Notes to Heaven and Hell in Christian Thought

1. Our set of three propositions is thus inconsistent in the sense that contraries are inconsistent: Even if it should be possible that all three propositions are false, it would not be possible that all three of them are true.

2. For the sake of accuracy, the word “not” in Albert C. Outler’s translation has been repositioned. The original translation reads as follows: “not even if a single member of the race were saved from it, no one could rail against God’s justice.”

3. Some in the Augustinian tradition have allowed that God might in fact save all who die in infancy—not, however, because they are innocent or deserve something from God and certainly not because God owes it to them to do something on their behalf. To the contrary, dying in infancy, no less than someone’s performing good works, is merely an indication, according to these Augustinian theologians, that someone is to be numbered among the elect. Accordingly, God could justly have condemned those who die in infancy, so they claim, even if he in fact chooses not to do so.

4. Popular arguments over the issue of capital punishment illustrate the point nicely. Opponents of capital punishment often point out, quite rightly, that the execution of a murderer does nothing to bring the victim of murder back to life and, in that sense, does nothing to restore a just order. On the other side, a proponent of capital punishment might retort that society should not permit murderers to gain an unfair advantage over their victims through an act of murder; so even though we humans have no power to achieve perfect justice in this matter, we can at least prevent this additional injustice and, in addition, even the score a bit. But whatever position one takes on this issue, it seems obvious that we humans have no power to achieve perfect justice in a case of murder, because neither the murderer nor society at large has the power to resurrect the victim of murder or to repair all of the harm that a murder brings into the lives of people.

5. Interesting enough, Augustine’s understanding of justice and mercy, as we encounter it in his later writings, appears flatly to contradict his earlier commitment to the philosophical doctrine of divine simplicity: the difficult to understand idea that each attribute of God is identical with God himself and with every other attribute of God. For if those in hell are the object of God’s justice but not of his mercy, then justice and mercy are distinct and very different attributes of God.

6. An important clarification is perhaps in order at this point. For not all who have traditionally identified themselves as Arminians are fully committed to the idea that God’s love is both unconditional in its character and unlimited in its scope. Unlike Roman Catholics, whose understanding of purgatory provides them with a good deal more flexibility on the point, many of these traditional Arminians hold that, for unrepentant sinners anyway, God’s love has a built in time limit, namely, the moment of a person’s physical death; they therefore reject the idea that God will continue striving to save sinners after this deadline has passed. Some traditional Arminians are therefore no more committed than the Augustinians are to God’s inexhaustible love for all sinners. They insist instead, even as Jonathan Edwards did, that any sinners who fail to repent before they die will discover that God’s conditional and limited love has instantaneously turned to wrath and to hatred without love. Such a view at least clarifies why the damned never repent and never vacate hell; they simply have no choice in the matter. Once God rejects them with finality, they will never again have any opportunity to repent. So in that respect, at least, these traditional Arminians no more regard hell as a freely embraced condition than the Augustinians do. More recently, however, a number of those working within a basically Arminian framework—call them free will theists—have tried to formulate a more consistent free will theodicy of hell, and their work also reflects a more consistent commitment to God’s inexhaustible love for all created persons.

7. Middle knowledge includes more than perfect foreknowledge; it also includes a perfect knowledge of what a person would have done freely in circumstances that do not even obtain. So God can base his decision not to put someone in a given set of circumstances, for example, on his knowledge of what the person would have done freely had God in fact put the person in those circumstances.

8. When Paul quoted the poet Epimenides of Crete in order to make the point that “in him [God] we live and move and have our being” (Acts 17:28), one might interpret this to imply that God is not only our moral and spiritual environment, but our physical environment as well. Given that interpretation, even our experience of the physical order would be an implicit experience of God.

9. Whereas modus ponens is an argument of the form: if p then q; p; therefore q, modus tollens is an argument of the form: if p then q; not q; therefore not p.

Copyright © 2014 by
Thomas Talbott <>

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