The last three decades have seen a resurgence of interest in American Pragmatist philosophy, and part of the energy of that resurgence is due to feminist interest in pragmatism. What is now called “classical” American pragmatism is a grouping of philosophies that were developed from the late nineteenth through the early twentieth century, and were largely influential in the Progressive Era (1890–1915) and up until the Second World War. Pragmatists, such as John Dewey, William James and Jane Addams, were interested in the intersection of theory and practice, bringing philosophic thinking into relationship with the social and political environment. For these thinkers, philosophizing was an active process, both as a way to change social realities and to use experience to modify the philosophies themselves. Early pragmatists were often humanists; they saw the social environment as malleable, capable of improvement through human action and philosophic thought. Because of this, many of the classical pragmatists were engaged in social action, often participating in experiments in education and working for egalitarian social reforms. Both early and contemporary pragmatists reject the idea of a certain Truth that can be discovered through logical analysis or revelation, and are more interested in knowledge gained through experiences of all sorts, while emphasizing the social context of all epistemological claims. Pluralism is a central value for pragmatists, who understand that knowledge is shaped by multiple experiential viewpoints. As such, women's experiences are are an essential part of a truly pragmatist philosophy.
Contemporary studies in pragmatism and feminism generally combine a historical and a theoretical/methodological approach. Historically, feminist pragmatists are working to recover the ideas of women philosophers who were influential in the development and articulation of classical American pragmatism. This approach brings into view the lives and philosophies of thinkers and activists such as Jane Addams, Mary Parker Follett, Charlotte Perkins Gilman, Emily Greene Balch, Lucy Sprague Mitchell, Anna Julia Cooper, Mary Whiton Caulkins, and Ella Flagg Young. These women bring added dimensions to pragmatism and remind us of the issues that were subsequently left behind as American philosophy became more exclusively technical and academic. For these women, pragmatism was a philosophic practice used to accommodate their new academic and political engagement with the world, as well as a method of reforming politics and culture. The pragmatist approach to philosophy that brought theory and practice together helped these women trust and learn from their own experiences and to be intellectually engaged with their social reform movements.
Current feminist philosophers are also demonstrating the theoretical and methodological similarities between feminism and pragmatism, bringing feminist perspectives to pragmatist issues. Feminist pragmatists use pragmatist thought as a base for feminist theory, particularly in epistemology, education and social/political philosophies of democracy and rights. Both the biographical and theoretical approaches clarify the connections between feminism and pragmatism as activist-orientated philosophies, dealing with problems of embodied living in a social organism. Emerging feminist work is utilizing pragmatist-feminist thought to address contemporary feminist social and political concerns. This essay will first consider the influence of particular women of the classical pragmatist era, and the second part will consider the contemporary intersections between feminism and pragmatist philosophies, concluding with examples of how pragmatist-feminist philosophers are bringing their work to shed light on contemporary feminist concerns.
- 1. Early Feminist Influences on American Pragmatism
- 2. Contemporary Feminist Pragmatist Philosophies
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The historical recovery of female voices in the history of philosophy in the last few decades is an ongoing project that helps us become aware of women's influence on the history of philosophy and helps us gain an understanding of the process of the marginalization of women's voices. (See the entry feminist history of philosophy.) Recovering these women thinkers also allows us to hear new or excluded voices in the philosophic conversation, in some cases resulting in opening up the definition of philosophy itself. Because of the gender-based discrimination against women as rational thinkers and their exclusion from the academy, history has rarely carried the names and texts of these women into our philosophy textbooks. (See for example Eileen O'Neill's essay “Disappearing Ink”) The history of pragmatism is recent enough that we can more easily recover and recognize the women who participated in forming this uniquely American school of thought, formerly considered only through the work of such male thinkers as William James, Charles Sanders Peirce, George Herbert Mead, George Santayana, and John Dewey. The work of the women who were in philosophic and activist relationships with these philosophers, and were original philosophers in their own right, had until recently disappeared. Charlene Haddock Seigfried's work, particularly her 1996 book Pragmatism and Feminism, has been central in the effort to bring these invisible women back into the philosophical discussion, as well as to bring feminist perspectives to the field of pragmatism.
Pragmatism originated in the era when the first generation of American women were going to college and were beginning to enter academic discussions in all fields of study. Many of the women whose work has been brought into the feminist-pragmatist discussion were college-educated activists rather than professional academic philosophers, but their work had an enormous effect on the development of pragmatist thought. Taking John Dewey as an example, we can discover many women who were in dialogue with him and were influential in the formation of his philosophies. Through his correspondence, and through the writing of his female colleagues, we can get a glimpse not only of the interactive and relational nature of his philosophizing, but also of its development in relation to these women.
Jane Addams's (1860–1935) was a central figure in the development of pragmatist thought. In her lifetime Addams was revered as one of America's most famous social reformers, the founder of Hull House and the recipient of the 1931 Nobel Peace Prize. She developed her pragmatist philosophies through her experiences working in the poverty-stricken immigrant neighborhoods in Chicago, working and thinking cooperatively with the talented women who lived at Hull House, as well through reflection on texts and direct dialogue with philosophers of her time such as John Dewey, William James, Leo Tolstoy and W.E.B. DuBois. Addams published eleven books and hundreds of essays, writing on ethics, social philosophy, and pacifism, in addition to analyzing social issues concerning women, industrialization, immigration, urban youth, and international mediation. Addams's understanding of the relationship between action and truth contributed to her choice of a career in the public world of social activism. For her, a motivation to understand truth would compel her to seek it out in the world of action. Addams was a close friend of John Dewey: he was often at Hull House and she lectured in his classes at the University of Chicago. They worked and thought together on issues of democracy, education, and ethics, and they continued a lifelong collegial relationship.
Education was an area where the pragmatist feminists of the Progressive Era were very influential, in childhood education as well as in adult education theory and practice. Addams' educational philosophy provides a model for the interaction between thinking and action. For her, as well as for other educators like Lucy Sprague Mitchell, education is not seen as standing apart from life, but rather blending seamlessly into the fabric of experiences and providing a meaning-making function. Addams understood that while education informs experience (providing historical context as well as skills), education must also interact with and change in response to current social needs. In understanding the culture that students come from as well as the values of their lives, Addams argued for an educational approach that uses students' own experiences (personal as well as cultural) as starting points for learning.
A distrust of the divorce of theoretical ideals from experience in educational theory is evident in the work of early pragmatist-feminist writing. In Twenty Years at Hull House, Addams talks about how the professor's lack of interest in matters of the “welfare of mankind” leaves behind the messy and chaotic experiential realm of student relationships for the more pure intellectual realm, which then left the students open to the influence of “charlatans” (1990 , 247). Addams's vision of education, even in the early days of Hull House, brought together the intellectual culture of a liberal arts education, with the practical aspects of urban industrial life, bringing life and thought together.
Addams was involved in educational reform in the Chicago Public Schools, and later was a member of the Chicago School Board. However, her philosophy of education has had more enduring impact on adult education theory and practice, primarily as a result of her innovations at Hull House. In working with adults, she integrated arts, literature and history into the industrial life; later she celebrated the arts and culture that was already present in the lives of her industrial immigrant communities.
As several of his biographers have noted, one of the major personal and philosophic influences in John Dewey's life was his wife, Alice Chipman Dewey. Alice had been raised in Michigan by her pioneering grandfather and had attended a Baptist seminary after completing high school. Her interest in education and in the women's rights movement led her to study at the University of Michigan where she met Dewey, who was a young professor of philosophy. Alice is generally credited with bringing Dewey's philosophic Hegelian thinking into contact with real social issues. Their daughter Jane described Alice's influence on John this way:
Awakened by her (Alice's) grandparents to a critical attitude towards social conditions, she was undoubtedly largely responsible for the early widening of Dewey's philosophic interests from the commentative and classical to the field of contemporary life. Above all, things which previously had been matters of theory acquired through his contact with her a vital and direct human significance. (Jane Dewey quoted in Rockefeller 150)
Alice Chipman Dewey had taught school before attending the University of Michigan. She continued her interest in education while working with Dewey in his educational projects at the Lab School at the University of Chicago.
In addition Jane Addams and Alice Dewey, three other female pragmatist educators, Ella Flagg Young, Elsie Ripley Clapp, and Lucy Sprague Mitchell, had an influence on Dewey's educational philosophy. Joan K. Smith investigates Young's relationship with Dewey in her article “The Influence of Ella Flagg Young on John Dewey's Educational Thought” (1977). According to Smith, Ella Flagg Young began taking classes from John Dewey at the University of Chicago in the fall of 1895. Young was then 50 years old, with 33 years experience in all aspects of the Chicago Public School System. At the time that they met she was District Superintendent; she went on to become the first female superintendent of the Chicago Public School System after Dewey left Chicago. Young had already had an innovative career before she met Dewey, as she moved from being a classroom teacher to being the first woman to pass the certifying exams to become a school principal.
Dewey had not published in philosophy of education, or worked on educational issues, before he came to Chicago where he experienced Jane Addams's Hull House, and worked with individuals like Ella Flagg Young. Smith notes that he benefited from Young's experience as much as she benefited from his philosophy. After her graduation from the University of Chicago, Young worked with Alice and John Dewey in the innovative University of Chicago Laboratory School. In a letter to John McManis, Dewey wrote of the many ways that Young influenced his work, saying “it is hard for me to be specific, because they were so continuous and so detailed that the influence resulting from them was largely insensible. I was constantly getting ideas from her.” In this same letter Dewey refers to Young's pragmatism:
She had by temperament and training the gist of a concrete empirical pragmatism with reference to philosophical conceptions before the doctrine was ever formulated. (Quoted in Smith 1977, 152)
Seigfried also discusses Ella Flagg Young's influence on Dewey in Feminism and Pragmatism. Citing the McManis biography, Seigfried lists three examples which Dewey gave of instances when Young's “original interpretations and applications of his theories went beyond his own understanding.” These were: (1) “the extent to which freedom meant … a respect for the inquiring or reflective process of individuals”; (2) an understanding of “the way that the interactions of persons with one another influences their mental habits”; and, (3) “how all psychology that was not simply physiological was social” (1996, 80).
Two other pragmatist educators, Elsie Ripley Clapp and Lucy Sprague Mitchell,were associated with Dewey. Both of these women were born in the generation after Jane Addams, and were students of the classical pragmatists. Elsie Ripley Clapp (1882–1965) took fourteen courses from Dewey at Columbia, was his graduate assistant, and collaborated on research projects with him for years (see Seigfried 2001, 89–90). Clapp commented on drafts of Dewey's work, and contributed original ideas, as Seigfried shows by quoting a portion of a letter from Dewey to Clapp in 1911:
So great is my indebtedness, that it makes me apprehensive — not, I hope that I am so mean as to be reluctant to being under obligation, but that such a generous exploitation of your ideas as is likely to result if and when I publish the outcome, seems to go beyond the limit. (Quoted in Seigfried 1996, 92)
Dewey publicly acknowledged Clapp for her contributions to Democracy and Education, but only in the introduction, not attributing to her any particular ideas in the body of the text. Seigfried said that “it is also clear from letters that Clapp helped Dewey with the content of the courses in which she assisted” pointing out that Clapp would meet with Dewey before his lecture periods to discuss the content of the class. At his retirement in 1927, Dewey suggested that Clapp should be appointed to teach his courses at the Teachers College, but she was not offered the position by the college. She went on to do important work with rural education in a project with Eleanor Roosevelt.
Lucy Sprague Mitchell (1878–1967) was another feminist educator who both defined and reflected the progressive era philosophies of reform and social change through educational progress. In 1903, Mitchell became the first dean of women at the University of California at Berkeley where she encountered the sexism that was pervasive in the academy in that era. After moving back to New York, she began a 60 year career in child-centered education, combining educational scholarship in both research and practice, with founding and administrating innovative programs. Although Sprague Mitchell knew Dewey in Chicago, they developed a mutually influential relationship when she took classes from him at Teachers College, and she and her husband Wesley Clair Mitchell became close personal friends with the Deweys. In her lifetime, Lucy Sprague Mitchell was also seen as an example for other women who were interested in professional lives while marrying and raising children, something that was rarely available to the women of Jane Addams's generation. Sprague Mitchell's Bank Street School demonstrated the effectiveness of pragmatist child-centered education and continues to influence childhood development specialists and educators.
Educated young women quickly moved into activist realms, influencing the intellectual culture of the Progressive Era and early pragmatist thought. Jane Upin in “Charlotte Perkins Gilman: Instrumentalism beyond Dewey” (1993) compares the philosophies of John Dewey and Charlotte Perkins Gilman. Gilman and Dewey were contemporaries, born in the same year, and both were friends with Jane Addams. Gilman stayed at Hull House for about a month in 1895 where she lectured and explored the settlement culture. Both Dewey and Gilman were interested in philosophy as a useful factor in social and political problem-solving. Dewey wanted to reconstruct philosophy to be a force of social reform and was personally involved in projects designed to bring about concrete changes in society. Gilman, not trained in philosophy, was interested in the philosophy of “find(ing) out what ailed society and how most easily to improve it” (1993, 42). Both thinkers were interested in industrial issues, but Gilman's interests were primarily concerned with the industrial and economic conditions of women, both in the home and in the workplace.
Gilman, Addams, and Dewey were influenced by Darwinian thought, but all three rejected the harsh position of Social Darwinism that pits humans in a competitive fight for individual survival. Instead, they used the concepts of evolution to theorize the possibilities of social progress, affirming a social ethic that mandates that humans have the ability and the responsibility to improve their environment. Gilman concentrated much of her writing on social issues of women's environment, working towards radical changes in the home environment to make it more democratic and egalitarian. Gilman's writing recommended some Hull House innovations as examples of some of the social changes she recommended, such as having professional cooks making healthy family meals in a public kitchen, instituting day care centers, and abolishing industrial child labor. In his work on ethics, John Dewey used the home as model for social ethics in a democracy, yet Upin points out that the family model that Dewey used was a defective one, since women had very little freedom or autonomy in their homes at that time. Addams was more perceptive about the perplexities of home life for women, and in her book Democracy and Social Ethics, she advocated many changes that made private home life more consistent with a public social good.
It is important to note that we often have to look beyond academic philosophy to find the women who were influential social philosophers. In an attempt to expand our methods of philosophy, and to think in new ways, understanding these reformers as philosophers can be useful in seeing ways that those outside of modern, professional, academic setting have held and expressed ideas, helping us, as Elizabeth Kamarck Minnich would said, opening a “new space for thinking” in philosophy. In the Progressive Era, many of the college-educated social reformers in the Chicago area lived at Hull House or were associated with the University of Chicago, such as Julia Lathrop and Florence Kelly. Some of the Hull-House reformers, such as Sophonisba Breckinridge and Edith and Grace Abbott, did have academic positions, but did most of their academic and activist work in the realm of social reform.
Peace activism was an important political arena for the many of the women involved in social reform in the first decades of the twentieth century. During the Spanish American War of 1899 and in the decades prior to World War I, these women worked on anti-imperialist campaigns and fought militarist influences in society. After the beginnings of the war in Europe, political activism in opposition to war and working for alternatives to war became, for some women, their primary occupation. Primary among these women were Jane Addams and Emily Greene Balch, both of whom received the Nobel Peace Prize (Addams in 1931, Balch in 1946). Addams and Balch were founding members of Women's International League for Peace and Freedom, an organization which continues to be internationally influential. Balch was trained as a sociologist and an economist, but we see in her work the foundations of pragmatist philosophy, particularly in her support of a social democracy and in her fundamental faith that the social environment was capable of transformation through philosophical reflection and action. Pragmatist peace work has significant implications for understanding feminist causes; the early pragmatist women saw peace activism growing out of the same reform movement that led to women's suffrage. For these women, the movement toward social justice, toward egalitarian economic structures, and away from competitive hierarchies necessitated a social structure based in cooperation and peace, not on war. Such belief in the possibility of substantially changing social and political realities is at the heart of both pragmatism and feminism. It is evident from reading the works of these early pragmatist reformers that the feminist reform movements of the early 20th century were effectively squelched by the militarist fervor of the first world war.
Many early feminist pragmatists such as Jane Addams and Mary Parker Follett (1868–1933) developed innovative and influential social philosophies around the concept of democracy. For Addams, democracy as an ethic provided the theoretical framing for Hull House, her work with labor unions and her peace activism. By 1902 when she wrote Democracy and Social Ethics Addams theorized a continually evolving democracy based on social association which was particular to each generation and locality. She critiqued earlier formations of liberty and democracy that weren't developed out of experience and interaction, and that didn't embrace all classes of society. Addams' democracy was built on dialogue, joint experiences and social equality. As an ethical system, it placed on each person “a moral obligation” to chose experiences of “mixing on the thronged and common road” where we can “least see the size of one another's burdens” (1902/2002, 8–7).
As a political activist, Addams opposed American expansionist policies that precipitated the Spanish-American War in 1898 and the annexing of the Philippines. In “Democracy or Militarism,” published by the Central Anti-Imperialist League of Chicago, she criticized America's desire for colonies and as early as 1901 she warned of the dangers of equating democracy with nationalism (1901/2003, 11). Many of her political positions, such as women's suffrage, child labor legislation, and pacifism were based on democratic theory.
Follett's commitment to democracy started with her work in local community centers in the Boston area, but she took her ideas about integrative democracy to the workplace and eventually became a well-known management consultant. As a pragmatist, she believed that all theories be integrated with concrete experience and she advocated local networks and group organizations as the basis for democracy. In Creative Experience she claimed that we are governed mostly by cultural traditions which shape active processes and habits, which compose our shared experience. Follett rejected compromise as a way of dealing with difference, and instead advocated for what she called “integration” which requires that conceptual resolution of differences must be worked out in everyday practice.
In addition to recovering the writings of women in the pragmatist tradition, contemporary feminists use and extend pragmatist philosophies as a foundation for feminist theory. These feminist philosophers who work in the pragmatist tradition point out that pragmatism offers a valuable, although often unrecognized, resource for feminist thinkers, especially as we come to see it developed in the work of women pragmatists and activists.
A historical examination of pragmatism shows a reverse ordering of the theory-action method sometimes assumed in philosophic thought, and often critiqued by feminist thinkers. In its privileging of theoretical thinking, some philosophic texts leave us with the impression that ideas normally originate from theoretical, often solitary, thinkers and are diffused into the general culture. However, in the case of many women activists, like Jane Addams, it is evident that public and political activism shaped the character of the philosophy. Such a method is consistent with pragmatism; as 20th century pragmatist Sidney Hook said, “social action is the mother of inspiration and not, as is usually imagined, its offspring” (1991 , 3). Feminist theory also has grown out of the activism of the women's movement, and incorporates the understandings that have resulted from social activism. Pragmatist philosophers have often made these same points in their critiques of positivism. Both pragmatists and feminists have advocated for the practical use of philosophy in the realm of personal and public experience; pragmatism and feminism generally also share a social and/or political focus and advocate specific cultural changes. As Seigfried says, both pragmatism and feminism “reject philosophizing as an intellectual game that takes purely logical analysis as its special task. For both, philosophical techniques are means, not ends” (1996, 37).
Although pragmatism originated in a time when our culture was in the midst of enormous change in women's roles, classical early century male pragmatists did not analyze the gender biases in knowledge and culture in the ways that some early pragmatist feminist reformers did or in the way contemporary feminists have. Currently feminists and pragmatists share an effort to radically change oppressive political and social structures, an effort that finds resonance with the early feminist-pragmatists. Jane Addams and other feminist reformers like Charlotte Perkins Gilman were continuously involved in fighting oppression, especially of women, children and minorities. Pragmatism's continued insistence that philosophy address the problems of the current social situation supports critiques of gender, race and class oppression, even though the majority of the male founders of pragmatism seemed unconscious of cultural gender-related oppression.
Described below are four areas addressed by contemporary feminist pragmatists: epistemology, education, the active process of philosophizing, and the importance of pluralistic communities. Contemporary feminist epistemologists have pointed out how traditional philosophy's emphasis on rational, logical absolutes has devalued the ambiguities of the embodied life. For feminist pragmatists, pluralistic communities have epistemological value and provide the base for an inclusive problem-solving approach to social problems. The pragmatist understanding of education as a social and political force, as a major aspect of how society and individuals are shaped, has been echoed by contemporary feminists who analyze our educational curriculum and methods of teaching. Both pragmatism and feminism are more likely to bring social context to the forefront of philosophy, allowing for realities that are in flux and that are always being shaped and reconstructed by their context. Pragmatists emphasize that we must include particular and individual experiences in a pluralistic discussion of multiple realities, and that all parties involved in the issue be involved in any creation of a solution.
Feminists and pragmatists share an interest in an epistemology that is based in experience and relationality. In Pragmatism and Feminism, Seigfried lists some particular aspects of pragmatism that make it useful to feminist thinkers. Seigfried's first comparison between feminism and pragmatism concerns their mutual critique of dualism. She notes four dualistic aspects of rationalistic philosophy that Dewey critiques, and that some feminisms have also found oppressive in their support of invidious social/economic hierarchies:
(a)The depreciation of doing and making and the over-evaluation of pure thinking and reflection; (b) the contempt for bodies and matter and praise of spirit and immateriality, (c) the sharp division of practice and theory, and (d) the inferiority of changing things and events and the superiority of a fixed reality. (1996, 113)
Jane Duran, in “The Intersection of Pragmatism and Feminism” (1993), points out that feminist theorists have critiqued the preoccupation with universals “that seem to pervade much of analytic philosophy (indeed philosophy as a whole),” a desire for universals, she says, which leads all the way back to Plato. Plato's idealism carries with it a devaluation of the changing realm of the physical world. Duran points out that feminists, as well as pragmatists, are often less interested in universal generalities and notes that an emphasis on particulars as well as “relations and connections become almost more important than particulars themselves” (1993, 166). This pluralistic sense of refusing to constrict reality to that which is defined by logic or language, or to human conceptions, helps feminists as philosophers propose an alternative vision of philosophy.
Feminist pragmatists have relied on John Dewey's concept of experience as philosophical support for a position that holds together the subject and object in a nondualistic epistemology. Yet, as postcolonial feminists have pointed out, experience in itself is conditioned by one's cultural background. Ofelia Schutte (2000) points out that “the nature of knowledge is not culture-free but is determined by the methodologies and data legitimated by dominant cultures” (40). Feminist-pragmatist Celia T. Bardwell-Jones (2008) draws on Josiah Royce's theory of interpretation to address the problem of translation “at the borders of conflicting experience...where differences are translated instead of assimilated” (22). Such epistemological translation work is essential for feminists and pragmatists, given that in both fields theory is inherently about changing the world. Jane Addams embodied this intersection of pragmatism and feminism in her efforts to reconstruct the social order to increase justice for women and the underprivileged and to work as an interpreter across class and cultural boundaries (see Fischer 2005).
Feminist social analysis often produces the conditions for philosophic reflection, creating what Addams called “perplexities” that are the starting-points for philosophical and political change. In “Feminist-Pragmatist Revisioning of Reason, Knowledge, and Philosophy,” Phyllis Rooney notes that the classical pragmatists would have welcomed the challenges that contemporary feminisms have brought to philosophy. She compares these rifts to what Peirce called the “irritations of doubt” which open the door to inquiry and signal possibilities for recreation and rediscovery (1993, 21). Dewey called this irritation “an unsettlement” which “aims at overcoming a disturbance” or the “uncertainties of life” (1985 , 336–337), which he says, are the motivations for beginning to do philosophy. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams calls these events “perplexities,” and uses them as a way and a place to begin rethinking social values and epistemological claims. Pragmatism and feminism then share a movement toward active philosophizing about those “irritations,” “uncertainties,” and “perplexities.”
Contemporary feminist epistemologists such as Susan Bordo and Alison Jaggar have pointed out how traditional philosophy's emphasis on rational, logical absolutes has devalued the ambiguities of changing embodied experience. Shannon Sullivan in Living Across and Through Skins (2001) brings the pragmatist tradition of transactional knowing through embodied and relational lived experience to the feminist epistemology of standpoint theory, describing what she calls a “pragmatist-feminist standpoint theory.” This pragmatist-feminist perspective considers knowing through those relationships that are enacted through physical embodiment and also the social environment, incorporating “multiple marginalized perspectives.” Using Dewey's standard of truth as that which results in “transactional flourishing” Sullivan considers “questions about which standpoints can help promote flourishing transactions” (146–47). In doing so, she corrects the privileging of women's experiences that is found in Sandra Harding's feminist standpoint theory, and locates knowing as transactions among diverse others, possibly even non-humans. Sullivan's work is particularly significant in the ways she investigates feminist issues of embodiment drawing on both Continental and American Pragmatist perspectives.
Many contemporary feminist philosophers of education have drawn on the pragmatist tradition, and specifically on the work of early pragmatist women, in their conceptualization of education as political and emancipatory practice. Possibly because of its interest in the relationship between theory and action, philosophy of education has always occupied a privileged place in pragmatist philosophy, and feminist pragmatist writing reflects this.
Feminist philosophers, such as Elizabeth Minnich and Jane Roland Martin, have critiqued the content of college curriculum as well as the methods of education. Both have critiqued the traditional canon, pointing out the way that the canon perpetuates the traditional power structures by excluding the works of women and minorities. Minnich points out that the administrative structures of colleges and universities often place programs like women's studies or African-American studies on the periphery of the college hierarchies. Minnich's 1990 book, Transforming Knowledge, draws on both a feminist critique and pragmatist practices to advocate for a rethinking of the patriarchal assumptions at the base of our academic traditions. This means reconstructing what it means to do philosophy, opening our definitions of philosophy to voices that may have been previously excluded or marginalized. Minnich and other feminist thinkers have shown us how many traditional theorists have been blinded by their inability to conceive of ideas outside of the dominant hegemonic traditions. Minnich points out that pragmatism can share with feminism the vitality that arises from an opening of philosophy to newness, to otherness, to diversity.
Maxine Greene, a philosopher of education who draws on multiple philosophic traditions, has inspired a generation of educators and philosophers to think of education in terms of a practice of freedom, to provide “an opening of spaces” for new ways of thinking and being. In The Dialectic of Freedom, Greene relies on John Dewey, the example of Jane Addams, as well as feminist novels, to describe the ways that women have told the truths about their private and public lives. Greene wants an educational system that allows radical difference, that leaves open a space for diverse others to appear in the public world, to “tear aside the conventional masks…that hide women's being in the world” (57).
Pragmatism is a process-oriented philosophy, valuing and thinking about how ideas arise from social interactions within society. As Dewey said, pragmatism is a philosophy that “forswears inquiry after absolute origins and absolute finalities in order to explore specific values the specific conditions that generate them” (1977 , 10). Many pragmatist philosophers, past and current, have welcomed the tension and social changes that result from reconstructing the ways we think and act, especially in relationship to philosophy. Rather than a philosophic retreat from the impermanent and adapting nature of everyday life, pragmatists have chosen to do philosophy in an interactive and public mode. Dewey criticizes philosophy's tendency for “flight” from the messy world of experience:
(N)o one knows how many of the evils and deficiencies that are pointed to as reasons for flight from experience are themselves due to the disregard of experience shown by those peculiarly reflective. (1982 , 41)
Dewey's critique of the “flight from experience” is in some ways reminiscent of what Susan Bordo describes as the Cartesian “flight to objectivity” in her book The Flight to Objectivity: Essays on Cartesianism and Culture (1987). Feminist-pragmatists point out that the search for universalized ideals bankrupts ordinary experience and robs from philosophic thought the creativity of thinking with and through complex networks of experience and interaction.
Pragmatist philosophy can provide rich support for feminist attempts to reconstruct the ways that we think about reality. Pragmatists suggest an understanding of the “vague” nature of our social world, which involves the continual reconstructing of our conceptions as our social and intellectual environment changes. William James in A Pluralistic Universe refuses to constrict reality to that which is defined by by logic or language, or to human conceptions. This type of thinking helps feminists as philosophers propose an “other” vision of philosophy. Similarly contemporary feminist thinkers have changed the academy and the larger culture by re-analyzing and reconstructing the ways that we think, the hierarchies of knowing, as well as the social conventions that have defined gender. Erin McKenna in The Task of Utopia: Pragmatist and Feminist Perspective uses this process-orientation to create a social/political philosophy that is always open to change, rather than one with finished “ends” in view. With both feminism and pragmatism we can consider philosophizing contextually as a creative force, reacting to as well as reconstructing our multiple environments.
For the early pragmatist-feminists, as well as for John Dewey, pluralistic community was an important theoretical and practical ideal. Addams's social ethics and Dewey's emphasis on self as connected to community is a powerful critique of the ideal of liberal individualism which positions individuals as autonomous beings who are often in competition with each other for their freedoms. Dewey's political philosophy emphasizes social relationships, not as individual to individual but as individual to the larger community. As he says, individuals “have always been associated together in living, and association in conjoint behavior has affected their relationships to one another as individuals” (1984 , 295). Feminists working in the pragmatist tradition rely on this prioritizing of community to rethink what it means to live in a democracy (Green 1999), to provide a feminist communitarian philosophy (Whipps 2004), or to re-conceive alternative ways of structuring societies. The “social ethics” advocated by Dewey and Addams embraces equality and multiplicity in community in ways particularly pragmatist. Addams claimed that these conditions of interdependence held the promise of civilization, cooperation, and coexistence, and she worked to build communities that fostered these joint associations. Scott Pratt has noted that these pluralistic values in American philosophy may have deeper roots that James, Dewey and Addams. In Native Pragmatism he finds some of the origins for the gender and cultural pluralistic values of American philosophy in the early 19th century writings of Lydia Marie Child, writing about indigenous North Americans. These early pragmatist writers join with contemporary feminists in a critique of the hierarchical systems of power that limit multiple perspectives. For feminist-pragmatists, the reliance on diverse experiences for developing truths and the importance of understanding pluralistic perspectives means that we are dependent on relationships with others for meaningful public life. Several contemporary pragmatist-feminists have built upon these foundations to develop pragmatist-feminist political philosophies, including Judith Greene in Deep Democracy: Community, Diversity, Transformation, Beth Singer in Pragmatism, Rights and Democracy, and Erin McKenna in The Task of Utopia.. Through education in critical thinking and social responsibility, along with changes in social structure. These feminist pragmatists believe that we could imagine a participatory democracy in which all members of the society are involved in creating the community.
Many contemporary feminists have criticized recent communitarian philosophies as potentially harmful to feminist issues, when the call for a “return” to community values means a return to values that restrict gender roles or limit diversity. Jane Addams's work can be seen as a basis for a feminist progressive communitarianism that critiques isolated individualism and understands personal identity as necessarily embedded in social and political community. Her first book, Democracy and Social Ethics, posits a democratic “social ethic” of caring for and being involved with the larger community. This is a social ethic that results from “mixing on the thronged and common road where all must turn out for one another, and at least see the size of one another's burdens” (2002 , 7). She took this sense of empathic understanding to larger and larger communities, as she moved from local to national to international work.
Pragmatists and feminists share this concern for relational community, as well as an interest in pluralistic thinking. Yet, as Seigfried points out, given the pragmatist emphasis on difference and diversity, feminists and pragmatists may differ on how they construct the Other. Pragmatists, she says, “are more likely to emphasize that everyone is a significantly and valuably Other … and tend to celebrate otherness by seeking out and welcoming difference as an expression of creative subjectivity” (1996, 267). As Francis Hackett, an early resident of Hull House, said about Addams, “one feels in her presence that to be an ‘other’ is itself a title to her recognition” (1969, 76). Feminists, on the other hand, having experienced the position of marginalized otherness as women, are more inclined to “expose the controlling force exercised by those who have the power to construct the Other as a subject of domination” (Seigfried 1996, 267). In either embracing the diversity of the other, or in critiquing a system that makes persons into object-others, both feminists and pragmatists critique and actively fight against the unjust hierarchies created by racism, classism, and sexism.
As pragmatist feminist philosophy continues to develop, more women who worked in the pragmatist tradition are being uncovered, and their voices incorporated back into the pragmatist tradition. Contemporary pragmatist feminist philosophers are utilizing those perspectives to address contemporary philosophical issues such as care ethics (see Hamington) and cosmopolitanism (see Fischer 2007). Philosophers bring these recovered perspectives to contemporary feminist issues. For example, Amrita Banerjee investigates resolutions to domestic violence using Mary Parker Follett's philosophy of “power-with” rather than “power-over” (2008). The combined force of pragmatism and contemporary feminism is leading to a deeper understanding of contemporary progressive feminist goals, bringing action and theory together in egalitarian practice.
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- Jane Addams Hull-House Museum, College of Architecture and the Arts, University of Illinois/Chicago
- Jane Addams Biography, Nobel e-Museum
- Web Companion to Pragmatism, The Pragmatism Cybrary, maintained by John Shook.
- Center for Dewey Studies, Southern Illinois University Carbondale.
- The Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy.