Notes to Medieval Philosophy

1. The more common form ‘medium aevum’ emerged later. (Robinson [1984], p. 748.) Robinson's delightful paper also discusses the demonstrably false claim that English is the only language to refer to this period in the plural (“Middle Ages”). (Ibid., pp. 747–49.) St. Augustine does refer to an “age in between” (interim saeculum), and Julian of Toledo in the seventh century describes his own day as a “middle time” (tempus medium). But they were thinking of the entire period between the Incarnation and Judgment Day, so that the expressions have a more theological than historical sense. (Ibid., p. 749.)

2. It is relevant to point out that Robinson is talking about the Middle Ages in general, not about medieval philosophy in particular. There is no antecedent reason to regard the medieval period in philosophy as coinciding exactly with the medieval period in, say, architecture or literature.

3. The key word here is ‘predominant’. The practice is still alive and thriving among quite respectable philosophers in our own day, even if it no longer sets the tone of philosophy generally. Indeed, one of the enduring legacies of medieval philosophy is the development of what we call “philosophy of religion,” which can be pursued both by those with and by those without prior doctrinal commitments. Historians of medieval philosophy have sometimes felt a need to defend, or even embarrassed by, this close connection between philosophy and dogma in the Middle Ages, as though it somehow compromised the integrity of their subject. But such concerns are probably misplaced. The popular notion of the philosopher as someone who follows the dictates of “pure reason” wherever they may go, without regard for prior “givens” that have to be accommodated, is something of a naive idealization; throughout its history, philosophy at large has rarely if ever proceeded in this purely autonomous way. One might in fact argue that in our own day it is scientific theory rather than theological doctrine that provides the standard against which much philosophy is measured. Not long ago, for example, some eminent and highly respected philosophers were arguing that distribution laws of classical logic itself must be abandoned because they could not be reconciled with certain interpretations of quantum mechanics (note: not that they could not be reconciled with empirical data, but that they were irreconcilable with certain scientific theories to interpret those data). Still, just as today there are many areas where one can philosophize freely without fear of trespassing on scientific ground, so too there were many areas of medieval philosophy where one could speculate freely without worrying about theological doctrine. The situations are altogether parallel, so that historians of medieval philosophy need not feel apologetic or defensive about the theological commitments of the philosophy of their period.

4. Here I am not distinguishing the “Platonism” of Plato himself from the later Platonic tradition, including Plotinus and others. The Middle Ages did not distinguish them either.

5. One can see the realization of this problem already in the second-century Christian Justin Martyr. See the “Prologue” (Chaps. 1–9) to his Dialogue with Trypho, a Jew [Available online in PDF].

6. This simplified account obviously leaves out many nuances, not the least of which is that Platonism and Aristotelianism were not the only pagan philosophies available. Still this sketch will suffice to illustrate the kinds of difficulties a Christian philosopher would have to face in dealing with his philosophical heritage from antiquity.

7. On Calcidius, see the extensive discussion in Gersh [1986], Chap. 6 (pp. 421–92). There is considerable uncertainty about Calcidius's identity, and even about the date of his translation, which has been put anywhere from the first half of the fourth century to the early fifth century. In any event, it is fairly certain that Calcidius was a Christian. On all these questions, see ibid., pp. 421–34.

8. Klibansky [1982], p. 27, says these translations were available from about 1156, and remarks that the translation of the Phaedo was “later revised.”

9. Thus Gilson [1955], p. 623 n. 80, says, “The influence of these two texts was hardly perceptible even in the XIIIth century.” On the other hand, Klibansky [1982], pp. 27–28, says, “these works had a wider circulation than the comparatively small number of extant manuscripts would presuppose. The Phaedo and, to a lesser extent, the Meno were read by Roger Bacon and by Parisian schoolmen who from 1271 had a manuscript of the former dialogue at their disposal in the library of the Sorbonne. They were quoted about 1300 by the Paduan judge, Jeremiah da Montagnone, by the Franciscan John of Wales at Oxford and by Henry Bate of Malines; later, by the Dominican Bertold of Moosburg and by the chancellor of Edward III, Richard de Bury; excerpts are found in collections of exempla and sayings.” He goes on to mention yet further citations. Still, while all this goes to show that there were manuscripts available throughout a broad area, and that some people actually read these texts, it does not do much to show any real influence of these dialogues. No one appears to have commented on them, for example.

10. On Victorinus, see Armstrong [1970], Chap. 20 (pp. 331–40). Readers of Augustine's Confessions will perhaps recall Victorinus from Confessions VIII.2 and VIII.4. Our only evidence that Victorinus really did translate Plotinus comes from Augustine's Confessions VIII.2.3, where he says that Victorinus translated the “books of the Platonists” mentioned back at VII.9.13. But nothing in what Augustine says requires that those “books” were Plotinus's in particular. Augustine certainly knew about Plotinus's views, but how much of them he actually read in direct translation is unclear. For a summary of the question, with references to further literature, see James J. O'Donnell's commentary on Augustine, Confessions, VII.9.13 and VII.2.3 (Augustine [1992], vol. 2, pp. 421–424, and vol. 3, pp.13–15).

11. The passage is worth quoting more fully: “The more one studies the middle ages, the more one notices the polymorphism of the Platonic influence. Plato himself does not appear at all, but Platonism is everywhere; let us say rather that there are Platonisms everywhere.” (Gilson [1955], p. 144.) He then goes on to list several different kinds of broadly Platonic theories up into the twelfth century. The point, of course, is that “Platonism” in this context should not be thought of as a single, monolithic set of doctrines.

12. Competitors include Confucius and the Buddha.

13. One might argue that the so called “Cassiciacum Dialogues” are exceptions. These include his Soliloquies, and the Contra academicos (= Against the Academicians), De beata vita (= On the Blessed [or Happy] Life), and De ordine (= On Order). The De dialectica (= On Dialectic

14. Strictly speaking there was no “emperor” in the West after the year 476. Theodoric was never emperor but “king,” in fact a kind of barbarian warlord although his administration was nevertheless known for its enlightened patronage of culture. The Ostrogoths were also Arian Christians, whereas Boethius and the old Roman families were not. Perhaps the conspiracy Boethius was accused of had something to do with plans to free the West of barbarian rule and restoring it to the orthodox old Roman families. But the facts are unclear.

15. Marius Victorinus had already translated the same three texts in the fourth century (Dod [1982]), but those translations were lost. The first of Boethius's two commentaries on Porphyry's Isagoge is “based on” Victorinus's translation, but it is not clear just how much of the text of that translation is preserved Boethius's commentary.

16. ‘Eriugena’ means “born in Ireland.” ‘Scotus' means “the Scot.” So the name as a whole means “John the Scot, the Irishman.” This doesn't sound quite so odd once it is realized that, at the time, Ireland was known as “Scotia Major.” John is sometimes simply called “John the Scot,” but do not confuse him with the more famous John Duns Scotus (c. 1265–1308).

17. Eriugena was not the first to translate these texts. An earlier translation was done c. 832 by one Hilduin (d. 840), abbot of St. Denis, who had been educated at the Carolingian school by Alcuin (d. 840). But Eriugena's translations were much more influential.

18. The odd name ‘ontological argument’ is not used by Anselm himself, and comes instead from Kant.

19. Augustine's Confessions comes to mind for comparison, although the two works are quite different in tone and content.

20. A good example can be found in Augustine's odd “proof” for the existence of God in De libero arbitrio (=  On Free Choice of the Will), II.

21. With this section, see Dod [1982].

22. The “palace school” associated with the Carolingian court does not quite fit into the following generalization.

23. I say “may have been” because there has been some scholarly dispute over whether there was a real “school” at all at this time in Chartres, and if so, whether it was a cathedral school. Nevertheless, there is universal agreement that the people about to be mentioned were all associated with Chartres, and were all important figures.

24. Despite its intriguing title, John's Metalogicon has nothing whatever to do with metalogic in the present-day sense of the term.

25. The expression ‘secular clergy’ is sometimes confusing to modern ears. The distinction is between the “secular clergy” and the “regular clergy.” The latter are the clergy who belong to an organized religious order, living under a regula or “rule,” such as the famous sixth-century Rule of St. Benedict for Benedictine monks. Particularly during the early Middle Ages, those in religious orders tended to live together in communities (the monasteries), in a kind of retirement from the world. By contrast, the “secular clergy” lived out in the world (the “age” or saeculum), tending to the flock of the faithful. In the thirteenth century, “mendicant” or “begging” orders were founded who were just as much out in the world as the secular clergy were, but who nevertheless belonged to the “regular clergy” because they were governed by a “rule.”

26. A perhaps not altogether inappropriate analogy can be found in the modern political party system. In the United States, for example, both major parties continually appeal to the heroes of their past, who affect thinking even today and who can be regarded as helping to define the parties' “identities.”

Copyright © 2009 by
Paul Vincent Spade

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.