Notes to Marcus Aurelius

1. The correspondence is most easily accessed in Marcus Cornelius Fronto ed. C. R. Haines, in the Loeb Classical Library series, 2 vols., and the Meditations and other writings in Marcus Aurelius, also ed. C. R. Haines in the Loeb Classical Library series.

2. Section 4 below raises difficulties for Hadot's characterization of (i).

3. Haines 1930 p. xv.

4. Since this purpose explains these various features of the work, it seems preferable to the speculation that the terse writing of the Meditations was forced by the circumstance of being written while Marcus was waging military campaigns. At the beginning of Book II (or perhaps the end of Book I) Marcus says that it was written on the Gran, and at the beginning of Book III (or end of Book II), that it was written at Carnutum, both in modern day Hungary; but he does not indicate anything about the composition of the remaining ten books.

5. The relationship between physics and ethics in Stoicism is controversial: are the two independent, or is physics foundational to ethics, or do the two support each other? For opposing views see Annas 1993, which is criticized in Cooper 1995 and defended in Annas 1995.

6. Cooper 2004 argues that Marcus is open to the possibility of Epicurean physics being true, and to that extent lacks reasons to believe that his happiness depends entirely on his own rational mental acts. Cooper seems to think that for a Stoic, the reason to believe the claim about happiness is that a providental reason governs the world.

Copyright © 2010 by
Rachana Kamtekar <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.