Notes to Feminist Metaphysics

1. Some parts of this section were originally published in (Haslanger 2005).

2. Like Hacking, I will use the terms ‘idea’ and ‘concept’ without making precise distinctions between them for the purposes of our discussion. In contrast to concepts, ideas are often propositional, and plausibly more specific to the individual.

3. It may be that, given the use of the diagnosis, there are individuals who take themselves (and are taken by others) to have SDPD and by virtue of this come to have something in common. The diagnosis may even reinforce features that are described in the DSM as characteristic of SDPD. However, it would be wrong to say even then that the individuals in question have SDPD, for the diagnosis is supposed to be tracking an independent disorder, not one caused by being diagnosed with SDPD.

4. Note that the notion of kind in philosophy has several different uses. On one use it is meant to capture a classification of things by essence: things fall into kinds based on their essence, and each thing falls only into one kind. On this view, horses constitute a kind because they share an equine essence, but red things don't constitute a kind because apples, t-shirts, and sunsets don't share an essence. However, on a more common use, the term ‘kind’ is used as equivalent to ‘type’ or ‘sort’ or ‘grouping’. So far I've been using the term ‘kind’ in the latter sense, and will continue to do so.

5. The term ‘transgendered’ is typically used for those whose “gender identity” does not match their “assigned gender” but the meaning of the term is contested and in flux. The term ‘transsexual’ is used for those who desire to have a differently sexed body than the one they were born with, or who have changed their sex due to such desire.

6. Some anthropologists have hypothesized that the broad pattern of sexual dimorphism with respect to average height, weight, and strength has been caused by social factors such as the “division of labor by sex” (Frayer and Wolpoff, 1985). At this point, however, there is no consensus on what explains the evolution of such patterns.

7.By “intrinsic property” I mean, following standard usage, a property that an object has “simply in virtue of itself.” In more picturesque but somewhat misleading terms, it is a property that an object could have if it existed in a world all by itself. Intrinsic properties may be accidental, e.g., my current body temperature is an intrinsic property of me, but is not essential.

8. An important theme in feminist metaphysics is how to understand women as an analytic category without over-generalizing about all women based on a small sample of women in the dominant group. This is one form of the problem of “essentialism”. See, e.g., (hooks 1981; Spelman 1988; Young 1994)

Copyright © 2011 by
Sally Haslanger <>
Ásta Kristjana Sveinsdóttir <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.