999; Tresan 2009). Weak Internalists are committed to the impossibility of there being amoralists (Brink 1986; Svavarsdottir 1999), agents who make genuine first-personal moral judgments while never having any corresponding motivation, while Community-Wide Internalists only deny the possibility of amoralist communities. (For a more thorough discussion, see the entry on Moral Motivation.)

The second premise of the argument is a thesis in the philosophy of mind. It says that mental states with propositional content divide into two fundamentally different kinds that play a differential role in guiding action. Some mental states represent how things are. Beliefs are the paradigmatic case. They provide a partial map of the world. Something has gone wrong if the content of the belief does not match how things are. This idea of a mind-to-world direction of fit of a belief that p is cashed out by Michael Smith as the tendency to go out of existence when perceiving that not-p (Smith 1987). If you believe that you car is working well but it refuses to start when you try, you tend to stop believing it works well, other things being equal. Other mental states are not representational, though they may have the same propositional content as beliefs. If you want your car to work well and notice that it refuses to start, your desire does not tend to go out of existence. Rather, it moves you to do something you believe would make the car work, such as call a mechanic. It has a world-to-mind direction of fit. Although particular ways of drawing the distinction remain controversial, the key idea that representational beliefs themselves are motivationally inert is widely accepted.

Finally, the conclusion comes in different strengths. Traditional non-cognitivists believe that moral judgments simply are non-cognitive states (For the ‘at least in part’ proviso, see the discussion of hybrid views in Section 3.5). But what kind of states? They are clearly not mere desires, since we can desire things we don't regard as desirable. Early non-cognitivists talked about a special ‘ethical feeling’ (Ayer 1936), identified in phenomenological terms. But there doesn't seem to be any common phenomenological character to all the various moral thoughts we have. So contemporary non-cognitivists appeal to the functional role of moral attitudes instead, to their distinctive part in our overall psychology. Blackburn's (1998) idea is that moral thoughts involve higher-order attitudes towards desires and preferences. When I morally disapprove of polluting the environment, I don't just desire not to pollute, but I also applaud others who are averse to it and dislike those who fail to share my desire. Here's how Blackburn describes this sort of emotional ascent:

[A]t the bottom we start with pure preferences. Rising up we come to preferences that we prefer others to share. Rising further we come to preferences that we ‘demand’ of others; that is, if they do not share them we find ourselves averse or in opposition to them. Here, according to me, we begin to enter the territory of ethics. (Blackburn 2002: 125)

When I morally disapprove of something, I also have these higher-order attitudes towards my own attitudes: I prefer not to desire what I disapprove of. This doesn't guarantee that I will always have the first-order desires, so the link between judgment and motivation is defeasible.

Gibbard (1990), in turn, identifies narrowly moral judgments with judgments about the rationality of guilt and resentment. To think that stealing is wrong, for example, is to think it rational to feel guilt for stealing and resent others for stealing (in the absence of conditions like ignorance or force that excuse the agent). To think that something is rational or makes sense, in turn, is to accept norms that permit it. On Gibbard's original account, norm-acceptance is a basic kind of non-cognitive state, an evolutionary adaptation for linguistically achieved coordination that is not analyzable in terms of other attitudes (1990: ch. 4). It is non-cognitive, because it is essentially a motivational tendency to act or feel in ways that we are prepared to avow in discussion about what to do. In later work, he considers normative thoughts as contingency plans that settle what to do in actual and non-actual situations (Gibbard 2003). These thoughts are defeasibly motivating, just as the Argument from Internalism requires.

3.2 Expressivism

The above argument concerns moral judgment as a psychological state, a kind of thought. But the term ‘judgment’ is sometimes also used for linguistic utterance or sentence containing moral terms. Likewise, the term ‘non-cognitivism’ is also used for a thesis about moral language. To minimize confusion, this entry will talk about moral terms and sentences when it comes to linguistic entities, and reserve the term ‘expressivism’ for the linguistic thesis. Bearing these terminological stipulations in mind, any argument for non-cognitivism can be extended to an argument for expressivism with the addition of some deceptively simple premises:

  1. The meaning of a sentence is determined by the mental state it expresses. (Metasemantic Psychologism)
  2. Moral sentences express moral judgments.
  3. So, moral sentences express (at least in part) non-cognitive psychological states.
  4. So, the meaning of moral sentences is determined (at least in part) by non-cognitive psychological states.

Premise 4 is the key addition. It is not the only way to arrive at a broadly expressivist theory in ethics—earlier forms, such as emotivism (Ayer 1936; Stevenson 1944) and universal prescriptivism (Hare 1952, 1963) relied on the problematic assumption that the meaning of a sentence is to be understood on the basis of the effects it is used to achieve or the speech act it is used to perform. Metasemantic Psychologism doesn't make this assumption, but simply derives the meaning of linguistic expressions from the thoughts that they express, rather than their truth-conditions or the possible worlds they rule out, as standard semantics does. As Allan Gibbard puts it,

A normative sentence, the expressivist says, expresses a state of mind; its meaning is explained not by giving its truth conditions but by telling what state of mind it expresses. (1990: 92)

It is essential to understanding expressivism that expressing a thought is not the same thing as reporting a thought. Consider the following pair of non-moral sentences, as uttered by me:

The sun is shining.

I believe that the sun is shining.

The first expresses the belief that the sun is shining. It doesn't say anything about me, but rather something about the weather. The second sentence, in contrast, reports my belief. It is about my psychology, not about the weather. It is perfectly possible that the second sentence is true while the first is false (maybe I'm fooled by a very bright lamp outside my window), so they clearly do not mean the same. Mark Schroeder (2010a) has recently emphasized that the core expressivist claim is that the sentence “Murder is wrong” is related to disapproval of murder in just the same way as the sentence “The sun is shining” is related to the belief that the sun is shining, whatever that is. The only difference is that the expressed state is non-representational.

This has significant semantic consequences, to be sure. Since non-representational states lack truth-conditions, expressivists cannot explain the inferential relations among them in the usual way. They'll have to account for the incompatibility of “Kissing cousins is wrong” and “Kissing cousins is not wrong”, for example, in terms of disagreement in attitude (Stevenson 1937) or in plan (Gibbard 2003). Attempts to do so have proven controversial, to say the least. For discussion, see the entry on Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism.

Although it is definitive of expressivism that the meanings of moral sentences are explained without appealing to their truth-conditions, it is important to note that contemporary expressivists do not deny that it makes sense to talk about moral truth or even moral facts. This is an important part of their programme of capturing the ‘realist surface’ of ordinary moral talk. Blackburn emphatically endorses a minimalist or deflationist theory of truth and facts, according to which the truth predicate is only a handy device for endorsing propositions without necessarily mentioning them, as when we say “Everything the Pope says is true”. As Blackburn puts it:

To say that an ethical view is true is just to reaffirm it, and so it is if we add the weighty words ‘really’, ‘true’, ‘fact’, and so on. To say that it is objectively true is to affirm that its truth does not vary with what we happen to think about it, and once more this is an internal, first-order ethical position. (Blackburn 1998: 296)

Given minimalism, many questions that might at first sight seem metaethical, second-order questions about ethics turn out to be first-order questions within ethics. Is it an objective fact that it is wrong to force a woman to wear a veil outside her home? As the expressivist hears this question, it is about how we should respond to forcing women to wear a veil—perhaps more specifically, whether it is acceptable for someone to force a woman to wear a veil if he happens to believe it is morally or religiously required. That is a first-order ethical question about whether our reactions to this kind of behaviour should hang on the agents' own opinions concerning it. In answering it, we thus deploy our first-order ethical opinions, possibly rethinking them in the light of recognizing that others hold opposing views.

If we answer that forcing women to wear a veil is objectively wrong, we are against it regardless of what the agents themselves think of it. Indeed, since we are against it in this way, we regard a potential change in our own opinion in favour of forcing women to wear a veil as a change for the worse, and are disposed to resist it. This is what it is, for an expressivist, to regard a moral claim as true independently of anyone's opinion of it. Expressivism is thus consistent with objectivist first-order views and is not committed to the idea that were we to come to feel differently about ethical issues, ethical facts themselves would change.

The extent to which expressivism can accommodate moral truth, facts, and objectivity has created no small amount of unclarity about what the real difference between expressivist and non-expressivist views really is (see Dreier 2004). To make things even more confusing, contemporary expressivists also condone talk of moral beliefs, as long as they are understood as whatever states sentences express, representational or non-representational. Perhaps the key difference is simply that expressivists are committed to the priority of non-representational attitudes in metasemantic explanation. For a more detailed discussion, see again the entry on Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism.

3.3 Subjectivism and Ideal Dispositionalism

Sentimentalists need not think that moral judgments just are sentiments or attitudes of some sort. They might also be beliefs about sentiments or the disposition to cause sentiments. The related semantic view is that moral sentences are about the speaker's (or someone else's) sentiments or dispositions to cause sentiments. Although it is surprisingly unusual to do so, it is important to distinguish these views about judgments, concepts, and language from similar-sounding views about properties and facts, since the arguments for and against differ. This section will focus solely on the first kind of issue.

The simplest semantic account along these lines is Speaker Subjectivism, according to which the truth condition of an utterance of “Stealing is wrong” is that the speaker disapproves of stealing. This disapproval need not consist simply in a negative sentiment towards stealing, but may also be thought of, in a Gibbard-like fashion, as endorsement of a moral standard or norm that prohibits stealing. In other words, the speaker reports the same attitude that expressivists say the sentence expresses. This view is suggested by some things that Hume says, in particular the following:

[W]hen you pronounce any action or character to be vicious, you mean nothing, but that from the constitution of your nature you have a feeling or sentiment of blame from the contemplation of it. (T 469)

For speaker subjectivism, there is a non-cognitive element to moral judgment, but moral sentences can nevertheless be given standard truth-conditional semantics. Its attraction is thus making sense of judgment internalism without the need for non-standard semantics. A generalized version of Speaker Subjectivism is Metaethical Contextualism, according to which the content of a moral sentence of the form “A ought to f” is a proposition to the effect that A ought to f relative to standards S, where S is determined by the context of utterance (Dreier 1990; Björnsson and Finlay 2010). For contextualists, the standard need not be one that is endorsed by the speaker (although it often is).

The standard objection to subjectivism and contextualism is the Missing Disagreement Problem. Suppose that Ann says “Eating people is wrong” and Beth, a committed cannibal, replies “No, eating people is not wrong.” According to simple speaker subjectivism, what Ann said is true if and only if Ann disapproves of eating people, and what Beth said is true if and only if Beth doesn't disapprove of eating people. It can obviously be simultaneously true that Ann disapproves of eating people and Beth doesn't, so their utterances don't contradict each other. Indeed, since what Ann says is true on this picture, it looks like it should be possible for Beth to say “What Ann says is true, but eating people is not wrong”. So it seems they don't disagree any more than if Ann had said “My name begins with an A” and Beth had said “No, my name begins with a B”. Yet they do, so Speaker Subjectivism has a problem.

Contemporary subjectivists and contextualists are well aware of this problem, and offer various suggestions to solve it. Gilbert Harman's response appeals to pragmatics. When we say that something is wrong, we presuppose that the hearer shares our moral standards (Harman 2000: 36). Our conversation is about what the content of the standard we endorse is, or what it entails about a particular case. These are issues about which we can genuinely disagree. If, however, it turns out the hearer doesn't share the standard, the conversation is defective, and the speaker and hearer are indeed talking past each other. According to Harman, the speaker should then withdraw or explicitly relativize the assertion, or be guilty of linguistic impropriety (ibid.). This is debatable at best, however.

In any case, this pragmatic strategy appears to unduly restrict the scope of possible disagreement, since it is possible to disagree with people who are not part of the conversation. Gunnar Björnsson and Stephen Finlay (2010) offer an alternative pragmatic proposal, according to which expressions of disagreement do not target the proposition that the original utterance actually expressed (which may be true relative to the speaker's standards) but rather a different but suitably related proposition that is relevant to conversational purposes, such as persuading another or deciding what to do. If Beth says to Ann “That's not true”, she may be talking about the proposition that eating people is wrong-relative-to-Beth's-standards rather than what Ann strictly speaking said. This suggestion is related to the third kind of subjectivist response, which is retreat to the same notion that expressivists use: the disagreement does not consist in contradictory beliefs, but disagreement in attitude. Assume, for simplicity, that disapproval involves desire to have the agent punished, and approval a desire not to have the agent punished. Then even if Ann's and Beth's utterances don't contradict one another, they disagree in the sense that it is not possible to simultaneously satisfy the desires entailed by their sincere utterances when they issue a verdict on cannibalism. If Ann gets her way, Beth doesn't, and vice versa.

Another issue for Speaker Subjectivism is that the subject matter of the moral thought is not distinctively evaluative: if Ellen is a Presbyterian and thinks that stealing is wrong, the content of Ellen's thought might be just that stealing is such as to arouse disapproval in Presbyterians. Someone else could have a thought with the same content without thereby making a moral evaluation of stealing (Egan 2012: 566). The evaluative aspect is external to the belief, and consists rather in something like identifying as a Presbyterian, which involves a desire-like attitude towards avoiding things that don't fit the Presbyterian moral code. Consequently, there is no commitment to a distinct kind of evaluative fact. It is not clear whether this is a problem or an advantage for the theory—according to Jamie Dreier (2009), it is the latter.

Ideal Dispositionalist views evade problems with Speaker Subjectivism with two moves. The first is idealization: the beliefs and sentences refer not to the speaker's views, but to those of a suitably idealized subject (perhaps an idealized version of the speaker). At the level of logical form, ought claims may have a tacit argument place for a standard, just as for contextualists—but the standard is context-invariant. The second is dispositionalization: the reference is not to anyone's actual sentiments, but to sentiments they would have in suitable circumstances. Suggestions of this type of view can be found in Hume and Smith—recall their talk of correcting our sentiments by reference to the common point of view or the impartial spectator's response. Here is a recognizably Smithian formulation of this kind of view:

To judge that X is wrong is to believe that any informed impartial spectator would disapprove of X.

Roderick Firth's (1952) Ideal Observer Theory is a more contemporary variant of this kind of view. He formulates it as an analysis of the meaning of ethical statements, but it can also be taken as an account of the corresponding thoughts. In general form, it is as follows:

To judge that X has a moral property is to believe that any ideal observer would have an ethically significant reaction to X in conditions ideal for doing so.

By an ‘ethically significant reaction’ Firth means

the kind of moral experience which we take to be evidence, under ideal conditions, for the truth of our ethical judgments. (Firth 1952: 326)

He leaves it open whether the reaction is sentimental, so there are possible variants of Ideal Observer Theory that are not sentimentalist. In specifying the characteristics of the ideal observer, Firth uses a ‘pragmatic methodology’ of

examining the procedures which we actually regard, implicitly or explicitly, as the rational ones for deciding ethical questions. (ibid. 332)

If we actually disqualify someone's ethical verdicts because she is ignorant of non-moral facts, failure to vividly imagine what something would actually be like, partiality, non-moral emotions, and inconsistency, this shows that we implicitly regard moral judgements as valid only when made by an omniscient, omnipercipient, impartial, dispassionate, consistent, but otherwise normal judge (ibid. 333–345). These are then the characteristics of the ideal observer.

Ideal Dispositionalist views avoid the Missing Disagreement Problem. For example, if Ann believes that any informed impartial spectator would disapprove of X and Beth believes it's not the case that any informed impartial spectator would not disapprove of X, their beliefs contradict each other and they straightforwardly disagree. However, this victory for idealized views is achieved by detachment from people's own actual attitudes, which leads to the Missing Motivation Problem. The attraction that simple subjectivism, contextualism, and non-cognitivism share is that if moral thoughts consist in attitudes or beliefs about standards one endorses, their putative non-contingent connection to motivation is unproblematic. But how could beliefs about dispositions to cause sentimental responses in ideal subjects non-contingently motivate ordinary thinkers, given the Humean Theory of Motivation (Mackie 1980: 69)? Some might have the desire to do what an impartial spectator would approve of, but what about those who don't? As Richard Joyce (2013) has put it, it appears that one may be just as unmoved by such thoughts as by the belief that drunken Vikings would mock the performance of an action, and quite rationally so.

A well-known response to a version of the Missing Motivation Problem is developed by Michael Smith (1994: 1997). Smith begins with the initially appealing view that to think that something is desirable is not just to desire it, but to believe that one would desire it, were one fully rational, where to be fully rational is to have no false beliefs, to have all the relevant true beliefs, and to have a coherent and unified set of desires. Given that becoming fully rational might itself change what's desirable for me, Smith prefers an Ideal Advisor model, according to which thinking that A-ing is desirable for me is to think that a fully rational version of me would want me to desire to A. Smith's claim is that attributing this content to people's normative beliefs makes best sense of their “inferential and quasi-inferential potentials” (1997: 103), although few are capable of articulating it.

Given this content for desirability beliefs, Smith poses the question: would S be more coherent, were she to believe that her fully rational counterpart would desire her to A and desire to A, or were she to have have the same belief without the desire (Smith 1994)? Smith claims that the former belief-desire pair makes for a more coherent psychology, other things being equal. Since rationality requires coherence, rationality thus requires people's desires to line up with their desirability beliefs. So rational agents are motivated by their beliefs about their Ideal Advisors' desires, and motivation is thus non-contingently linked with normative judgments. This view allows for the conceptual possibility of amoralists, as long as they are irrational.

Smith's argument is about desirability or normative reason thoughts, not about moral judgments. But he proposes to bridge the gap by arguing that first, the desires of fully rational agents converge regardless of their starting points (Smith 1994), and second, that among these convergent desires are desires for the sort of things that commonsense morality requires (Smith 2012). Both of these claims are controversial, and together make Smith a rationalist rather than sentimentalist ideal observer theorist. But there may be room for a sentimentalist theory to appropriate something like his model without its rationalist elements. That is, it might be a requirement of rationality that we are motivated to do what we believe an informed impartial spectator would not resent us for, for example. For Adam Smith, the voice of an imagined impartial spectator is the voice of conscience, the part within us that stands in judgment of ourselves. It is the “peculiar office” or function of conscience to “bestow censure or applause upon all the other principles of our nature” (TMS 191). So Adam Smith might argue that an agent who believes that any impartial spectator would desire her to do A and fails to desire to A is less coherent (and thus less rational, other things being equal) than one who combines the belief with a desire to A. What is decisive is that our beliefs about an ideal spectator's attitudes define where we ourselves stand, unlike our beliefs about drunk Vikings, for example.

3.4 Sensibility Theory and Neo-Sentimentalism

The cognitivist sentimentalist views discussed in the previous section appealed to beliefs about dispositions to cause sentimental responses in certain kind of subjects. The other main type of cognitivist view, sensibility theory, regards judgments as beliefs about merited responses (Wiggins 1987; McDowell 1998). Sensibility theory begins with an analogy with secondary quality concepts, such as colour concepts. These concepts, according to many, are concepts of mind-dependent qualities whose existence isn't independent of human sensibility. On this view, to experience something as red, say, is experience it as being such as to look red to normal human beings in suitable conditions.

This is, to be sure, a controversial view, as many think that colour experience presents its object as having a simple, non-dispositional property. Nevertheless, sensibility theorists believe it offers a partial analogy with moral experience, the difference being that value is

conceived to be not merely such as to elicit the appropriate ‘attitude’ … but rather such as to merit it. (McDowell 1985: 143)

When we conceive of value in this way, we perceive there to be a reason for, say, admiring or emulating someone (McDowell 1979).

This state of perceiving or conceiving of there being a reason is a belief of a unique and controversial sort. According to John McDowell (1978), it can explain a virtuous person's action without the help of a related desire playing a causal role (although we can rightly attribute a desire to a person as a consequence of their being motivated by the perception of a reason). McDowell thus rejects the Humean Theory of Motivation (premise 2 in the Argument from Internalism). His arguments are inspired by his reading of Aristotle rather than the Early Modern sentimentalist tradition. The Argument from Uncodifiability is that explaining a virtuous person's action in terms of a desire for doing N things, where N is a natural property of actions, combined with the belief that something is N falsely presumes that there is some finite and codifiable natural kind N corresponding to every virtuous quality in actions.

Take honesty. It is not just a matter of always speaking truly, for example, or not misleading others. Sometimes honesty requires being more forthcoming with information, sometimes less (it is not dishonest not to tell everything to a gossip journalist). On the Aristotelian view, there isn't a pattern that could be captured in non-evaluative terms, and hence no explanation of action in terms of an independently intelligible desire to instantiate such a pattern:

Occasion by occasion, one knows what to do, if one does, not by applying universal principles but by being a certain kind of person: one who sees situations in a certain distinctive way. (McDowell 1979: 73)

The distinctive way a virtuous person sees a situation is that certain features, like someone's need to know something, are salient to her: they silence other concerns. Other things do not stand out as calling for action, and this suffices to explain what the agent does.

A familiar objection is that it is possible for someone to share the virtuous person's belief or “conception of the situation” but nevertheless lack the motivation. McDowell denies this:

[T]he relevant conceptions are not so much as possessed except by those whose wills are influenced appropriately. (McDowell 1978: 87)

One argument in favour of this is that there is a difference between being virtuous and being continent. Both kinds of agents do the right thing—for example, both remain faithful to their partner. But the continent agent has to struggle with competing desires that cloud their attention on the noble and the fine. She has to muster willpower to keep from temptation. The difference between her and the virtuous person, on this picture, is not in the first instance a conative one, but a difference in what is salient, which is simultaneously a cognitive and affective difference. As David McNaughton maintains, “a way of seeing a situation may itself be a way of caring or feeling” (McNaughton 1988: 113). A consequence of this view is that the process of coming to appreciate practical reasons will involve shaping the agent's motivational sensitivities and may itself be akin to a non-rational conversion rather than to rational deliberation from existing motives (McDowell 1995: 100–101).

Purported states of mind with both conative and cognitive features are often derogatorily labeled “besires” (Altham 1986) by those who don't believe in them. The basic argument in defense of the Humean theory, presented notably by Michael Smith (1994: 119–125), is that beliefs and desires are modally separable: it is at least conceivable, and according to Smith actual, that someone maintains the belief that they ought to do something while losing the associated desire, due to depression, say. In response, McDowell would have to insist that in becoming depressed, one's conception of the situation changes, even if one maintains (or acquires) a deflated belief—the sort of cognitive state that a merely continent person has that overlaps with the virtuous person's conception. This is a less outrageous move than is often assumed. After all, it is commonsensical to say that a depressed person sees things differently, even if some aspect of continuity is retained.

Sensibility theories belong in the category Justin D'Arms and Daniel Jacobson (2000a) have labelled neo-sentimentalism. It is, officially, the view that evaluative concepts are concepts of appropriateness of sentimental responses. (As discussed in Section 4.3, neo-sentimentalists often make related metaphysical claims about evaluative properties.) That is, to think that something is shameful is to think that shame is appropriate or that there is sufficient reason for it. Gibbard's account is a non-cognitivist variant of this view, since for him thoughts about appropriateness are non-cognitive, whereas McDowell and Wiggins's view is cognitivist, since according to them thoughts about merit are beliefs (or, perhaps, besires).

A key motivation for neo-sentimentalism is that making a judgment about desirability or shamefulness is distinct from desiring or being ashamed. The point of using and introducing normative concepts is to guide our attitudes rather than just express or report them. A clear advantage of this view is that it promises to account for the rich variety of evaluative judgments we have—we don't just have thoughts about right and wrong, but also about who's enviable or admirable or detestable or funny.

Neo-sentimentalism faces a variety of challenges. Francois Schroeter (2005) argues that warranted emotional responses do not determine the extension the most important evaluative concepts, such as dangerous or wrong, but only minor ones that make explicit reference to emotion, such as fearful or shameful. Schroeter contends that the ultimate criterion for determining whether something is dangerous, for example, is whether it is liable to cause harm, where harm can be understood in response-independent terms, such as loss of bodily integrity (Schroeter 2005: 343). In work in preparation, D'Arms and Jacobson respond by pointing out that not everything that threatens to violate bodily integrity is dangerous, nor is everything that is dangerous a threat to bodily integrity (or some other response-independent feature). Our inquiry into what is dangerous will be ultimately about the fittingness of fear, even if we can use response-independent characterizations (is it likely to kill or hurt someone?) as useful rules of thumb in reasoning about danger or other evaluative features.

Shaun Nichols (2008) criticizes neo-sentimentalist accounts on the basis that they cannot make sense of moral judgment in young children. If neo-sentimentalists are right, to think that something is wrong, for example, is to think that guilt is fitting for doing it—but, Nichols claims, children who distinguish moral from conventional violations do not yet possess the concept of guilt. This is an empirically fraught issue, since it is not easy to determine either whether children make full-blown moral judgments or experience guilt. But there is some evidence that very young children (from 22 months on) exhibit behavioural signs of guilt (such as gaze avoidance and bodily tension) after a mishap (Kochanska et al. 2002). Perhaps the more interesting question is the development of the sense of appropriateness of emotional responses.

D'Arms and Jacobson themselves say that both varieties of neo-sentimentalism face what they call the Conflation Problem (2000a: 732). In general terms, it is that for any attitude Y, S may think that Y is appropriate towards X without thinking that X is Y-able, and vice versa. If a dictator will kill a hundred people unless I admire him, I may think it is appropriate for me to admire him to save all those lives. Nevertheless, I may think the dictator is not admirable. If a colleague gets a promotion, I may think she is enviable. Nevertheless, I may not think it is appropriate for me to envy my colleague, as it would manifest pettiness and worsen the atmosphere of the department.

Since most responses to the Conflation Problem draw on metaphysical considerations about right and wrong kinds of reasons for attitudes, they will be discussed in Section 4.3. It is, however, worth noting here that some deny there is a genuine problem. What seem to be wrong kind of reasons for an attitude are not, in fact, reasons for the attitude at all, but for wanting to have it (Gibbard 1990; Way 2012). The dictator's threat is no reason for me to admire him, since it's not the sort of thing to which I can directly respond with admiration. (Nor does the thought that envy would be petty directly reduce envy, sadly.) I can, and probably should, respond to it by wanting to admire him, and trying to bring it about that I admire him. But, on this line of response, the thought I have isn't that I have sufficient reason to admire the dictator, but rather that I have sufficient reason to want to admire him. As these are distinct thoughts, there is no conflation: even in the presence of the threat (or, more generally, any intuitively wrong kind of reason for an attitude), I don't find the attitude itself an appropriate or rational response. Conversely, in the case of the enviable colleague, I do find envy appropriate, given her promotion, but nevertheless take myself to have sufficient reason to want and try to bring about not envying her, given the bad consequences for the departmental atmosphere. (For further discussion, see also the entry on Fitting Attitude Theories of Value.)

3.5 Hybrid Approaches

Hybrid theories solve the problem of fitting together the representational and practical aspects of moral judgment by arguing that both cognitive and non-cognitive states are in play somehow: moral judgments have both a sentimental and a non-sentimental aspect. Several options have been explored recently. Hybrid expressivists argue that moral sentences express both kinds of state. Hybrid state theorists claim that there are psychological states that have both representational and non-representational aspects. Moral thought pluralists distinguish between several kinds of moral thought.

Hybrid expressivism comes in many varieties. Some take the behaviour of pejoratives such as ‘frog’ (for a French person) as the model for their account. Calling someone a ‘frog’ conveys both a belief that the person is French and a negative attitude toward the French. Daniel Boisvert (2008) argues that a normative utterance like “Stealing is wrong” similarly expresses both a belief that stealing is wrong (which, for Boisvert, is the belief that it has whatever natural property the correct moral theory says it has) and disapproval of stealing. On his view, the belief and attitude are determined by the meaning of the term independently of the speaker's views, just as in the case of ‘frog’.

In contrast, Michael Ridge's ‘ecumenical expressivism’ (Ridge 2006) involves speaker-relativity. Ridge's theory is complex and evolving, but the basic idea is simple enough. Take the judgment that I must tell the truth to the judge. As a first approximation, such judgment consists in approval of actions of a certain kind, and the belief that telling the truth to the judge is an action of that kind (cf. Barker 2000). Maybe I approve of actions that maximize utility, and believe that telling the truth to the judge maximizes utility.

A little less roughly, the judgment amounts to thinking that any acceptable standard for practical reasoning requires me to tell the truth to the judge. And this, in turn, is a matter of having a normative perspective N, and having the representational belief that any standard admitted by N requires me to tell the truth to the judge (Ridge forthcoming). The first of these is a complex desire-like state—roughly, embracing a policy that admits a set of standards as authoritative. (In the example, such standards are utilitarian, but different people have different normative perspectives.) The second is an ordinary belief about these very normative standards: that they require telling the truth to the judge.

Ridge argues that this type of view accounts for the attractions of non-cognitivism, chiefly avoiding problematic ontological commitment to non-deflationary moral facts, and explaining practicality. Having a normative perspective involves a desire-like attitude towards what one believes to be required by certain standards, practically rational agents form an instrumental desire to perform such actions. The cognitive element serves to explain the compositionality and inferential features of moral language. For example, the judgment expressed by “Either there is nothing wrong with watching a film every night or Jesse is going to hell” consists of a normative perspective N and belief that either no standard admitted by N forbids watching a film every night or Jesse is going to hell. Validity of inferences is then understood in terms of avoiding inconsistency of the associated beliefs. There is no need for a separate logic of attitudes. (For worries about hybrid expressivism, see Schroeder 2009.)

Jesse Prinz's (2007) account of moral judgment can be classified as a hybrid state theory. The key to his view is his theory of emotions (Prinz 2004), according to which they are perceptions of patterns of bodily changes that represent what they are “set up to be set off by”—what it is their function to detect—just the same way as any other psychological states do on teleological theories of representation. For Prinz, a moralsentiment is a disposition to respond to certain actions with a range of self- and other-directed blame- or praise-constituting emotions, such as guilt, contempt, anger, and gratitude. (He also calls it a moral rule—to have internalized a rule against stealing consists in being disposed to respond negatively to stealing.) A moral judgment consists in the emotion that results from activating a sentiment, such as anger at stealing or shame for fleeing. The anger represents stealing as being such as to cause disapprobation in the judge—that is, as morally wrong, according to Prinz's moral metaphysics (see Section 4.1). This means the judgment can be true or false. It also motivates punishing the agent. Other emotions, and hence judgments, have different motivational effects—disgust may motivate to avoid the agent instead.

In addition to the standard internalist argument, Prinz employs the Argument from Parsimony. He claims that empirical research (some of which was discussed in Section 2.1) shows that moral judgments are accompanied by emotions, influenced by emotions, and give rise to emotions. Prinz acknowledges that non-sentimentalists may have a story to tell about all of these phenomena, but the simplest explanation is that moral concepts are themselves constituted by emotions or emotional dispositions (Prinz 2007: 21–47). One challenge to Prinz's view is thus the seeming possibility of non-emotional moral judgment.

Finally, moral thought pluralism is a very new approach, although Elizabeth Radcliffe (2006) argues that Hume himself distinguished between two kinds of moral thought. Linda Zagzebski (2003) and Uriah Kriegel (2012) argue in different ways that there are two kinds of moral judgment, one of which contains an affective element. Antti Kauppinen (forthcoming a) distinguishes between moral appearances, which are constituted by manifestations of sentiments we expect others to share, and moral judgments, which are (implicitly) beliefs about what would be permitted, required, or recommended by standards an ideal subject would endorse. Moral appearances are taken to be parallel to perceptual appearances—non-doxastic states that attract assent to their propositional contents (see Section 5.1). As with other appearances, the existence of moral thoughts that are not judgments is clearest in cases in which they clash with judgment.

Kauppinen draws on the observation that it can seem to us that what we do is wrong even when we sincerely believe it is right, or vice versa. He maintains that moral seemings have a distinctive phenomenological and motivational character, which is best explained by their being sentimental in nature. Motivational internalism is thus true of moral appearances. Since appearances cause moral beliefs, the two kinds of thought often co-occur. But moral beliefs can be arrived at and held independently of moral appearances. This accounts for the force of motivational externalist objections and the possibility of amoralism. Since the beliefs are ordinary descriptive ones, there is no need for a separate moral semantics. Pluralist views thus split the difference between non-cognitivist and cognitivist sentimentalism: each is, broadly speaking, true of one important kind of moral thought (in contrast to hybrid views, according to which each thought has both non-cognitive and cognitive elements).

4. Moral Metaphysics

It is an appealing thought that moral (and other evaluative) facts and properties are not just brutely out there independently of human thought and sensibility. Take the evaluative property of being funny. How could something be funny, if no actual human being was ever amused by it? How could something be outrageous if it failed to generate any outrage when known about, even in those who care about the victim? For sentimentalists, value, including moral value, is anthropocentric (D'Arms and Jacobson 2006).

Sentimentalists agree with error theorists that sui generis, non-natural moral facts would be queer, and that mind-independent natural facts are unfit for the role of moral facts. Non-cognitivist sentimentalists treat moral facts as projections of moral attitudes. Although there is excellent reason to think Hume wasn't a projectivist, he gave one of the classic formulations in saying that taste

has a productive faculty, and gilding and staining all natural objects, borrowed from internal sentiment, raises in a manner a new creation. (1751: 269)

We take a sentimental response in ourselves, say envy, and attribute to the worldly object a feature it doesn't really have, such as being enviable.

Error theorists treat this projection as much the same as the attribution of agency to clouds or trees by some primitive culture: a predictable false belief. Contemporary expressivists, in contrast, believe that attribution of moral facts and properties serves a purpose. It enables us to express our commitments in a way that provides a focal point for disagreement and debate. As discussed above, on deflationary views of truth and facts, it is a first-order question whether some attribution is in error or not.

A distinctive kind of sentimentalist moral metaphysics is endorsed by cognitivist sentimentalists who believe that moral and evaluative facts are metaphysically determined by some sort of sentimental responses. According to such views, moral properties are response-dependent in one way or another. Several varieties will be discussed below. For a brief overview of the different types of response-dependence accounts and their relation to other main views in moral metaphysics, see the Response-Dependence Supplement.

4.1 Subjectivism and Relativism

The simplest way to link moral properties with our emotional or conative responses would be to say that what makes something wrong is that it is disapproved of, or bad that it is not desired. No one holds a view this elementary, since it entails that an undetected murder isn't morally wrong, for example. It also leaves undetermined whose disapproval is at issue—what if one person disapproves of an action but someone else approves? Simple Subjectivism improves on it by indexing moral properties to subjects and referring to dispositions to cause responses rather than actual responses. What makes something wrong-for-Mary, for example, is that Mary would disapprove of it, were she aware of it. A related relativist proposal is that something is wrong-for-Mary if and only if Mary accepts a normative standard or framework that prohibits it (Harman 1975).

As noted in Section 2, subjectivists or contextualists about moral semantics need not think that there are specifically evaluative properties at all, only natural properties that can be conceived of under an evaluative mode of presentation that involves a non-cognitive element. Some nevertheless do so. Edward Westermarck maintained that

[T]o name an act good or bad, ultimately implies that it is apt to give rise to an emotion of approval or disapproval in him who pronounces the judgment. (Westermarck 1906: 4).

According to Jesse Prinz,

An action has the property of being morally wrong (right) just in case there is an observer who has a sentiment of disapprobation (approbation) toward it. (Prinz 2007: 92)

(Recall that for Prinz a sentiment is a disposition to feel various emotions, so wrongness doesn't hang on someone actually having a negative reaction to something.) But this claim is highly implausible, given that wrongness is unindexed. It is true of almost anything that someone will disapprove of it, and someone else will approve of it. Thus, female genital cutting, for example, is simultaneously both (absolutely) right and wrong. This is a steep theoretical cost.

The Missing Rigidity Problem for Simple Subjectivism is that it seems to entail that if we were to begin to approve of slavery, slavery would come to be morally right—it would be true that we would respond to it positively when encountering it, say. But surely the correct description of such a scenario would not be that slavery has become right, but that we have become worse people (Broad 1944/5: 151). The Missing Fallibility Problem, which also has to do with tying value closely to our actual responses, is that a simple subjectivist view seems to leave insufficient room for mistakes about value. If what's right is determined by what I approve, I can only be mistaken about what's right if I'm mistaken about what I in fact approve. But it is very implausible that the remedy for moral mistakes is better introspection.

4.2 Ideal Dispositionalism

Paralleling the case of moral judgment, problems with Simple Subjectivism motivate a move to Ideal Dispositionalism. According to this type of view, the extension of moral or evaluative properties is determined by the sentimental responses of idealized subjects of some sort, or responses under idealized conditions. Consequently, the Missing Fallibility Problem is handily skirted: we can no doubt be mistaken about what an ideal observer would approve.

Ideal Dispositionalist views also avoid the Missing Rigidity Problem. Depending on the details, it may suffice to idealize the subject of the sentiments: maybe no impartial spectator would approve of slavery, even if the majority of people were to have a pro-slavery sensibility. In case the idealization process is path-dependent (so that the outcome depends on the unidealized initial sentiments of the subject), Ideal Dispositionalists may make a rigidification move (Wiggins 1987: 206). They can say that the starting point for idealization is constituted by actually normal sentiments, which include a strong desire not to be at the mercy of the good will of others, among others. Thus, rigidified ideal observers would disapprove of slavery, even if it became statistically normal to approve of it.

Ideal Dispositionalism comes in several varieties, which often correspond to views about the content of moral judgment (Firth 1952; Lewis 1989; Smith 1994). Even if they avoid problems with fallibility and rigidity, there are a number of further challenges. Five will be discussed here.

First, the Euthyphro Dilemma derives its name from the Platonic dialogue in which Socrates argues against a version of Divine Command theory. Applied to subjectivism, it can be presented as follows:

  1. A subjectivist theory defines the subject whose responses determine the extension of evaluative properties either in terms whose application presupposes mind-independent evaluative truths (for short, evaluative terms) or in non-evaluative terms.
  2. If the subject is defined in evaluative terms, the theory collapses into mind-independent realism: it presupposes the existence of at least some mind-independent evaluative truths.
  3. If the subject is defined in non-evaluative terms, her responses will be morally arbitrary and lacking in authority to determine the extension of evaluative properties.
  4. So, a subjectivist theory is either self-defeating (because of collapse into realism) or false (because of yielding arbitrary extensions for moral properties).

It is clear that subjectivist accounts with any kind of reductive ambition cannot embrace the first horn of the dilemma (see below for non-reductivist accounts). So it is the second horn that they must face. What exactly is the problem with it? According to Russ Shafer-Landau, it is that

it may be impossible to craft a set of [non-evaluative] constraints on attitude formation such that the emerging attitudes yield prescriptions that match up with our views about what constitutes paradigmatically moral and immoral behaviour (Shafer-Landau 2003: 41)

The challenge is that ideal observers, when defined in non-evaluative terms, might approve of bad things, like ethnic cleansing, which would counterintuitively entail that ethnic cleansing would be morally right.

However, Shafer-Landau admits that there is no knock-down argument to the effect that any idealization in non-evaluative terms will yield counterintuitive results. Here a Humean might draw comfort from her explanatory theory: if our most robust actual moral intuitions are explained by the sentimental responses we have when we approximate the Common Point of View, as the Humean claims, it is after all highly unlikely that the anyone who successfully occupies that perspective would approve of something we actually find a paradigmatic moral wrong, such as genocide.

Michael Huemer offers a different angle on the second horn. He says that if an ideal observer

has no moral reason for desiring what he does, then his desires are arbitrary and have no moral import. Why would someone's desiring or approving of something for no reason make that thing good? (Huemer 2005: 63)

The problem with this line is that it does not follow from the fact that something is not approved for a moral reason that it is approved for no reason. There is something about an action in virtue of which it would be approved of by any ideal observer: perhaps it involves keeping one's promise. The Ideal Observer theorist says that what makes this natural fact a right-making feature is precisely that it would be approved of by any ideal observer.

Perhaps the real challenge that the Euthyphro poses concerns the normative authority of the responses of any kind of subject defined in non-evaluative terms. One way to develop this challenge may be called the Missing Normativity Problem. Many believe that moral rightness or wrongness are categorically reason-giving features of actions. Everyone, regardless of their interests and desires, has a reason to refrain from morally wrong behaviour. Suppose, then, that to be wrong is to be such as to be disapproved of by any ideal observer. On a reductivist view, this is a natural property of the action, specified in non-normative terms. The challenge is: why would such a natural property be categorically reason-giving? Why should people care about doing only things that would not be disapproved of by a hypothetical spectator?

As Johnston puts it,

To say that something would be valued under condition K is not thereby to commend it, but only to make a descriptive remark about its relation to certain psychological conditions. (Johnston 1989: 157)

Similarly, Blackburn notes that evaluative judgments are

more like verdicts than hypotheses about the suspected reactions of some other group under some putative circumstances. (Blackburn 1993: 274)

These challenges may be ways of spelling out the force of G. E. Moore's (1903) famous Open Question Argument: since it makes sense to grant that some X would be disapproved of by any impartial, informed, but otherwise normal observer, but nevertheless deny that X is morally wrong, there is reason to think that being disapproved of by an ideal observer is not the same thing as being morally wrong. To be sure, the Open Question Argument is contentious, and there are a number of standard responses: perhaps the identity of the properties is a posteriori, like that of water and H2O (Brink 1989), or perhaps it is an unobvious conceptual truth that we can read off the platitudes surrounding our concepts (Smith 1994). (For discussion of the Open Question Argument, see the entry on Moral Naturalism.)

The Missing Normativity Problem is certainly one of the main outstanding challenges to any reductivist version of sentimentalism. One direction in which a solution might be sought is drawing on the kind of response I suggested might be given to the Missing Motivation Problem. Suppose there is a rational requirement for any agent to care about what their ideal advisor or any impartial spectator would endorse, for example. If we have to care about what our ideal advisor would want us to do in order to be coherent, or perhaps in order to be self-governing agents in the first place, then the reactions of a suitable subject in suitable circumstances will be normative for us, regardless of our contingent desires and interests. To be sure, this kind of constitutivist sentimentalist response is yet to be defended in print.

Third, Nick Zangwill (2003) argues that response-dependence theories can't account for acting from the motive of duty. It seems we can do something just because it is the right thing to do. When we do so, our reason isn't always that we want others, even ideal observers, to approve of us or be disposed to do so (Zangwill 2003: 286). This is something that Adam Smith clearly recognized. He distinguished between being motivated by love of praise and by love of praise-worthiness (TMS 132–3, 147). The latter, however, he identified with desire for self-approbation (the approval of the imagined impartial spectator) and for “possessing those qualities, and performing those actions, which we love and admire in other people” (TMS 150), which is for a wise man “the principal object, about which he can or ought to be anxious.” (TMS 136) Doing something out of the motive of duty is more plausibly understood in terms of dread of “doing any thing which can render us the just and proper objects of the hatred and contempt of our fellow-creatures” (TMS 137), such as failing to do our duty. It is not obvious that the kind of motivations that Smith describes amount to the “arrant cynicism” Zangwill charges response-dependence accounts with (2003: 287), even though they involve desire for approval.

The fourth issue is the Indeterminacy Problem. Given a characterisation of an ideal observer, is there really such a thing as an action that would be approved of by any ideal observer? Here is how Richard Brandt formulated the objection:

The fact of ethnology and psychological theory suggest that there could (causally) be two persons, both “ideal observers” in Firth's sense, who would have different or even opposed reactions (approval, experience of apparent requiredness) with respect to the same act, say on account of past conditioning, a different system of desires, etc. (Brandt 1955: 408)

If ideal observers disagree, there is, according to the theory, no fact of the matter. This problem derives from an essential feature of idealized dispositional theories: the idealization begins from what people are actually like, and the process may not guarantee convergence in the relevant respects. The only two possibilities are going relativist (as Brandt himself does) or defining the process of idealization so as to guarantee convergence. The latter, however, threatens to disengage the ideal responses from motivation and lose the connection between values and beings like us.

Finally, the Unmotivated Idealization Problem is that it is not obvious that the move from actual responses or dispositions to ideal dispositions has a rationale that is consistent with the core ideas of response-dependence theory. David Enoch (2005) has recently made a forceful case for this problem. He notes that if there are response-independent facts, it makes good sense to privilege responses of certain kind of subjects in certain conditions, because such features of subjects and conditions are conducive to tracking the response-independent facts. But that option is obviously closed for the subjectivist.

Enoch claims that there is no real alternative rationale that is not ad hoc or that doesn't tacitly rely on response-independent realism. For example, appealing to our actual justificatory practice, in which we may privilege responses under full imaginative acquaintance, for example, is not an option, since that practice is itself best explained by the underlying assumption that there are mind-independent moral facts (Enoch 2005: 774). However, Hume might object that the rationale for stepping back from our actual sentimental responses is avoiding “continual contradictions in society and conversation” and other practical problems (see Section 2.2). If this is right, our actual justificatory practice and the privileged place it gives to reflectively corrected responses thus has an explanation and rationale that do not presuppose mind-independent evaluative facts. (For a different response based on the idea that uninformed desires are not really desires for a certain option but only for what the option is falsely thought to be, see Sobel 2009.)

4.3 Sensibility Theory and Neo-Sentimentalism

For sensibility theories, an evaluative property is not a disposition to cause responses in us, but the property of meriting a response from us. A sensibility theory version of the response-dependence equation looks like this:

X is M if and only if X merits R / any virtuous subject S would respond to X with R in ideal circumstances

It is an obvious and familiar complaint against views of this type that the analysis is uninformative. After all, normative terms occur on both sides of the equation: the right-hand side refers to meriting and virtuous subjects. There is no attempt to reduce evaluative properties to non-evaluative ones. Neither responses nor properties have metaphysical priority, but are instead “siblings” (McDowell 1987). One argument in favour of this is the claim that the relevant response cannot be identified independently of the (concept of the) property (Wiggins 1987: 195). Sensibility theorists nevertheless claim that the non-reductive elucidation offers an advantage over primary quality views, according to which moral properties have no essential relation to us.

In response to this point, Terence Cuneo (2001: 581) distinguishes between strong and weak primary quality views. The latter do claim that moral properties must be characterized in terms of appropriate responses, but nevertheless deny that kindness, say, is constituted by meriting responses—it is rather a mind-independent feature in virtue of which responses are merited. It is thus not clear whether the no-priority view has an advantage over weak primary quality views.

Sensibility theories are a species of what is often called a Fitting Attitudes (FA) Analysis of value (Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen 2004). The general form of an FA analysis is the following:

X is E if and only if, and because, R is an appropriate or fitting response to X / there is sufficient reason to respond to X with R.

The ‘because’ indicates that the direction of metaphysical explanation is from fittingness of attitudes to the property, and not the other way: something is good because it is fitting to desire it, and not fitting to desire because it is good. This rules out weak primary quality views, which accept that value and fitting attitudes go together, but claim that it is value that makes the attitude fitting and not vice versa. Some identify FA analyses with neo-sentimentalism (Tappolet 2011), but this is a theoretically unhelpful classification, since many forms of FA analysis regard the appropriateness or fittingness of attitudes itself as either a mind-independent normative fact that can be intellectually intuited (such as Ewing 1948) or as a truth determined by what would be rationally or reasonably accepted (such as Scanlon 1998). These FA views thus significantly depart from the key motivations for sentimentalism, and are better classified as FA variants of non-naturalism and constructivism.

The specific features of sentimentalist FA analyses come out most notably in the responses that sentimentalists can give to the metaphysical echo of the Conflation Problem, namely the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem. This is the problem that what makes a response appropriate or gives sufficient reason for it may be something that has nothing to do with the relevant value. If an evil demon threatens to smite you unless you admire it for its threat, you may have sufficient reason to admire the demon (Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen 2004). But that doesn't mean the demon is admirable—quite the contrary. In the jargon, admiration is not a fitting response to the demon, since it is appropriate for the wrong kind of reason.

There are various proposals to distinguish between right and wrong kind of reasons for attitudes, not all of which are sentimentalist (e.g., Parfit 2011). Justin D'Arms and Daniel Jacobson (2000b) present a distinctively sentimentalist alternative. Their piecemeal solution appeals to alethic standards of correctness derived from the content of the attitude in question. Assuming that an emotion has a cognitive component that presents or construes things as being in a certain way (see Section 5.1), it can be either accurate or inaccurate, depending on whether things are that way. The right kind of reasons for or against the attitude are those that bear on its accuracy. As they put it,

An emotional episode presents its object as having certain evaluative features; it is unfitting … when its object lacks those features. (2000b: 73)

The example D'Arms and Jacobson use is envy. According to them, it broadly speaking presents a rival as having a desirable possession in a negative light. The right kind of reasons bearing on whether a rival is enviable are thus those that have to do with what she possesses and its desirability relative to what you have. If a colleague gets a promotion you wanted, envy may be fitting in this sense, and consequently, given a fitting attitudes account of evaluative properties, the colleague will be enviable. This is the case even if envy is morally or prudentially inappropriate—the latter kind of reasons do not bear on the fittingness of envy.

Adam Smith offers an alternative sentimentalist account of fittingness in criticizing the intuitionist FA analyses of his time:

[T]here are some modern systems, according to which virtue consists in propriety; or in the suitableness of the affection from which we act, to the cause or object which excites it … None of those systems either give, or even pretend to give, any precise or distinct measure by which this fitness or propriety of affection can be ascertained or judged of. That precise and distinct measure can be found nowhere but in the sympathetic feelings of the impartial and well-informed spectator. (TMS 346)

A natural take on this is that Smith accepts the FA analysis that an action is wrong if and only if it is fitting to resent the agent for it, for example. But he then gives a distinctively sentimentalist cast on what it is for something to be fitting. This normative fact consists in the response being endorsed by an impartial and well-informed spectator. Kauppinen (forthcoming b) argues that if such endorsement is understood as approval of manifesting the attitude by doing what the attitude by its nature motivates one to do, and not only approval of having the attitude, Smithian sentimentalists can avoid the Wrong Kind of Reason problem. For example, admiration essentially motivates emulation (Schroeder 2010b). It is fitting only when an ideal subject of a suitable kind would approve of emulating its object. In contrast, it is appropriate for the wrong kind of reason when an ideal subject would only approve of having the attitude but not manifesting it. Insofar as a subject can be ideal in many ways—such as morally or aesthetically—this type of analysis allows distinguishing between morally and aesthetically fitting responses.

5. Moral Epistemology

Hume famously argued that we cannot infer an ‘ought’ proposition from an ‘is’ proposition, because the former introduces “a new relation” of an entirely different kind (T 469). This means we cannot come to know moral truths by theoretical reasoning from known non-moral truths. This argument is based on metaphysical and explanatory arguments to the effect that moral truths aren't the sort of relations or facts that reasoning can discover (see the Anti-Rationalism Supplement). The consequence is that ethics is epistemically autonomous. In this, epistemic sentimentalists agree with intuitionists, but they deny that basic moral propositions are self-evident, so we cannot come to know their truth merely by understanding them either. Sentimentalists also reject the Kantian idea that pure practical reason can yield moral knowledge. Instead, we come to know basic moral truths by way of emotional experience.

Epistemic sentimentalists do not, to be sure, claim that we should just go with the gut and throw reason to the wind. Hume was emphatic that theoretical reasoning is typically needed to establish the true nature and consequences of the actions and characters that we judge (e.g., Hume 1751: 268–269). Nor do sentimentalists deny that we can reason from basic moral principles to derived principles or verdicts with the help of factual premises. It is only the basic moral beliefs that cannot (or need not) be inferred from other moral or non-moral truths that are held to be supported by emotional experience.

5.1 The Perceptual Model

Talk of a moral sense suggests an epistemic picture according to which moral knowledge is similar to knowledge acquired by other senses. We simply attend to something, and immediately, without any kind of reasoning, just know whether it's right or wrong, just as we come to know the colour or shape of a car just by looking at it. This picture of immediate knowledge surely has some commonsensical appeal—I don't have to spend a lot of time thinking about whether torturing a dog is wrong. And it is no doubt often the case that belief in the presence of the wrong-making natural properties (such as intentionally causing excruciating pain to a whimpering dog) triggers an emotional reaction in us. It is plausible, and supported by empirical data (see Section 2.1), that the emotional response often precedes and perhaps causes the moral judgment. But is it a perception or something analogous?

In the case of ordinary perceptual experience, an object instantiates an observable property, such as being red, and this causes us (in the right way) to have a corresponding phenomenal representation of the object, such as a visual experience of a red object in front of us (Audi 2013). Many believe that this experience is not itself a belief, since the two can come apart: I can believe that a stick in the water is straight while it nevertheless perceptually appears to me that it is not straight. However, in an ordinary case, having a perceptual experience provides (propositional) justification for the corresponding belief, at least according to epistemological internalists. Epistemologists debate whether this requires only the absence of defeaters or also some type of warrant to rule out skeptical scenarios (see Tucker (ed.) 2013).

So is there such a thing as emotional moral perception? The answer depends, in part, on the nature of emotions. On Hume's view, a passion is “an original existence” which “contains not any representative quality, which renders it a copy of any other existence” (T 415). If this is the case, then emotional experience cannot justify belief the same way contentful perceptual experience does. Most contemporary epistemic sentimentalists reject Hume's theory of emotions. Instead, they subscribe to some variety of a representational theory of emotions, motivated by the thought that emotions can be assessed as appropriate or fitting or even rational (de Sousa 1987). This suggests that emotions are about something—that they have intentional content.

One representational theory holds that emotions involve or consist in a judgment that the target of the emotion (such as flying on an airplane) has the property that is the formal object of the emotion (such as being dangerous in the case of fear) (Kenny 1963; Lyons 1980). Sabine Roeser (2011) defends this type of account in the moral case. According to her, moral emotions are “at the same time both value judgments and affective states” (Roeser 2011: 149). On her view, they constitute intuitions just in the same sense as traditional intuitionists claim: they are direct apprehensions of non-natural states of affairs. (This is a clear case in which epistemic and metaphysical variants of sentimentalism come apart.) Any view of this type faces the challenge of explaining why our emotions would reliably track such non-natural facts. If being wrong has nothing to do with being such as to arouse a disapproving reaction in us in some suitable circumstances, why should we think that there is a reliable connection between being wrong and our disapproval? Beside the reliability concern, there is also the worry that value judgments in general are not self-justifying, so it is not clear why judgments embedded in emotion would justify further belief.

In any case, it is a well-known problem with judgmental theories of emotion in general that emotions can be recalcitrant, that is, come apart from our judgments. We can be hopeful while believing our prospects are dim, or worried in spite of judging that everything is all right. This motivates many to regard emotions as being or containing or being analogous to perceptions, in particular evaluative perceptions (de Sousa 1987; Tappolet 2000, 2011; Helm 2001; Prinz 2004, 2007; Zagzebski 2003; Goldie 2007; Döring 2007). On this type of view, emotions and perceptual experiences have many common features: they are spontaneous, informationally encapsulated (that is, relatively independent from the subject's beliefs and desires), have a characteristic phenomenology, have conceptual (and/or non-conceptual) content, and represent or construe the world as being in a certain (evaluative) way without involving judgment or belief. Consequently, they can non-inferentially but defeasibly justify evaluative belief just as sense perceptions can justify empirical belief.

The main challenge for the perceptual analogy is capturing the causal element that seems essential to genuine perception: is the wrongness of an action the sort of thing that can cause us to have a feeling of disapprobation, for example? It certainly seems plausible that what we literally perceive is the property that grounds the wrongness of the action, such as the shooting of a peaceful demonstrator by a police officer, and then respond to it with an emotional reaction, which construes the action as wrong. If so, perhaps it is better to think of emotions as quasi-perceptual appearances that constitute moral intuitions rather than perceptions (Kauppinen 2013). On this view, emotions don't represent things as having certain properties in virtue of being triggered by those properties when functioning properly, as Prinz (2004) claims, but rather in virtue of their phenomenal character. The way an emotion feels is not irrelevant to how it construes its object. The feelings involved in anger, for example, aren't directionless sensations, but have a qualitative character in virtue of which anger presents its object as offensive (Kriegel forthcoming).

As with the judgmentalist view, there is room for perceptualist or quasi-perceptualist views that are not committed to sentimentalist metaphysics, such as Tappolet (2011), as well as those that are, such as Prinz (2007). It is much easier for the latter to explain why emotions should be thought of as ways of accessing evaluative truths. They can offer a constitutive explanation of the reliability of the responses: since the facts are constitutively linked to emotional responses, there is good reason to think emotional responses track them, at least in suitable conditions.

The plausibility of the analogy or identity between emotions and perceptions hangs on the details. Critics like Mikko Salmela (2011) and Michael Brady (2011) point to various differences in cognitive processing and reason-responsiveness. Perceptualists and quasi-perceptualists also need to make clear which emotions can justify and when. Even if moral perception (or sentimental intuition) is epistemically as good as sense perception, we know that in some circumstances our senses are not reliable. But how do we know which circumstances? This calibration challenge was already noted by Hutcheson:

But may there not be a right or wrong state of our moral sense, as there is in our other senses, according as they represent their objects to be as they really are, or represent them otherwise? So may not our moral sense approve that which is vicious, and disapprove virtue, as a sickly palate may dislike grateful food, or a vitiated sight misrepresent colours or dimensions? Must we not know therefore antecedently what is morally good or evil by our reason, before we can know that our moral sense is right? (Hutcheson 1728: 177)

Hutcheson's response was to point out that even if moral sense can mislead, it doesn't follow that reason is needed to provide a standard for it, or that it's capable of doing so. After all, it's not by reasoning that we fundamentally correct mistakes of colour perception. Rather, we try to ascertain which circumstances are conducive to properly functioning perception (perhaps by way of an a priori inquiry) and then try to place ourselves in such circumstances and look again. What the suitable circumstances in the moral case are like depends on the nature of moral facts. For relativists like Prinz (2007), the only thing that matters is that our reactions genuinely reflect our sentiments towards the action. For ideal dispositionalists, David Lewis offers a basic recipe:

To find out whether we would be disposed, under ideal conditions, to value it, put yourself in ideal conditions, if you can, making sure you can tell when you have succeeded in doing so. Then find out whether you value the thing in question, i.e., whether you desire to desire it. If you do, that confirms that it is a value. (Lewis 1989: 117)

(Note that Lewis's suggestion seems to involve a kind of inference from the proposition that I'm in ideal conditions and the proposition that I value x to x being valuable. If so, his model is not a perceptualist one.) For Lewis himself, the ideal conditions for valuing are those of full imaginative acquaintance with the object. For Hume and Smith, the ideal conditions of moral judging involve occupying the ‘common point of view’ or the perspective of an impartial and well-informed spectator. As discussed in Section 2.2, they both believe that achieving this requires sympathizing (or empathizing) with the feelings or reactive attitudes of those immediately affected while controlling for predictable distortions. Unless they are felt from the common point of view, our emotional responses will not reliably track the response-dependent moral facts. Contrary to the way psychologists sometimes represent Hume, he thus does not condone relying on just any flashes of affect.

5.2 Tracking and Pragmatic Theories

Not all epistemic sentimentalists subscribe to the perceptualist model. One alternative is provided by John Allman and Jim Woodward (2008), who argue that moral intuitions (in the sense of immediate judgments resulting from what psychologists call System 1) involving emotional processing can reliably track moral facts after a suitable kind of implicit learning. They draw on empirical work on the development of expertise. In implicit learning, the learner, such as a novice nurse, is repeatedly exposed to certain cues, (such as babies manifesting different symptoms), makes certain decisions to act (giving certain kind of treatment to the baby), and then receives clear, independent feedback on whether the decisions were correct (the symptoms either go away or get worse) (Kahneman and Klein 2009). As a result, the learner may become an expert, who is able to respond immediately and appropriately to situations without necessarily being able to articulate why. Allman and Woodward's suggestion is that a similar kind of training of our emotional responses is possible in the moral case.

The core challenge for this type of view is that there is a difference between training emotions to be responsive to potentially morally relevant information, such as

mental states of others and their likely behavior in interactive situations, as well as the likely consequences of such behaviour (Allman and Woodward 2008: 173),

and training them to be responsive to moral facts themselves. It is not clear whether there is any analogue to the unambiguous and independent negative feedback that a nurse receives after giving the wrong treatment in the case of making a mistaken moral judgment.

A very different non-perceptualist suggestion is made by Shaun Nichols and Michael Gill. It draws on the empirical assumption that many core moral judgments are explained by emotions or affect-backed rules, and cannot be either explained or justified by reasoning alone (see Section 2.2). One way to respond to realizing this is giving up our emotion-based moral convictions. But Nichols and Gill argue that is problematic:

The evidence suggests that if the influence of emotion is eliminated, one's pattern of moral judgment will be incongruous or bizarre to commonsense—one's pattern of moral judgment will look to be not merely a refinement or revision of commonsense morality but a very different thing altogether. (Nichols and Gill 2008: 152)

Given that our actual judgments are largely explained by affective responses to rule-prohibited actions, we have to either accept that emotions can justify or “give up the bulk of commonsense morality” (Nichols and Gill 2008: 153) This argument doesn't claim that emotions track moral truth or provide some kind of internalist epistemic justification. It simply appeals to the undesirable pragmatic consequences of rejecting the influence of emotion. We'd have to regard our opposition to incest, sacrificing one to save many, and privileging the near and the dear as unjustified. There are, to be sure, error theorists who happily embrace this conclusion. Even non-error theorists might say the sort of considerations that Nichols and Gill put forward cannot show that emotion-based moral beliefs are epistemically justified.

5.3 Debunking Arguments

The empirical data suggesting that at least some moral beliefs are based on emotional responses has been claimed by some to undercut their justification. Most prominently, Joshua Greene (Greene et al. 2001; Greene 2008; Greene et al. 2009) and Peter Singer (2005) have argued that deontological (more precisely, non-utilitarian) moral theories are unwarranted rationalizations of gut reactions that are outputs of the Intuitive System. In contrast, utilitarian judgments are held to result from conscious processing by the Reasoning System, and therefore to be justified. Although some things that Greene and Singer say impugn emotion-based judgments as such, their main argument is best construed as follows:

  1. Deontological beliefs are proximately caused by affective responses of type D.
  2. Affective responses of type D are sensitive to factors such as the use of personal force or up-close-and-personal causing of harm to others.
  3. Whether harm to others is caused by personal force or up close is morally irrelevant.
  4. So, deontological beliefs are formed in response to morally irrelevant factors, and are therefore epistemically unwarranted.

The first two premises of the argument are empirical. Most evidence for them comes from studies of Trolley Cases. In Bystander, a person has to choose between letting a trolley run over and kill five people and hitting a switch to divert it to a side track, on which it will run over and kill one. In Footbridge, a person has to choose between letting a trolley kill five and pushing a heavy man off the bridge, so that the trolley will only kill the heavy man. Most people think it is permissible to turn the trolley in Bystander, but not to push the heavy man in Footbridge, even though both scenarios pit the death of one against the death of five. Greene's hypothesis that the non-utilitarian response to Footbridge is caused by an automatic affective process is supported by neuroimaging, cognitive load, and reaction-time studies (Greene et al. 2001; Greene et al. 2008), as well as studies of patients with brain damage to emotion-processing areas (according to Koenigs et al. 2007 such patients have more utilitarian responses). Variation of details of cases suggests that these processes are responsive to the use of personal force (Greene et al. 2009)—for example, people are less likely to condemn dropping the heavy man if the agent uses a switch to open a trap door in the footbridge.

Premise 3 of the reconstructed argument is a substantive moral assumption. Selim Berker argues on this basis that “neuroscientific results are actually doing no work” (2009: 294) in the argument. But as Greene (manuscript) plausibly notes, establishing the factual premises of the argument is not nothing. If they are accepted, the non-utilitarian who relies on commonsense intuitions faces the unpleasant task of arguing that personal force or distance are, after all, morally relevant considerations. Greene also provides some independent argument that affective processes as such are likely to fail at tracking moral truth. The idea is that the relevant negative feelings are ultimately explained as evolutionarily adaptive “point-and-shoot” responses to life in small-scale societies (cf. Singer 2005: 347–348). As such, they are likely to be unreliable, at least in circumstances in which we can harm or help at long distance.

Some responses to this argument simply challenge the empirical data. Perhaps most effectively, Guy Kahane et al. (2012) broaden the investigation from the trolley cases, and find that when deontological responses are counterintuitive (such as when one must choose between honesty and lying to prevent serious harm), the patterns that Greene observes are reversed: it is the subjects who give a deontological response who manifest controlled processing, while utilitarian responses are automatic. Kahane (2012) concludes that the most plausible hypothesis is that the Reasoning System gets involved when we balance other considerations against the initial verdict of our Intuitive System, regardless of whether the intuition is utilitarian or deontological. This supports no debunking conclusions, nor the superior rationality of utilitarianism. Taking a different line, some Kantians, such as Allan Wood (2011), simply declare the intuitions irrelevant to justifying deontological theory. On their picture, it is pure practical reason that justifies moral judgments, so what causes most people's reactions is neither here nor there.

Finally, while Greene makes a plausible case that some emotional processes are sensitive to morally irrelevant factors, it is questionable whether this generalizes. Sentimentalists like Nichols and Hume who deny that the relevant emotions are adaptations seem to avoid the point-and-shoot charge, if they are right. Reflection on the process that results in our verdicts might increase rather than diminish our confidence. In this vein, Hume notes at the very end of the Treatise that once we see the origin of our moral judgments in sympathy felt from the common point of view, we “must certainly be pleas'd to see moral distinctions deriv'd from so noble a source” (T 619). Our moral sense

must certainly acquire new force, when reflecting on itself, it approves of those principles, from whence it is deriv'd, and finds nothing but what is great and good in its rise and origin (T 619)

What this brief account suggests is that when we engage in a process of what would now be called wide reflective equilibrium, in which we try to find the best fit for our particular and general moral convictions and known psychological and sociological facts, including facts about the origin of our moral convictions, we will reflectively endorse those moral convictions that result from impartial sympathy. After all, if Hume and Smith are on the right track in their explanatory hypotheses, such responses are sensitive to features like contributing to the general good, violating trust, or being used as a mere means, regardless of whether the actions in question redound to our self-interest or affect our near and dear. On the other hand, if we come to believe that some moral belief of ours reflects partiality or the influence of mere distance, we lose confidence in it. On this coherentist picture, then, we assess the implications of moral psychological hypotheses on the basis of substantive convictions that we hold, such as our approval of unbiased judgment. At least if emotions are perceptions or quasi-perceptions of value, emotion-based beliefs start out with initial credibility in this reflective equilibrium process. Its outcome may well be opting for embracing rather than rejecting the right kind of emotion-based judgments.


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