Notes to The Economic Analysis of Law

1. As argued at greater length below, judges are not well situated to make policy judgments about the efficiency of legal rules. Courts resolve disputes; they are largely backward looking; they determine whether the defendant in fact violated a legal norm. What happened in the instant case, however, provides little insight into what legal rule would induce efficient behavior

2. One might classify the various enterprises that comprise economic analysis of law differently. Economic analyses of law distinguish theoretical from empirical studies. They then distinguish different strands within each of these. So, for example, one might differentiate the theoretical strands in terms of the nature of the theory used - game theory, simple price theory, or behavioral economics (which abandons one or more of the rationality postulates of neoclassical economic theory). Similarly, one might distinguish the empirical strands in terms of the methodology used: case study, laboratory experiment, field experiment, or “natural” experiment. Alternatively, one might differentiate strands in terms of the aim of the enterprise: policy analysis, explanation or prediction.

3. In many articles that explicitly address policy issues, the analyst employs cost-benefit analysis. Cost-benefit analysis is often regarded as an implementation of some welfarist social objective function. For criticism of this assumption, see Kornhauser [1998, 2000].

4. The intellectual geography of political economy is actually more complex. Buchanan is a founder and exemplar of the “Virginia” school of the theory of political institutions, sometimes called “public choice theory.” Its evaluative commitments are indeed contractarian. The Rochester school of the theory of political institutions, sometimes called “positive political theory,” however, has not in general rejected welfarism. Both schools apply economic techniques to the analysis of political institutions and both schools have influenced the economic analysis. (One might differentiate them crudely in the following way. Public choice theory fixes political institutions and asks how the distribution of preferences within the polity affects outcomes. Positive political theory, by contrast, fixes the distribution of preferences within the polity and asks how institutional design affects outcomes.

5. Political economic accounts of adjudication will also reject a purposive account of adjudication. Even if a judge pursues a specific purpose, no judge has complete control over the development of the law. Consequently, the legal rules that evolve are unlikely to be efficient or to further the aims of a specific individual. Nor can a particular aim be attributed to the courts as a whole.

6. Institutional instrumentalism is somewhat at odds with a contractarian evaluative position. Note that one might identify a third type of legal instrumentalism, systemic instrumentalism, in which the legal system as a whole promotes some goal. One might understand Durkheim's theory of law in this manner. On legal instrumentalism generally see Kornhauser [2000].

7. On the other hand, some legal positivists justify the sources thesis on the grounds that moral criteria are too controversial to serve as an identification criterion for law. Efficiency, too, may be difficult to apply which would argue against its use as a criterion.

8. Some models do study the consequences of uncertainty over the legal rule and some of these models interpret this uncertainty as judicial uncertainty. The formalism, however, admits equally the interpretation that the private agent is uncertain how the court will respond to her action.

9. Obligation might enter into an economic account of behavior as a concern that the agent integrates into her preference ordering. Breach of an obligation would impose a “psychic cost” that she weighs with other costs and benefits in her decision. Though under this approach obligations motivate, it is clearly ad hoc and unsatisfactory. For further comments see Kornhauser [2000].

10. The implausibility of the assumption of narrowly self-interested preferences appears most clearly in models of adjudication. Self-interest here generally means that the judge cares about salary, promotion, reputation, and leisure. Unfortunately, it is unclear how these concerns lead the judge to a resolution of the dispute. The models thus typically assume that the judge has preferences over policies, an assumption that broadly interprets the idea of a “narrowly self-interested” preference.

11. In the standard exposition of this game, there are only two players so that identification of the highest and lowest ranked alternatives gives a complete ranking. The text suggests a game with more than two players. To fill out the ranking define n(L) as the number of people who drive on the left and n(R) as the number of people who drive on the right. Let m = min{n(L), n(R)} and M = max {n(L), n(R)}. Let r = m/M. The ratio r is defined for each possible choice of strategy vector. Consider two strategy vectors s and s′ with r and r′ the associated ratios. Then each agent prefers s to s′ if and only if r < r′.

12. That is, the rule specifies an action that is not necessarily a best response, under perfect information and costless deliberation, to the specific situation. The rule might be an optimal response to the class of situations, given costly deliberation and imperfect information.

13. See Raz [1994]. Raz, at times, seems to ground legal authority in convention; such a grounding would provide a third, economic account of authority as the analysis of convention rests on self-interest. This argument, too, fails to provide an account of authority that treats legal rules as exclusionary reasons. For a clear exposition of this argument see Green [1985].

14. In accident situations where the agents are symmetrically placed, each taking due care may be in the interests of both but, in the non-cooperative solution to this strategic situation, each would, in the absence of a legal rule, adopt a suboptimal level of care. In the prudential account, by contrast, it is in each agent's interest to follow the rule because the costs of identifying the better action exceed the gains from such efforts.

15. Heiner [1986]. This account assumes that each judge has an interest in “correctly” deciding cases. It thus assumes away the first difficulty. Rasmusen [1994] provides an equilibrium account (see below) of stare decisis, on the other hand, that relies only on the interest of each individual judge. Rasmusen's theory of stare decisis, though it grounds the practice in judicial “self-interest” (understood as the desire to influence policy), does not yield a rule that functions as an exclusionary reason to follow the law.

16. Constitutional political economy generally argues that, even at the design phase, agents act self-interestedly. Impartiality arises not from a shift in motivation but from the difference in the environment so that self-interest coincides with a more impartial perspective. See generally Brennan and Buchanan [1981, 1985] for this argument. Brennan has subsequently rejected his earlier views in Brennan and Hamlin [2000]. For a critique, see Kornhauser [2002].

17. Z is pareto preferred to Y if and only no one in the population prefers Y to Z and at least one person prefers Z to Y. Technically, the Kaldor-Hicks criterion is not a purely welfarist criterion as it requires reference to the underlying distribution of goods and not simply the underlying distribution of well-being.

18. Suppose agent K has wealth wK with preferences over wealth and policies representable by an indirect utility function u. Let P be the prevailing policy and P′ the proposed policy. Then cost benefit analysis assigns a number m defined by the equation u[P′, wK] = u[P, wKm] where negative numbers indicate the amount one must pay K in order for her to accept that state of affairs.

19. My critique of cost-benefit analysis here is thus related to but different from the standard critique that cost-benefit analyses depend on the underlying distribution of income. That critique contends that an unjust distribution would undermine the moral legitimacy of the cost benefit analysis. The argument in the text suggests that, even if the underlying distribution of income and wealth were morally acceptable, we would require additional argument to establish that the representation of preference derived by willingness to pay would yield interpersonally comparable measures of well-being.

20. They fare no better as interpretive theories of adjudication within civil law countries. Economic analysis of law, however, has concentrated predominantly on the study of common law systems of adjudication.

21. Kaplow and Shavell [2001] offers a defense of welfarism consistent with the characterization in the text. A more comprehensive discussion and critique of Kaplow and Shavell's argument is provided in Kornhauser [2003].

22. Fleurbaey, Tungodden and Chang [2003] argue against the claim that the Pareto criterion is incompatible with non-welfarist criteria.

23. Kaplow and Shavell [2002] acknowledge this distinction.

24. The strategy of incorporation in some sense confuses the direction of causation. An agent's well-being depends on the proper resolution of the moral conflict rather than the aggregation of well-being determining the proper resolution of the conflict.

25. This claim does not rely on a cognitive view of morality. Even expressivists such as Gibbard [1990] and Blackburn [1998] acknowledge that moral assertions are not personal and that the individual has no sovereignty over them. For a fuller discussion, see Kornhauser [2003].

26. In some contexts of course majority rule is used to resolve conflict in belief but we defend this aggregation method in a different way. Compare the defense of majority rule in jury decisions to its defense in interest group theories of politics.

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Lewis Kornhauser <>

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