Notes to Moral Motivation

1. See Darwall (1983), pp. 51 ff. See also notes 8 and 10.

2. This way of explaining moral realism follows Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, “The Many Moral Realisms,” in Essays on Moral Realism, ed. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, pp. 1-23.

3. Mackie's claims about moral properties are not entirely clear, but his position seems to be, not merely that nothing has a moral property but that there are no moral properties. Insofar as Mackie is committed to the nonexistence of moral properties, the analogy to unicorns is at least somewhat inapt.  For arguably there is a property of being unicorn; it's just not instantiated—i.e. nothing has it. 

4. See Little (1997) for a particularly helpful depiction of the view, as well as compelling replies to certain prominent criticisms of it.

5. For a more refined presentation of this and other Humean arguments, as well as more detailed anti-Humean replies, see Shafer-Landau (2003), 122-141. Shafer-Landau presents these arguments as considerations a Humean might offer to undercut what he (Shafer-Landau) takes to be a “presumption in favor of anti-Humeanism.”(127) 

6. See Little (1997) for critical discussion of this type of argument, which is due most prominently to Smith (1987, 1994). See also Shafer-Landau (2003), pp. 134-140.

7. Little presents this reply in the context of defending virtue theorists. See Little (1997) more generally, for an extensive and detailed examination of arguments against virtue theory based on appeal to considerations in the philosophy of mind. 

8. Darwall (1983), pp. 51 ff., originally coined the expressions ‘judgment internalism’ and ‘existence internalism.’  Darwall describes judgment internalism as holding that it is a necessary condition on a judgment's genuinely being of a certain type—it's being, say, the judgment that one ought to φ or the judgment that one has a reason to φ—that the individual who makes the judgment be disposed to act in accordance with it. For a related, though slightly different distinction between kinds of internalism see Brink (1989),  pp. 37-80. 

9. Noncognitivists take themselves to supply such an account, when they tell us that the content of moral judgments is given by one or another conative state. For one rigorous effort by a moral cognitivist to offer an account, see Smith (1994). For general critical discussion of Smith's theory, see Brink (1997), Copp (1997), and Sayre-McCord (1997), and see Smith's reply (Smith 1997). 

10. For helpful and informative discussion of the internalism-externalism debate, see Darwall (1983), ch. 5; Brink (1989), pp. 37-80; Smith (1994), ch. 3; Svavarsdottir (1999);  and Shafer-Landau (2003), ch. 6.

11. See Brink (1997), p. 7, comparing his way of characterizing internalism with Smith's characterization. 

12. Various qualifications to this characterization of noncognitivist antirealism are in order, though extended discussion would take us beyond the scope of this entry. Both classic and contemporary versions of the view allow for senses in which we may legitimately talk about moral facts and moral truths. Still, noncognitivist antirealism rejects the idea that moral judgments are representational. See, e.g., Stevenson (1944); Gibbard (1990); and Blackburn (1984). 

13. Shafer-Landau (2003), p. 121. Shafer-Landau acknowledges that no philosopher has presented the argument in just this form, but he claims, p. 121, n. 1, that it accurately depicts an ideas we find in Stevenson (1963), Aiken (1950), Hare (1952:  79-93), Nowell-Smith (1954: 36-43), Harman (1975), and Mackie (1977:  27-42).  Simon Blackburn (1984: 188-189) also advances it, Shafer-Landau claims, though “with some reservations.”

14. This map obviously does not aim to exhaust the range of positive views philosophers might accept. Accepting or rejecting particular premises of the noncognitivist argument need not always commit one to a particular positive metaethical theory.

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