Law and Language
Political philosophers are not generally preoccupied with questions in the philosophy of language. But legal philosophers are political philosophers with a specialization that gives language (and philosophy of language) a special fascination.
The use of language is crucial to any legal system — not only in the same way that it is crucial to politics in general, but in the special respect that lawmakers typically use language to make the law, and courts typically use language to state their grounds of decision. So philosophers of law need a good philosophical understanding of the meaning and use of language. But philosophers of law have also tried to draw on insights from philosophy of language to deal with other problems they face. Philosophy of law shares a tension that affects philosophy of mind and metaphysics, and perhaps all the central areas of philosophy: it is often unclear which problems are problems of language, and which are not.
Two areas of philosophical interest in law and language result. First is the interest in the use of language in law. Second is the interest in using philosophy of language to address problems of the nature of law. I will outline some problems in each area. But I will start with a brief historical note on the linguistic preoccupations of legal philosophers.
- 1. Historical note
- 2. The use of language in law
- 3. The use of philosophy of language in philosophy of law
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Systematic attempts to use philosophical insights about language to solve problems in philosophy of law are recent, and are a distinctive feature of modern English-speaking jurisprudence. Jeremy Bentham was perhaps the first to make such an attempt. He developed a radically empiricist theory of the meaning of words, which supported his utilitarianism and his legal theory.
Bentham wanted to abandon what he considered to be a nonsensical mythology of natural rights and duties — that is, moral rights and duties that people have regardless of whether anyone is prepared to enforce them. He looked for ‘sensible’ phenomena by which to explain the nature of law without any such phantoms. Linguistic acts struck him as respectable empirical phenomena, and he made them an essential element of his theory of law. He based his ‘legal positivism’ on his claims about the meaning and use of words. Language had not been especially important to the natural law theorists whose views Bentham despised. They accounted for a law as a certain sort of reason. From that perspective, philosophy of language has no special role in explaining the nature of law. Its role in legal philosophy is the same as its general role in the philosophy of practical reason. Philosophy of language cannot explain the nature of reasons; perhaps it has the ancillary role of explaining the possibility of expressing or communicating a reason. Bentham, by contrast, needed the ‘sensible’ phenomenon of a perceptible, intelligible linguistic act for his purpose of expounding the nature of law by reference to empirical phenomena.
Bentham seems to have thought of the meaning of a word in causal terms, as its capacity to act on a subject by raising an image of perceptible substances or emotions for which, he said, the word was a name. ‘By these general terms or names, things and persons, acts, and so forth are brought to view…’ (Bentham 1782, 82; see also Bentham 1776, 28, 108n). Words that do not bring to view such perceptible things have no meaning, on that view, except insofar as they can be expounded by ‘paraphrasis’ — Bentham's method of translating whole sentences in which those words are used into sentences that do raise images of perceptible things.
To many legal theorists, as H.L.A. Hart put it, that approach ‘appeared as a revelation, bringing down to earth an elusive notion and restating it in the same clear, hard, empirical terms as are used in science’ (Hart 1994, 84). The theory supports not only Bentham's empiricism, but also his utilitarianism, because it privileges what he viewed as the ultimate intelligible ‘affections’: the pain and pleasure that utilitarianism treats as the basis for a theory of value and of morality. ‘Pain and pleasure at least, are words which a man has no need, we may hope, to go to a Lawyer to know the meaning of.’ (Bentham 1776, 28)
In his legal theory, this view of language became the basis of an innovative account of law as the expression of the will of a sovereign in a political community. Bentham stated it as follows:
A law may be defined as an assemblage of signs declarative of a volition conceived or adopted by the sovereign in a state, concerning the conduct to be observed in a certain case by a certain person or class of persons, who in the case in question are or are supposed to be subject to his power… (Bentham 1782, 1)
He went on to explain that such a signification of volition must be backed by ‘motives’ of pain or pleasure offered by the sovereign.
Two features of this theory tie the philosophy of law to the philosophy of language. One feature is methodological, and the other is substantive. First, Bentham proposes his theory as a definition (see section below, on ‘Definition as a methodology in philosophy of law’). Secondly, he defines law as a particular kind of assemblage of signs (see section below, on ‘Law and signs’. In Bentham's view, a law is an utterance, and legal philosophy is a form of philosophy of language. The legal theorist has a linguistic task of defining the terms (especially law, but others as well) of legal discourse.
That, in brief, is the apogee of the use of philosophy of language in philosophy of law. But Bentham was ahead of his time. His theory of the meaning and use of words anticipated various trends in twentieth-century philosophy of language (including Frege's and Wittgenstein's ‘context principle’, some views of logical positivists, and the development of speech act theory). It was H.L.A.Hart who, in the 1950s and 1960s, made a concerted effort to use twentieth-century developments in philosophy of language to ‘elucidate’ the nature of law. He did so with an enthusiasm for the work of Wittgenstein, and also of Oxford ‘ordinary language’ philosophers such as J.L.Austin. So Hart had some advantages over Bentham. Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations had been directed against the view that a word's meaning is a thing for which it stands as a name (which is one of the misconceptions that had distorted Bentham's theory of the meaning of words). And J.L.Austin took an attitude to ordinary discourse that was quite opposed to that of Bentham, who thought that philosophy must tear away the ‘veil of mystery’ that ordinary language throws over every object of study (Bentham 1782, 251). Wittgenstein's attitude was more complex: he thought both that philosophers create philosophical problems by bewitching themselves with language, and also that a clear understanding of the use of language could provide healthy therapy for people suffering from philosophical problems. Taking advantage of the insights of Wittgenstein and J.L.Austin, Hart aimed to put philosophy of language to work in addressing problems of legal philosophy, without making what he regarded as Bentham's extravagant mistakes (such as thinking that a word like ‘right’ is a name for a ‘fictitious entity’ — Bentham 1782, 251).
In 1962, Hart's book The Concept of Law raised issues that have occupied legal philosophers ever since. He borrowed J.L. Austin's method of ‘using a sharpened awareness of words to sharpen our perception of the phenomena’ (Hart 1994, v, 14). That method sets the background for the two problems I will outline in part 2 below: ‘Language and the normativity of law’, and ‘The Semantic Sting’. Hart's observations about the use of language in law were the basis of an innovative approach to the challenge of explaining the normativity of law — a problem for legal theory that can be clearly seen, Hart claimed, in the faulty explanation of normative language that had captivated Bentham. Hart's new approach to the issue has been the starting point for discussions of the normativity of law since he wrote his book [see section 3.2 below].
Ronald Dworkin has opposed Hart's theory of law on the basis that his whole approach to legal philosophy is undermined or ‘stung’ by his approach to words — that he wrongly thought ‘that lawyers all follow certain linguistic criteria for judging propositions of law’ (Dworkin 1986, 45). That is Dworkin's ‘semantic sting’ argument [see below], an argument in the philosophy of language that has set an agenda for much recent debate in philosophy of law (see, for example, the essays in Coleman, 2001).
Finally, it should be noted that, like Bentham, many legal theorists of the twentieth century aimed to debunk conventional views about law by taking advantage of sceptical views about the meaning of the language of the law. The Scandinavian legal realists viewed legal terms like ‘right’ as ‘lacking semantic reference’ and ‘denoting nothing’. So they considered statements asserting the existence of rights, duties, and other legal relations to be incapable of being true or false (Olivecrona 1971, 246, 255, 261). They variously explained the use of such statements as attempts to perform magical incantations, or as tools for taking advantage of the psychological conditioning that leads officials and citizens to act in one way or another when they hear such statements (see the outline of Scandinavian realism in Olivecrona 1971 at 174–182, and see Ross 1956. See also section 5 of the entry on Naturalism in Legal Philosophy.).
Similarly, various strands in the influential American legal academic enterprise of ‘economic analysis of law’ share Bentham's debunking attitude toward central legal terms such as ‘right’ and ‘obligation’. Like Bentham, some economic analysts oscillate (or equivocate) between (1) a moral theory that reduces those normative terms to terms describing maximization of human satisfactions, and (2) a theory that abandons moral concepts generally and only claims to describe human motivation, accounting for terms such as ‘right’ and ‘obligation’ as rhetorical epithets that agents use to pursue what they will [see entry on Economic Analysis of the Law section 2.2].
Not all legal sceptics have been driven by the empiricism of Bentham and the Scandinavians. Many other forms of scepticism about law have sought support in scepticism about the meaning of language. Recent attacks on the coherence of the idea of the rule of law, and on the meaningfulness of legal discourse, have used ideas in the philosophy of language as diverse as Saul Kripke's interpretation of Wittgenstein's remarks on rule following, and deconstruction (on Kripke, see entry on Interpretation and Coherence in Legal Reasoning).
Should we try to account for a law as an assemblage of signs, as Bentham did? The objections are insurmountable. Law (in the sense that is relevant here) is the systematic regulation of the life of a community by standards treated as binding the members of the community and its institutions. A law is a standard that is part of such a systematic form of regulation. Many such standards have no canonical linguistic formulation (that is, no form of words which, according to law, determines the content of the standard). Lawyers in common law systems are familiar with such norms: murder may be a criminal offence (or slander may be a tort, or certain agreements may be enforceable as contracts…), not because any person or institution uttered a ruling that it should be so, but because the institutions of the legal system customarily treat murder as an offence. Moreover, common law systems cannot be distinguished from legal systems consisting only of linguistic acts, because no legal system consists only of linguistic acts. A civil law system with a civil code and a criminal code may make murder an offence (and slander a tort, and contracts enforceable…) by a written act, and it may be a written constitution that gives legal force to the civil code and to the criminal code. But the validity of the written constitution will depend on a norm which is not created by the use of signs: the rule that that text is to be treated as setting out the constitution.
Bentham and his disciple, John Austin, knew that there are rules of law that were not laid down in language. Preserving their view of law as signification of volition, they accounted for such laws as tacit commands of the sovereign. That device is not merely convoluted, it lacks the resources it would need to explain the existence of a norm. In the right circumstances, it is certainly possible to communicate without using signs (and in particular, it is possible to convey a volition, backed by a threat of force, just by saying or writing nothing). But silence can only be a means of communication when the circumstances give it a meaning. We can say that a tacit command has been issued only if it is possible to identify features of the situation that distinguish the tacit communication from mere inaction communicating nothing [see Hart 1994, 45–48]. Those features do not generally accompany customary rules (in fact, they generally do not accompany customary rules).
There is another conclusive reason not to say that a law is an assemblage of signs. When a lawmaking authority does use language to make law, the resulting law is not an assemblage of signs. The reason for that conclusion is a general fact about communication: a communicative act is the use of an assemblage of signs to some effect. When an authority uses words to make law (as when a legislature uses a lawful process to pass an enactment that is within its powers), the law that it thereby makes is a standard (or standards) whose existence and content are determined by the legal effect that the law ascribes to that use of words. When a law is made by the use of signs, that law is a standard for conduct, and not an assemblage of signs.
A law, therefore, is not an assemblage of signs, and law is not necessarily made by the use of language, and every legal system requires norms that are not made by the use of language. Laws are not linguistic acts, or even communicative acts. They are standards of behaviour that can be communicated (and may be made) by using language.
So what is the relationship between the language that is used to make legal standards, and the law itself? If the law provides that a form of words determines the content of a standard (such as a term of a contract, or a criminal offence, or a duty of the executor of a will), what is the effect of the words? The question seems to demand a general theory of the meaning and interpretation of legal language -a general explanatory account of what makes the words of a statute (or contract, or will, or constitution ) apply to the facts of a case. If there is no general theory, then there is no general answer to the question. A theory of meaning and interpretation of legal language would not be very much less general than a theory of meaning and interpretation of language. And such a theory would have to vie with arguments of, e.g., Ludwig Wittgenstein that the search for such a theory would be a philosophical mistake.
The entry on Interpretation and Coherence in Legal Reasoning addresses theories of interpretation [see also the entries On The Nature of Law and Naturalism in Legal Philosophy]. Here I will only mention two features of legal language that raise challenges for philosophy of law and for philosophy of language: any good account of the meaning and interpretation of legal language needs to deal with the way in which its application depends on (1) the context of its use, and (2) evaluative considerations.
Consider the case of Garner v Burr  1 KB 31. The legislature had made it an offence to use a ‘vehicle’ on a road without pneumatic tires. Lawrence Burr fitted iron wheels to his chicken coop, and pulled it down the road behind his tractor. Burr was prosecuted under the statute. The magistrates acquitted him, apparently on the ground that a chicken coop is not a ‘vehicle’. The appeal court reversed that decision. The Lord Chief Justice wrote,
The regulations are designed for a variety of reasons, among them the protection of road surfaces; and, as this vehicle had ordinary iron tyres, not pneumatic tyres, it was liable to damage the roads. [The magistrates] have put what is in my opinion too narrow an interpretation on the word ‘vehicle’ for the purposes of this Act. It is true that, according to the dictionary definition, a ‘vehicle’ is primarily to be regarded as a means of conveyance provided with wheels or runners and used for the carriage of persons or goods. It is true that the [magistrates] do not find that anything was carried in the vehicle at the time; but I think that the Act is clearly aimed at anything which will run on wheels which is being drawn by a tractor or another motor vehicle. Accordingly, an offence was committed here . It follows that [the magistrates] ought to have found that this poultry shed was a vehicle within the meaning of s. 1 of the Road Traffic Act of 1930. ( 1 KB 31 at 33)
The magistrates and the appeal court seem to have disagreed over the effect of principles: a principle that the purposes for which Parliament passed the statute ought to be pursued, and a principle that statutes ought only to be read as imposing criminal liability if they do so unequivocally. Assume that those principles are legal principles, in the sense that a decision in accordance with the law must respect them. The apparent tension between the principles might be resolved in two ways. We do not have the magistrates' reasons, but let's presume that they resolved the tension in the first way; the appeal court resolved it in the second way:
1. by concluding that Parliament's purposes can be respected appropriately while still construing the prohibition strictly, so that it is no offence to use something on the road that is not unequivocally within the meaning of the term 'vehicle', or
2. by concluding that Parliament's purpose is sufficiently clear that it can be pursued without jeopardising the principle that criminal liabilities ought to be clearly spelled out, even if someone might reasonably claim that a chicken coop on wheels is not a ‘vehicle’.
It may seem that this common sort of disagreement in law tells us nothing about language, except perhaps that language is of no particular importance in law. It may seem that the two courts did not disagree over any question of language, but only over whether they ought to give effect to Parliament's evident purpose (of protecting roads) by convicting, or whether it would be unfair to Lawrence Burr.
One explanation of the decision would be that the appeal court ignored the word ‘vehicle’, and treated anything that moves on wheels as subject to the pneumatic tires rule. But the Lord Chief Justice did not explain his decision that way. He did not hold that, because Parliament aimed to protect roads from iron wheels, Burr should be convicted regardless of the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’. He held that the magistrates ought to have found that the chicken coop was a vehicle within the meaning of the Road Traffic Act. Presumably the magistrates, too, considered themselves to be giving effect to the language of the Act, rather than acquitting on grounds of fairness in spite of what Parliament had enacted.
No doubt, legal decisionmakers sometimes depart from the language of valid enactments (or wills, or contracts ). They may do so corruptly, or in the exercise of an equitable jurisdiction to depart from legal requirements, or even because they consider that justice demands it even if the law accords them no power to depart from the language. But there is no reason to think that the magistrates or the appeal judges decided not to give effect to the language in Garner v Burr. And the sort of disagreement that arose in that case (disagreement over the legal effect of the use of a word) is so common that we seem to find a paradox: competent speakers of the English language presumably share a knowledge of the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’, yet they disagree — apparently sincerely — over how to use the word.
To resolve the apparent paradox, we can say that what speakers of the English language share is an ability to use a word like ‘vehicle’ in a way that depends on the context. The question of whether a chicken coop on wheels counts as a ‘vehicle’ would be a different question (and might have a different answer) if, say, another statute or regulation imposed a tax on ‘vehicles’. The Lord Chief Justice was right that a dictionary definition of ‘vehicle’ could not conclude the question of whether the chicken coop was a vehicle in Garner v Burr, because the purpose of a dictionary definition is to point the reader to features of the use of the word that can be important in a variety of more-or-less analogical ways in various contexts. A definition of ‘vehicle’ as a mode of conveyance offers the reader one central strand in the use of that word, but does not tell the reader whether a more-or-less analogical extension of the word to a chicken coop on wheels is warranted or unwarranted by the meaning of the word. Another way of stating this resolution of the apparent paradox is to distinguish between the meaning of a word (which the magistrates and the appeal judges all knew) and a decision about how to interpret a communicative act using the word (over which they disagreed). What the courts in Garner v Burr shared was a knowledge of the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’, and what they disagreed over was the effect of the statute.
Note that it is the importance of the context of the word's use that requires anyone addressing the problem in Garner v Burr to make evaluative judgments, just to apply the putatively descriptive term ‘vehicle’. The context of use is a criminal prohibition imposed for a presumably good public purpose of protecting road surfaces. To determine in that context whether the word ‘vehicle’ extends to a chicken coop on wheels, you need to address (and to resolve any tension between) the two principles mentioned above: the importance of giving effect to the statutory purpose, and the importance of protecting people from a criminal liability that has not been unequivocally imposed. Because of the importance of that context, the question of the meaning and application of the language of the statute cannot be answered without making judgments on normative questions of how those principles are to be respected.
The dependence of the effect of legal language on context is an instance of a general problem about communication, which philosophers of language have approached by distinguishing semantics from pragmatics. They have attempted to distinguish the meaning of a linguistic expression, from the effect that is to be ascribed to the use of the expression in a particular way, by a particular user of the language, in a particular context. Pragmatics is an underdeveloped study in legal theory, and yet it is an underdeveloped study of a vast field, for the term 'pragmatics' could be used as a heading for all the work of legal scholars and theorists in defending particular interpretations of legal language (when the participants in the dispute understand the meaning of the expressions in question, as they did in Garner v Burr), and in theorizing as to the nature of interpretation. In recent work in this field, it is even controversial whether legal pragmatics is simply a part of the pragmatics of language use in general (see Dascal and Wroblewski 1988), or whether there is something special about law, in respect of the dependence of meaning on context (see Marmor 2008, arguing that ‘the contextual background is typically not rich enough’ in law, for the content asserted to differ from what has been said, in the way that it often does in conversation). But all agree that law has one special feature that distinguishes it from ordinary conversation: legal systems need institutions and processes for adjudication of the disputes about the application of language that arise (partly) as a result of its context-dependence.
The problem faced in cases like Garner v Burr is an especially vivid reminder of a problem that philosophers of language have long been more or less aware of (see Aristotle's discussion of the notion of ‘friendship’ in Eudemian Ethics VII, 2, 1236a 33). The context-dependence of the meaning of words requires an account of linguistic competence that relates it to other human capacities — capacities to judge the importance of context and to draw analogies. It would be a mistake in the philosophy of language to account for language in a way that divorces its mastery from other aspects of human rationality. Context-dependence also poses challenges for any theory of meaning to distinguish between (and to explain relations between) knowledge of the meaning of a word, and ability to apply it truly. Finally, the role of evaluative considerations in the application of ordinary descriptive terms like ‘vehicle’ raises a challenge for any thorough-going scepticism about value: the challenge of deciding whether to adopt a thorough-going scepticism about the meaning and application of descriptive language, which seems to follow from general scepticism concerning values.
For philosophy of law, the dependence of such language on evaluative considerations raises special problems.
Evaluative considerations and the nature of law
If you cannot tell what counts as a ‘vehicle’ without evaluative reasoning, then you cannot tell what law the Road Traffic Act makes merely by pointing out physical facts (such as that there were wheels on the chicken coop) and social facts (such as that Parliament used the word ‘vehicle’ in the Act). You cannot identify the law (that is, you cannot tell what legal rights and duties people have) without evaluative reasoning. That conclusion, if it is sound, seems to have important implications for the long-running debates in theory of law over the relation between fact and value in law, and over relations between law and morality. The conclusion seems to contradict one of the most provocative and controversial claims in the theory of law — the ‘sources thesis’, which Joseph Raz has stated as follows:
All law is source-based. A law is source-based if its existence and content can be identified by reference to social facts alone, without resort to any evaluative argument. (Raz (1994) at 194–5; see entry On the Nature of Law)
We can only decide whether the chicken coop was a ‘vehicle’ for the purpose of the Road Traffic Act by understanding the Act as pursuing a value, and by making an evaluative judgment as to whether the word ‘vehicle’ can be interpreted as applying to the chicken coop with due respect for the requirement of certainty in criminal liability. So we cannot identify the content of the law without resort to evaluative reasoning.
One way to rescue the sources thesis would be to say that judges need to make such evaluative judgments only in borderline cases for the application of legal language — and that they have discretion (that is, the law provides no standard that determines the matter) in those cases. But a clear case of a vehicle counts as a ‘vehicle’ for the purpose of the Road Traffic Act just because the evaluative considerations that justify the use of the word ‘vehicle’ in that context clearly support its application. The sources thesis seems to be contradicted even in the clearest cases of the application of a law stated in descriptive language. The content of such laws can only be identified on the basis of an evaluative judgment as to how the purposes of the law ought to be conceived. That form of evaluation, you may say, can only be carried out by engaging in the very same form of reasoning that, in Raz's theory, law excludes.
It is certainly true that, in order to decide what the sources have directed (and thereby, in Raz's terms, to identify the existence and content of a law), you need to understand the sense in which a word like ‘vehicle’ is used. But the existence and content of the offence can still be identified without first judging whether it ought to be an offence to do what Mr.Burr did, or whether there ought to be any offence at all of driving without pneumatic tires. The sources thesis articulates this important insight: in English law, there was no offence of driving without pneumatic tires, until Parliament acted to create it. Parliament might not have done so. Moreover, if the institutions of the law had not been prepared to treat the chicken coop as a vehicle, then because of that social fact, it would have been false (after a decision with precedential effect) to say that it was an offence to pull a chicken coop on iron wheels on the road. Because law is systematic (in the respect that the law gives legal institutions authority to identify the law), the courts' decisions determine legal rights and obligations. So, we might say, a law is source-based if its existence and content can be identified by reference to social facts alone, without resort to any evaluative argument (other than whatever evaluative argument may be needed to determine what the social facts are).
Raz's explanation of the nature of law is not undermined by the fact that evaluative judgments are necessary in order to identify the content of the law, as long as it is still possible for legal directives to have the exclusionary force that, in his theory of authority, they claim. The sources thesis is not undermined as long as the court in Garner v Burr can decide whether it is an offence to pull a chicken coop on wheels without pneumatic tires, without answering the question, ‘should it be an offence to use a vehicle without pneumatic tires?’ And indeed the court can do so. But it needs to ask the related question: ‘what is the relevant sense of “vehicle” for the purposes of this Act?’ It is what Parliament did that determines Lawrence Burr's liability; it may take evaluative reasoning to answer the question of social fact, ‘what did Parliament prohibit?’
A speed limit on a highway is a fairly precise law: in most cases it is clear whether a driver has conformed to the standard. But highway traffic regulation also needs (and typically uses) rules against careless or dangerous driving — abstract standards which are designed to control a variety of behaviour that lacks the uniform, measurable feature (speed) that allows the precision of a speed limit.
Vague laws, like a rule against careless driving, pose problems for philosophy of law that are related to problems that philosophers of language and of logic have addressed in arguments about the paradox of the heap. Suppose that, according to law, it counts as careless driving to drive with bald tires. If the law gives a precise definition of the thickness of tire tread that counts as bald, then in this regard the law is (more or less) precise, and for the purposes of the law, virtually every tire is either clearly bald or clearly not bald. But if there is no such precise standard, then there are ‘borderline cases’ in which it is neither clearly true that a tire is bald, nor clearly false. And we can construct a sorites series, and a sorites paradox for the application of the law:
- A new tire is not bald.
- If a tire is not bald, it does not become bald by losing one molecule of rubber from its tread.
- So a tire that has lost one molecule of rubber is not bald.
- Reiterate 2.
- So a tire that has lost two molecules of rubber is not bald.
- Reiterate 2.
N. So a tire never goes bald.
N+1. So no one can ever break the rule against careless driving by driving with bald tires.
The false conclusion arises by apparently valid reasoning from apparently true premises. Philosophical approaches to the paradox seem to have implications for legal theory: arguments that vague terms are incoherent, and that reasoning with them is impossible, would support arguments that vague laws are incoherent. Since vague laws are an important part of every legal system [Endicott 2001], the implications seem to be far-reaching.
‘Epistemic’ arguments that the only way to solve the paradox is to deny the truth of step 2 (so that vagueness is a problem of ignorance as to where the sharp boundary is between tires that are and are not bald) imply that there is always a right answer to the application of a law stated in vague language. Arguments that the application of a vague expression is indeterminate in borderline cases (or in some borderline cases) imply that the application of a law that can be expressed in vague language is indeterminate in some cases. But it is even controversial whether such theories matter to legal philosophy [Schiffer, 2001 and Greenawalt, 2001].
Philosophers of law have not been especially concerned with the question of how to solve (or to resolve) the paradox, but they have debated the nature of borderline cases, and its implications for the role of judges in a community, and for the possibility of the rule of law. If the application of vague laws is indeterminate in some cases, then in those cases a judge (or other official) responsible for applying the law cannot do so (and in fact, no one can use the law to guide their conduct).
Some legal philosophers have responded to this problem by claiming that judges never (or virtually never) have such a choice, and that there is virtually always a right answer to an issue of legal rights [Dworkin, 1986a, 1991]. Others have responded to the problem by claiming that the law gives judges discretion, in all or some borderline cases, to decide issues that the law does not determine [Hart, 1994, chapter VII.1]. That is, the standards of the system leave a choice to judges as to how to decide the issue. Then judges must treat the parties to litigation as having liabilities or obligations or entitlements that were not (determinately) theirs at the time when the dispute arose. That power of judges appears to run contrary to the principle of the rule of law, that laws (or at least, that legal burdens) should not be imposed retrospectively.
It is difficult to discern the connection between these problems for legal philosophy, and the debates about the paradox of the heap in philosophy of logic. There are two related reasons.
First, lawmakers avoid ordinary vague expressions like ‘driving too fast’ and prefer precise speed limits (or blood alcohol limits, or tire tread measurements). When the law uses vague language, it uses abstract evaluative expressions. Lawmakers typically do not prohibit driving with ‘bald’ tires; they either impose precise measures, or address the problem as part of a general prohibition on, e.g., ‘careless’ driving. The latter sort of standard calls upon its subjects to construct a view of the care that, in their law, a driver owes to another person — and not merely to ask, how bald is a bald tire? Such standards are a very common and a very important part of lawmaking technique. A negligence standard may require ‘reasonable care’; a constitution may define a procedural right as a right to ‘due process’, or a contract may require the delivery of goods in ‘satisfactory condition’. Those terms are very different from the vague descriptive terms that philosophers of logic use to illustrate their arguments about the sorites paradox (‘heap’, ‘thin’, ‘bald’, ‘red’…). It misses the point, you might think, to say that abstract standards do not draw sharp lines, because they are not designed to draw lines at all. By using an abstract standard, the lawmaker requires the people who must apply the law to construct a theory of the standard (of care, or of process, or of condition), which will draw any line that is needed. Ronald Dworkin has claimed that abstract expressions are not vague at all — that they have a different semantics from that of vague words like ‘heap’ (Dworkin, 1986b, 17).
Secondly, the legal use of an expression may be very different from its ordinary use. Principles of legal interpretation (for example, a legal requirement that vague criminal enactments are to be interpreted as applying only in clear cases) may make the legal effect of the use of a word more precise than its ordinary effect. The interpretation of a legal prohibition on careless driving demands an understanding of what counts as careless for the purposes of the law.
Given these features of law, it may seem that logicians' discussions of heaps and baldness are beside the point, and that legal reasoning is exempt from any implications of the paradox for logic or for semantics. That would be a mistake. Statements of law that use abstract expressions certainly are vague in the philosophers' sense: they appear to be susceptible to sorites reasoning. ‘Careless driving’ in its legal sense is a much more complex concept than ‘driving with bald tires’, and driving with bald tires is an instance of careless driving only in virtue of the evaluative and contextual considerations that must be understood if the law of careless driving is to be understood. Yet ‘careless driving’ is susceptible to sorites reasoning precisely because those evaluative and contextual considerations give reason to conclude that it is careless to drive with bald tires. For all their complexity (and their relation to deep questions of the rights of the citizen and the responsibilities that a community can justifiably impose on the citizen), those considerations do not determine a standard that is more precise than a standard that could be expressed using such an ordinary vague expression as ‘bald’. That is, those considerations do not provide a way of distinguishing between one tire in the sorites series and the next. Similarly, it is possible to construct sorites series for the application of even more abstract legal standards such as the United States constitutional prohibition on cruel and unusual punishment, or the right to due process — evaluative tests with special legal meanings that can only be understood in the context of a whole legal system (and by reference to their elaboration and development in a common law system of precedent).
Consider again the case of Garner v Burr (above, section 2.2). The term ‘vehicle’, as properly understood for the purposes of the Road Traffic Act, is vague if there are borderline cases for its application (cases in which it is unclear whether the term applies to some object). It may seem that nothing is more patently a borderline case of a ‘vehicle’ than a chicken coop on wheels. But we should bear in mind that (if the discussion in section 2.2 above is sound) the correct application of the term depends on legal principles relating to the purposes of the legislation and the need for clarity in criminal liabilities. So the chicken coop on wheels is a borderline case if it is unclear how those principles required the term to be applied. And the application of the term was indeterminate in the case, if those principles did not require a decision one way or the other. Of course, the appeal court held that a conviction was required — which we might say amounts to a decision that the term applied determinately to the chicken coop on wheels. The magistrates and the appeal court disagreed about it, but that disagreement in itself does not mean either that the application of the term was determinate or that it was indeterminate. And the fact that the appeal judges seem to have thought that the term clearly applied to the chicken coop cannot tell us that the application of the term was determinate.
The magistrates' approach put a special emphasis on the principle of certainty in criminal liability, and the appeal court's approach put a special emphasis on the effective accomplishment of the purpose the legislation was designed to pursue. Either approach would take the law in a certain direction. But the application of the term was indeterminate (before the decision of the appeal court set a precedent) if neither approach was demanded by the complex resources of legal reasoning that the courts (as a matter of legal obligation) had to act upon. If that was the case, then the appeal court's decision was not contrary to the law — but a decision upholding the acquittal would not have been contrary to the law, either. That account of a case like Garner v Burr would support the controversial claim that judges have widespread discretion in resolving legal disputes. Legal philosophers have debated whether that claim undermines the ideal of the rule of law, or reflects a basic requirement of the rule of law: that a legal system needs techniques for the resolution of legal issues that are not determined by the law (see Endicott 2000, chapter 9).
Bentham presented his theory as a definition. In focusing their attention on the meaning of the main terms of legal discourse, Bentham and John Austin were ahead of their time. But it has come to be a commonplace (though still controversial) view in legal theory that they were misguided in attempting to define those terms. So, for example, Hart in the sixties rejected definition as useful in philosophy of law (Hart 1994, 14–17). Dworkin in the eighties accused Hart of only repackaging the same approach as the ‘more candidly definitional’ method of John Austin (Dworkin 1986, 32–33). And Posner in the nineties accused both Hart and Dworkin of pointlessly “trying to define ‘law’” (Posner 1996, vii).
There is no reason to describe the work of Hart or Dworkin as defining the word ‘law’. And defining that word would not solve any of the problems of jurisprudence (as Hart pointed out). The fundamental reason is that a definition is useful only to someone who needs to learn the meaning of a word, and legal philosophers know the meaning of the word ‘law’. Their problems and their disputes would not be resolved by a statement that would help someone who did not know what the word meant. Philosophers of law cannot solve their problems by giving a definition of the word ‘law’, any more than philosophers of language can solve their problems by giving a definition of the word ‘language’ (for discussion of the implications for legal philosophy of the semantics and metasemantics of the word ‘law’, see Coleman and Simchen 2003).
A further reason is that, as John Finnis and Ronald Dworkin have both explained in different ways, the word ‘law’ can be used in a variety of senses: the law of the jungle, the law of gravity, laws of thought, Murphy's law, etc. (Finnis 1980, 6; Dworkin 1986, 104). A definition would have to allow for those senses. It might be an intriguing (and arduous) study in culture and human thought to explain the analogies among those senses, but it is a study that holds out no special promise for understanding the law of a community.
Legal philosophers have tried to explain the normativity of law — the fact that the law of a community is, or presents itself as, a guide to the conduct of members of a community. One easy way to express this abstract feature of law is by pointing out that the law can be stated by making normative statements (i.e. statements that use expressions like ‘obligation’, ‘right’, ‘must’, ‘may’). And one attractive way of trying to explain it is by explaining the meaning and use of the normative language that is often used in stating the law. That is, the problem of explaining the nature of legal norms (obligations, rights, etc.) can be addressed by explaining the meaning or the use of the normative words that are used in law (‘obligation’, ‘right’,…). Joseph Raz has put it that ‘The problem of the normativity of law is the problem of explaining the use of normative language in describing the law or legal situations.’ (1990, 170)
We saw that Bentham's theory of normative language in general was that, because there is no perceptible substance or emotion for which they stand as a name, words such as ‘right’ must be ‘expounded’ by paraphrasing sentences containing them by the use of sentences that contain only words that can be defined as referring to substances and perceptions. When no such paraphrase is available, he considered that normative language is meaningless. So he held that the phrase ‘natural rights’ is “simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptible rights, rhetorical nonsense; nonsense upon stilts”(Bentham 1843, Art.II). While the language is meaningless, he thought, we can explain its use — as a way of doing something. Using such nonsensical expressions is a way in which the speaker expresses his preferences.
Although Bentham and Austin thought that the notion of a natural right was nonsense, they did not at all think the same about the notion of legal rights. In their command theory they found a way of making sense of normative expressions in their legal use. They explained the meaning of the word ‘duty’ — and thereby the normativity of law — by reference to the pain and pleasure that a superior offered as motivation for compliance with the superior's will:
That is my duty to do, which I am liable to be punished, according to law, if I do not do: this is the original, ordinary, and proper sense of the word duty. (Bentham 1776, 109; cf. John Austin 1832, 14).
Hart used the resources of twentieth-century philosophy to challenge that approach to normative language. He drew on the work of J.L. Austin, a philosopher of language who thought that problems in many areas of philosophy could be dissolved by pointing out the things that people do with words. J.L. Austin once suggested that “a statement of ‘the law’” is a performative statement, rather than “a statement of fact” (Austin 1962, 4 n.2). The suggestion is that to state the law is to perform an act (an act other than the making of a statement that can be true or false). J.L. Austin's claim offers to account for the normativity of law by reference to the things that people do with words. That hint seems to have attracted Hart, whose theory of law is based on a ‘practice theory of rules’. He articulated the theory by pointing out what people do with the normative language they use in stating rules.
Hart started by arguing that Bentham and Austin had explained the meaning and use of normative language in a way that failed to account for its role in ordinary discourse. He pointed out that their account of the meaning of the word ‘duty’ left them unable to draw a distinction that people ordinarily draw in their use of language, between the command of a gunman (which no one would say imposes a ‘duty’ or an ‘obligation’), and a legal prescription:
The plausibility of the claim that the gunman situation displays the meaning of obligation lies in the fact that it is certainly one in which we would say that B, if he obeyed, was ‘obliged’ to hand over his money. It is, however, equally certain that we should misdescribe the situation if we said, on these facts, that B ‘had an obligation’ or a ‘duty’ to hand over the money. So from the start it is evident that we need something else for an understanding of the idea of obligation. There is a difference, yet to be explained, between the assertion that someone was obliged to do something and the assertion that he had an obligation to do it. (Hart 1994, 82)
Bentham and Austin would have had a ready response: that people ordinarily misuse the word ‘obligation’, by failing to give it a meaning that can be expounded by reference to sensible objects. Bentham and Austin (unlike J.L. Austin) were not ordinary language philosophers. They sought a way of using language that would back up their empiricism and utilitarianism, and they were actually pleased if that technique called for a reorganisation of ordinary language: it showed that they were disclosing what had been obscured by prejudice and cant.
Hart's approach to language was different, but it may seem that he did not need to talk about language, and that his point could have been made without mentioning types of assertions, or what ‘we would say’. His argument, you might think, simply puts into the linguistic mode an argument that could be made with no mention of language: an argument that you can have an obligation without being liable to sanction. And yet, the linguistic form of the argument was important to Hart. He wanted to avoid explaining the difference between obligation and coercion in the way a natural law theorist might (by saying that an obligation is a special sort of reason). So his focus on the use of the word ‘obligation’ is no accident. He did not point out the way we use that word merely as an oblique way of appealing to our shared wisdom as to what obligation is. It was actually important to him to point out how we use the word ‘obligation’. His explanation of the normativity of law relies on a view of the use of such words to display an attitude.
Hart claimed that a legal system is a system of power-conferring and duty-imposing rules, which are validated by a ‘rule of recognition’. That rule is not made valid by another rule; it is a ‘social rule’. It is in Hart's explanation of that crucial notion of a social rule, that he turned to the use of words to explain the normativity of law. He claimed that a social rule is a regular pattern of conduct accompanied by a ‘distinctive normative attitude’, which ‘consists in the standing disposition of individuals to take such patterns of conduct both as guides to their own future conduct and as standards of criticism’ (Hart, 1994, 255). In accounting for that disposition, or ‘internal attitude’, Hart's emphasis was on speech acts — on the use that participants in the practice make of normative language. He did not adopt J.L.Austin's suggestion that a statement of law is a ‘performative’ rather than being a statement that can be true or false. But the focus of his attention was on what people do when they make a normative statement — and not on what they assert.
What is necessary [for a social rule to exist] is that there should be a critical reflective attitude to certain patterns of behaviour as a common standard, and that this should display itself in criticism (including self-criticism), demands for conformity, and in acknowledgements that such criticism and demands are justified, all of which find their characteristic expression in the normative terminology of ‘ought’, ‘must’, and ‘should’, ‘right’ and ‘wrong’. (Hart, 1994, 57)
Hart's interest in normative language was focused not on its meaning, but on the attitude that people display when they use it. His explanation of the difference between non-normative and normative assertions (between, as he put it, ‘the assertion that someone was obliged to do something and the assertion that he had an obligation to do it’) was merely that the latter sort of assertion is used to display a distinctive sort of attitude.
Just as Bentham's approach to normative language was allied to his empiricism and his utilitarianism, Hart's approach to normative language was allied to his philosophical methodology, and to his views on the relation between law and morality. His methodological purpose was to describe human practices, and he wanted to defend a conceptual separation between law and morality — a distinction in kind between legal obligation and moral obligation (see Hart 1994, 239–240). The practice theory of rules attracted him as a tool for those purposes, because it offered a way of accounting for the normativity of law by pointing to ways of behaviour which could be described, and which did not (in his view) carry any moral baggage. In saying that people use normative language to display an attitude to regularities of behaviour, the theorist did not need to do moral philosophy, and did not need to make any moral evaluations of the practice being described. The theorist did not even need to ascribe any moral evaluations to the participants in the practice, since the fact that people use normative language to display an attitude is, Hart considered, consistent with their having various moral views or none at all.
How much simpler it would be to say that normative language means the same in its moral uses and in its legal uses. While a person who says that you must stop at a red light may display various attitudes, what he or she asserts is a necessity that implies a (presumptively) conclusive reason to stop. He says the same thing, whether he is saying what conduct the law requires, or what conduct is required, all things considered, by right reason. That approach is not only simpler; it closes the gap that Hart left in his theory. According to Hart, the meaning of normative language differs in morality and in law, but he never explained the difference. In fact, Hart had nothing to say about the meaning of normative expressions such as ‘ought’ and ‘must’ or ‘obligation’ or ‘right’ (except that their meaning differs in law and in morality). He only pointed out that people display an attitude when they use it.
Joseph Raz rejected Hart's claim that normative terms have a distinctive meaning in statements of law. In his view, to make a normative statement such as ‘you must stop at a red light’ is to say that you have a certain sort of reason for action. If it is a statement applying the law, it states that you have reason to stop from the point of view of the law. Raz's theory of law, unlike Hart's, is part of a theory of practical reasoning in general, and his account of normative statements treats them as having the same meaning in law and in morality. Hart initially thought that that approach would necessarily lead to an extreme sort of natural law theory, in which every true statement of law is also a true moral statement, and every valid legal obligation is necessarily a moral obligation. But Raz resolved that concern of Hart's, by pointing out that normative statements can be made in a detached way. People can make them without endorsing the point of view from which the reasons they are stating are valid (see Raz 1990, 175–177). Still, Hart did not accept Raz's approach, which he felt created a certain sort of conceptual connection between law and morality. In responding to Raz, he insisted that ‘statements of the subject's legal duties need have nothing directly to do with the subject's reasons for action’ (Hart 1982, 267). And in an interview with the Spanish journal Doxa near the end of his career he maintained ‘that legal and moral obligation are conceptually different’ in the sense that a statement of obligation has a different meaning in law and in morality (De Paramo 1988).
We saw that Hart tried to base the normative force of law on rules of recognition, which provide shared tests of validity for rules of the system. A rule of recognition is a social rule, consisting in a combination of two facts: the fact that the officials of the community regularly use certain tests to identify valid legal rules, and the fact that those officials take a ‘critical reflective attitude’ towards that behaviour. On that view, the content of the law of a community depends on a convention (or set of conventions), a way of recognizing legal rules that members of the community share. But if members of the community share a way of recognizing their law, how can they engage in the disputes about the law that we are all familiar with? How can people disagree about what the law is, if they share a conventional way of recognizing the law?
It is Ronald Dworkin who has made that question into a focus of jurisprudential debate. And he has framed the question as an objection to a misguided view of language, and of the relation between law and language. He begins his book Law's Empire by contending that many other theorists (including Hart) suffer from a ‘semantic sting’: they ‘insist that lawyers all follow certain linguistic criteria for judging propositions of law’ (Dworkin 1986, 32, 45). Dworkin claims that legal theories like Hart's cannot explain theoretical disagreement in legal practice, because they think that lawyers share uncontroversial tests provided by the conventional meaning of the word ‘law’ (tests which Dworkin terms ‘criteria’) for the truth of propositions of law. The semantic sting is the misconception that the language of the law can be meaningful only if lawyers share such criteria. It is fatal to a legal theory, because it leads the theorist to think that people cannot have any deep (or ‘substantive’ or ‘genuine’) disagreement about the law. They can only disagree about empirical questions (such as what words were used in a statute), or about how penumbral cases should be resolved, or about whether the law should be changed. Disagreeing about the criteria for application of the language of the law would be like using the same words with different meanings. People who disagree in that way are only talking past each other. Here is how Dworkin sets out the views of theorists who suffer from the semantic sting:
They say that theoretical disagreement about the grounds of law must be a pretense because the very meaning of the word ‘law’ makes law depend on certain specific criteria, and that any lawyer who rejected or challenged those criteria would he speaking self-contradictory nonsense.
We follow shared rules, they say, in using any word: these rules set out criteria that supply the word's meaning. Our rules for using ‘law’ tie law to plain historical fact. It does not follow that all lawyers are aware of these rules in the sense of being able to state them in some crisp and comprehensive form. For we all follow rules given by our common language of which we are not fully aware. …We all use the same factual criteria in framing, accepting, and rejecting statements about what the law is, but we are ignorant of what these criteria are. Philosophers of law must elucidate them for us by a sensitive study of how we speak. They may disagree among themselves, but that alone casts no doubt on their common assumption, which is that we do share some set of standards about how ‘law’ is to be used.
Philosophers who insist that lawyers all follow certain linguistic criteria for judging propositions of law have produced theories identifying these criteria. I shall call these theories collectively semantic theories of law. …
Semantic theories suppose that lawyers and judges use mainly the same criteria (though these are hidden and unrecognized) in deciding when propositions of law are true or false; they suppose that lawyers actually agree about the grounds of law.… (Dworkin, 1986b, 31–33)
Dworkin does not claim that we never share criteria for the application of a word: he says that there may be such shared, uncontroversial tests for the application of a word like ‘book’. But he claims that words like ‘law’ (and presumably most legal terms) stand for ‘interpretive concepts’. The correct application of an interpretive concept is determined not by a shared test of applicability, but by the theory that gives the best interpretation of the practice in which the concept is used. The semantic sting argument is a claim that Hart applies criterial semantics generally to legal (and, incidentally, jurisprudential) concepts, in a way that makes real disagreement about the law impossible.
Dworkin's idea that the concept of law is an interpretive concept is part of the underpinnings of his theory of law: he claims that legal philosophy needs to make a fresh start to face the challenge of explaining disagreement about the law, and he presents his theory as the best way of meeting that challenge. Any theory of law, he claims, needs to be a ‘constructive interpretation’ of legal practice. A constructive interpretation is one which simultaneously fits the facts of the practice (or other object of interpretation) and portrays it as a practice that achieves its purpose. On this view a theory that does not present law as an exercise in constructive interpretation cannot even compete as a theory of law, because it suffers from the semantic sting.
The semantic sting really does seem a gruesome fate for a lawyer, because those who suffer from it have to say that no one really disagrees with anyone about the law. Whenever people think they disagree about how to identify the law on any point, that fact in itself demonstrates that there is nothing to disagree about: there is no law on the point at issue, if the agreed ways of identifying the law do not decide the point. So if you suffer from the semantic sting, you will conclude that sincere, competent lawyers will never disagree with each other. When an apparent disagreement arises, they will throw up their hands and say that there is no law on the point. If you suffer from the semantic sting, you will think that at least one party to any dispute over the content of the law is both legally inept and philosophically misguided, or is just a liar.
Objections to Dworkin's diagnosis of Hart's work as suffering from a semantic sting are simple and compelling: Hart never said that people share complete and uncontroversial tests for the application of the language of the law, or specifically of the word ‘law’, and to say such a thing would have thwarted his attempt to take advantage of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations (Hart, 1994, 280, 297). Hart denied that he ever suffered from the semantic sting (Hart 1994, 246). Although he did claim that legal systems are based on rules of recognition, he did not say that those rules are linguistic rules, or that his theory is true because it states linguistic rules for the use of the word ‘law’. Neither he nor any other legal theorist has said that propositions of law are true if and only if they meet the uncontroversial tests of validity that people share in virtue of their knowledge of the meaning of the word ‘law’.
Some legal theorists have held that there is no genuine disagreement about law, but they are theorists who are much more sceptical about the whole enterprise than Hart was. Perhaps the semantic sting afflicts only those sceptics who think that it is impossible to agree or disagree about the law, and that it would be possible to agree about the law only if the conventional meaning of the word ‘law’ gave us shared uncontroversial tests for the content of the law. So the semantic sting argument does not undermine a theory of law like Hart's. What it does, however, is to pose in an original and striking fashion a challenge that Dworkin has raised for any legal theory, and a challenge that Hart never took up: the challenge of explaining disagreement about the content of the law. If an elucidation of the concept of law yields the insight that every legal system has rules of recognition, we might ask how it is possible for people to disagree about the content of the law. Hart's official answer was that a rule of recognition need not be very complete; like other rules, it can be vague (Hart, 1994, 147–154, 251). To Dworkin that is no answer: if the task of a rule of recognition is to provide a way of identifying the law, the tests provided need to be complete and uncontroversial, or there is no shared way of identifying the law.
But Hart did not take so high a view of his own theory's need to provide a certain and complete answer to all questions of law. Suppose that a rule of recognition identifies a legislature as having law-making power. That, to Hart, was enough to expect of a rule of recognition. It is a very common sort of rule of recognition, and it may leave many unanswered questions (as to how to interpret an act, and as to the limits of the power). But in Dworkin's view, it is no rule of recognition at all. And there is no rule of recognition in such a community unless (at least) (i) the members of the community also share uncontroversial techniques of legal interpretation that answer all questions of how an act is to be interpreted, and (ii) any limits on the power of the legislature are uncontroversial. Since many legal systems have legislatures whose powers are not clearly delimited, and since no community has an uncontroversial shared set of canons of statutory interpretation that answer all questions of interpretation, it is quite plausible to say that no legal system has a rule of recognition on Dworkin's understanding of such a rule. If that is the best understanding of a rule of recognition, then Dworkin's argument succeeds against Hart's theory of law. It succeeds not because Hart suffered from a semantic sting (there is still no reason to attribute to his theory the view that rules of recognition exist because they are required by linguistic criteria for use of the word ‘law’). It succeeds because it shows that Hart's theory cannot explain what makes a statement of law true or false.
If, on the other hand, it is right to characterize an ordinary rule granting lawmaking power as a social convention that identifies the law of the community, then Dworkin's argument fails. Hart can explain disagreement about the content of the law, by saying that the rule of recognition may require the participants in legal practice to apply a test that is very controversial: they must decide (and may dispute) how to interpret the acts of the legislature, and it may be unclear (and controversial) in some cases whether the legislature has the power that it claims to have exercised. If such a practice can be well described as a rule-governed practice for the identification of valid laws, then Hart has established his basic claim that there are rules of recognition.
But on Dworkin's view, conceiving of a rule of recognition as a very incomplete way of answering questions of law would still not explain disagreement: it would simply mean that there is no answer to most legal questions. So in order to meet Dworkin's challenge, Hart would have to show not only that rules of recognition (and other rules) may be vague, but that it can be reasonable to disagree over the application of such rules.
Think of a disagreement of the kind that divided the magistrates and the appeal court in Garner v Burr [above, section 2.2]. It would not be enough for Hart to say that there is no determinate law on the question of whether Lawrence Burr's chicken coop counted as a 'vehicle' for the purpose of the Road Traffic Act. To meet Dworkin's challenge, it would be necessary to explain how competent and (let's presume) sincere and reasonable adjudicators can differ (as they often do) on the question of what the law allows or prohibits.
That fact about Dworkin's challenge shows that there is a connection between his semantic sting argument and his view that there is a single right answer to virtually every legal dispute. Someone who suffers from the semantic sting is bound to think, on false grounds, that there are indeterminacies in the law when people disagree in applying the language of the law. Dworkin's argument makes room for his single right answer thesis. It concludes that in any unclear case of the application of an interpretive concept, the question of whether the concept applies or not is to be answered by arguments concerning the view that best fits and justifies the object of interpretation. The question cannot be sidestepped by a peremptory conclusion that the question has no answer because of the vagueness of the concept. It should be noted, however, that even if it is successful, the semantic sting argument does not give reason to accept Dworkin's right answer thesis. One mistaken way to disagree with the right answer thesis would be to think that there is no right answer to a question of law unless uncontroversial shared tests resolve the question. Avoiding that mistake does not mean concluding that there is a single right answer to every question of law.
Does the semantic sting have anything to do with semantics?
Dworkin's semantic sting argument is aimed against a certain attempt (which he considers Hart to have made) to apply philosophy of language in legal and political philosophy. But note that his objection to Hart's theory of law could be framed differently, without mentioning semantics or language at all: it is an argument that Hart was wrong to think that participants in a legal system share a rule of recognition, in the sense of an agreed way of deciding what rules are valid under the law of their community. Instead of opposing the misconception that the language of the law can be meaningful only if lawyers share criteria for the truth of statements of law, Dworkin could oppose the misconception that the members of a community can make legal judgments only if they share uncontroversial tests of legal validity that exhaust the grounds on which such judgments are legally justified.
Nicos Stavropoulos has restated the semantic sting argument as an argument against a ‘traditional semantic theory’ that he calls the ‘Criterial Model’ (Stavropoulos 1996). The Criterial Model holds that the content of some or all of the concepts used in legal practice, like ‘contract’ (and including the concept of law), is specified by a set of shared beliefs of users of the concept, which provide ‘criteria’ (in Dworkin's sense of the term) for the application of the concept. Stavropoulos offers an alternative understanding of the content of such concepts, borrowing eclectically from Dworkin and from Saul Kripke, Hilary Putnam, and Tyler Burge. He views the main concepts of legal discourse as referring to real properties, so that it is the task both of theorists and of lawyers to identify those properties, and there is room for ‘substantive disagreement’ over the nature of those properties. Just as ‘Aristotle’ refers to Aristotle, and ‘water’ refers to water, and ‘arthritis’ refers to arthritis (instead of referring to whatever has a set of properties that speakers believe Aristotle, water, or arthritis to have), a legal concept like ‘contract’ refers to contracts (instead of referring to whatever has a set of properties that speakers believe contracts to have). The content of those concepts is given by the real properties of the things that people use the words to designate (i.e. the properties of Aristotle, of water, of arthritis, and of contracts). The content of such concepts is not determined by the (more or less mistaken, and more or less shared) views about those properties that users of the words have in mind.
Like Dworkin, Stavropoulos uses the linguistic or ‘semantic’ mode, treating a legal dispute, such as whether an agreement is a contract, as a dispute over whether the concept ‘contract’ applies to an agreement. Stavropoulos treats Hart (and others) as having a semantic theory for the concept of a contract which is defective because it takes the content of the concept to be determined by shared beliefs or ‘criteria’. But Hart doubtless would have viewed disputes over alleged contracts as disputes over the application of the rules at a time in a jurisdiction for contract formation, or concerning the legal effects of misrepresentation, mistake, or frustration, etc.; in the view of a theorist like Hart, a contract is simply an agreement made enforceable (or valid for purposes other than enforcement) by the rules of the legal system (and enforceable in ways determined by those rules). Such a theorist might claim that there is no disagreement over the content of the concept (the members of the community agree in understanding a contract as an agreement that is enforceable according to law). But this agreement concerning the concept may leave a great deal of disagreement over whether particular transactions count as enforceable agreements.
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