Ontological Dependence

First published Thu May 12, 2005; substantive revision Thu Sep 10, 2009

Ontological dependence is a relation—or, more accurately, a family of relations—between entities or beings (onta in Greek, whence ontological). For there are various ways in which one being may be said to depend upon one or more other beings, in a sense of ‘depend’ that is distinctly metaphysical in character and that may be contrasted, thus, with various causal senses of this word. More specifically, a being may be said to depend, in such a sense, upon one or more other beings for its existence or for its identity. Some varieties of ontological dependence may be analysed in modal terms—that is, in terms of distinctly metaphysical notions of possibility and necessity—while others seem to demand an analysis in terms of the notion of essence. The latter varieties of ontological dependence may accordingly be called species of essential dependence, of which identity-dependence is a particularly important example. Notions of ontological dependence are frequently called upon by metaphysicians in their proposed analyses of other metaphysically important notions, such as the notion of substance. Consequently, a good way to test the adequacy of a putative definition of some species of ontological dependence is to see how well it serves the use to which it is put in attempts to analyse these other metaphysically important notions—and this is the strategy that will be adopted in discussing the merits of various different accounts of ontological dependence in what follows.

1. Ontological dependence, substance, and properties

A crucial notion in metaphysics is that of one entity depending for its existence upon another entity—not in a merely causal sense, but in a deeper, ontological sense. The kind of dependence in question must also be distinguished from any kind of logical dependence, because logical relations, strictly speaking, can obtain only between propositions, not between concrete objects, nor between abstract objects that are not propositional in nature. Thus, a substance is often conceived to be an object that does not depend for its existence upon anything else. (For example, Descartes asserts that ‘by substance we can understand nothing other than a thing which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence’ (Writings, vol. I, p. 210).) Again, properties are often said to depend for their existence upon the objects that possess them. (Thus, Descartes also remarks that ‘we know by the natural light that a real attribute cannot belong to nothing’ (Writings, vol. II, p. 114).) So how should this relationship of existential dependence be defined? An obvious proposal would be to say, quite simply:

(EDR) x dependsR for its existence upon y =df Necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

The subscript ‘R’ is used here because it seems appropriate to call this species of existential dependence of one entity upon another rigid existential dependence. The definiens in (EDR) is equivalent, of course, to ‘Necessarily, if x exists, then y exists’, so that according to (EDR) the existential dependenceR of x upon y amounts to the strict implication of y's existence by x's existence. Note that (EDR) implies that everything dependsR for its existence upon itself—but, while the desirability of this implication may be disputed, we shall let the matter pass for the time being. It would, of course, be easy enough to modify (EDR)'s definiens to read ‘y is not identical with x and, necessarily, x exists only if y exists’, but that would have the disadvantage of precluding anything from dependingR for its existence upon itself. Note also that one could very naturally contrast rigid existential dependence as defined by (EDR) with what might appropriately be called non-rigid existential dependence, defined as follows:

(EDN) x dependsN for its existence upon the F =df Necessarily, x exists only if the F exists.

The thought here is that—to use the language of ‘possible worlds’—‘the F’ in any instance of (EDN) might well denote different entities in different possible worlds. So, for example, it might be said that a material object x dependsN for its existence upon the matter composing x, even though it might have been composed of different matter, because in every possible world in which x exists the matter composing x in that world exists in that world.

On the face of it, (EDR) seems to capture precisely one strongly intuitive notion of existential dependence. For example, when it is said that a particular event, such as the assassination of Caesar, depends for its existence upon Caesar, (EDR) seems to explicate this appropriately in terms of the fact that the assassination could not have existed if Caesar had not existed to be assassinated. Some other assassination, we may suppose, could have existed at that very time and place, but for that very assassination to have existed, Caesar himself had to exist.

But how well does the conception of substance adverted to earlier fare under the assumption of (EDR)? According to that conception, a substance may be characterised as follows: x is a substance if and only if there is nothing y such that y is not identical with x and x depends for its existence upon y. Interpreting ‘depends for its existence upon’ here in terms of (EDR) thus gives us the following definition of substance:

(SUB) x is a substance =df There is nothing y such that y is not identical with x and x dependsR for its existence upon y.

Substituting the definiens of (EDR) into (SUB) then delivers the following principle:

(P1) x is a substance if and only if there is nothing y such that y is not identical with x and, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

But presumably we want to allow that substances may be composite objects, that is, that they may possess proper parts: and yet isn't it the case that any composite object is such that, necessarily, it exists only if its proper parts exist? So are we not compelled to give up (P1) and thereby (SUB)? Perhaps not, for we may instead deny that a composite substance dependsR for its existence upon its proper parts, on the grounds that it may undergo a change of its parts without ceasing to exist. It may be true that a mere collection of things, such as a pile of stones, dependsR for its existence upon the things in question, but for that very reason such a collection may be deemed not to be a true substance. By contrast, a living organism may survive a change of any of its parts, provided that the change is effected in a non-disruptive manner. It is true, of course, that such an organism must have parts if it is to exist, but which objects those parts are is inessential—and consequently it is not the case that it depends for its existence, in the sense defined by (EDR), upon any one of those parts. (We shall see later, however, that it is possible to define another sense of existential dependence in which it is true to say that a composite substance depends for its existence upon its proper parts: see (EDG) below.)

Let us, however, leave aside the notion of substance for the time being and turn to that of property. Earlier it was pointed out that properties are commonly said to depend for their existence upon the objects that possess them. One might propose to state this in the form of another principle, as follows:

(P2) If x is a property and y is an object possessing x, then x dependsR for its existence upon y.

This time, substituting the definiens of (EDR) into (P2) gives us:

(P3) If x is a property and y is an object possessing x, then, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

But (P3) might also be challenged. For even if one subscribes to an ‘Aristotelian’ (as opposed to a ‘Platonic’) view of universals, according to which there can be no unexemplified properties (that is, no properties that are not possessed by objects), one may still contend that a given property, x, possessed by a particular object, y, would still exist even if y did not, provided that some other object then possessed x. (Such a view of universals is defended by David Armstrong in Armstrong 1978.) However, to this challenge it might be replied that it misconceives how (P3) is to be interpreted: (P3), it may be said, is not intended to apply to properties understood as universals, but only to so-called particularised properties (otherwise variously known as property instances, individual accidents, tropes, or modes). These are such supposed items as the particular redness of a particular apple, conceived of as an entity distinct from the redness of any other apple, no matter how well matched in colour to the first. (See, e.g., Campbell 1990, in which these items are called—following D. C. Williams—‘tropes’; described as ‘moments’—following Husserl—the existence of such items is ably defended in Mulligan, Simons & Smith 1984; for an illuminating discussion of Husserl's conception of moments as ‘dependent parts’, see Simons 1982.) On this interpretation, (P3) has considerable plausibility, complying as it does with the intuition that particularised properties cannot ‘migrate’ from one object to another. (Actually, (P3) itself does not quite imply this, although it does imply that a particularised property cannot migrate from one object to another when the first object ceases to exist.)

But now another difficulty looms. What, in the light of preceding remarks, are we to say about the ontological status of properties in the sense of universals? More specifically, do they qualify as substances according to the proposed definitions? For, even adopting the ‘Aristotelian’ view, whereby if a property x exists then some object must exist which exemplifies x, we are not compelled to say that there is any object y, exemplifying x, such that necessarily, x exists only if y exists. However, even if the universal x does not dependR for its existence upon any of the objects which exemplify it, perhaps it still dependsR for its existence upon something else and thereby fails to qualify as a substance. Yet there is a difficulty in seeing what sort of entity, quite generally, could be invoked to fulfil this role. Compound universals (such as conjunctive ones, and disjunctive ones if they exist) no doubt dependR for their existence upon the universals out of which they are compounded. Likewise, if one believes that determinable universals exist in addition to determinate ones (for instance, red in addition to scarlet and crimson), one may argue that the determinate universals dependR for their existence upon the determinable ones. (Armstrong denies the existence of determinable universals—see Armstrong 1978, vol. II, p. 118; there he also denies the existence of disjunctive universals, but accepts conjunctive ones.) The reverse would be more difficult to argue for, because it is presumably not the case, for instance, that necessarily, if red exists then scarlet exists—since it is possible for red to be exemplified, and so to exist, even if scarlet is not exemplified. Incidentally, one should, of course, concede that scarlet itself is only a determinable relative to a more specific shade of it, so that more accurately one should speak of a scale of determinateness from most to least. However, simple and least determinate universals would not appear to dependR for their existence upon any other universals—unless perhaps it can be argued that corresponding to any universal there is a higher-order universal which must exist if that first universal does: for example, that if the property of being red exists, then so must the property of being a colour-property. (An argument of this sort is advanced in Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 1991; see also Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 1994, pp. 97–8.)

Suppose, then, that we cannot exclude (all) universals from the category of substance according to (SUB) in conjunction with (EDR): what to do? A plausible move, which would not appear unduly ad hoc, would simply be to modify the definition of substance, (SUB), to give:

(SUB-1) x is a substance =df x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical with x and x dependsR for its existence upon y.

After all, we have the respected precedent of Aristotle, who—in the Categories—admitted only particulars as ‘primary’ substances, while allowing some universals (the species and genera of primary substances) the status of ‘secondary’ substances (see Aristotle, Categories, ch. 2).

An alternative strategy that one should mention would be this. We could first define a generic notion of existential dependence as follows:

(EDG) x dependsG for its existence upon Fs =df Necessarily, x exists only if some F exists.

In this sense, both composite substances and ‘Aristotelian’ universals are existentially dependent objects, since the former require the existence of proper parts and the latter require the existence of particular exemplars. (Set F as ‘proper part of x’ and ‘particular exemplar of x’, respectively, in (EDG).) We could then define a substance as an entity which is existentially dependent only in virtue of requiring the existence of parts (bearing in mind here that even a non-composite substance must have itself as a part, albeit as an improper part):

(SUB-2) x is a substance =df x dependsG for its existence only upon parts of x.

(If we believe in the existence of universals, then we should clearly add to the definiens ‘and universals that are exemplified by x’.) This will then exclude universals from the category of substance because their particular exemplars—upon which they depend for their existence, in the sense defined by (EDG)—are not parts of them. However, we shall not pursue this alternative strategy further here since the problems that we shall later discover to afflict (SUB-1) also afflict this alternative definition of substance. Moreover, this alternative definition has additional problems of its own: for instance, unless we are prepared to regard particularised properties as parts of the objects possessing them—which looks like a category mistake—or else to argue against their existence altogether, then we shall have to conclude that only ‘bare particulars’—propertyless substrata—could qualify as substances. Similarly, unless we are prepared to regard places as parts of the objects occupying them, or again to deny their existence altogether, we shall have to conclude that only unlocated mental entities—immaterial souls, perhaps—could qualify as substances. (These problems could, no doubt, be evaded by adding appropriate clauses to (SUB-2), but because the terms introduced by those clauses—such as ‘particularised property’ and ‘place’—express concepts no more fundamental than that of substance itself, the resulting definition of substance would be philosophically unilluminating, even if extensionally correct. We shall encounter the same type of problem with another rival to (SUB-1) later: see the discussion of (SUB-3) below.)

Note, incidentally, that generic existential dependence as defined by (EDG) above is very close to a pluralised form of non-rigid existential dependence, as defined by (EDN). We could call this plural non-rigid existential dependence, definable as follows:

(EDP) x dependsP for its existence upon the Fs =df Necessarily, x exists only if the Fs exist.

For, clearly, saying—for example—that a composite substance x dependsG for its existence upon proper parts of x is very close indeed to saying that x dependsP for its existence upon the proper parts of x.

2. Essential properties and inalienable events

An apparently more serious problem for (SUB) than that posed by universals is this. How can we accommodate the possibility that some, at least, of the particularised properties of a substance (assuming such particularised properties to exist) are essential to it? For if y is an essential particularised property of a substance x, it will apparently be the case that there is something non-identical with x, namely y, such that, necessarily, x exists only if y exists: and this conflicts with x's status as a substance according to (SUB)—and indeed according to (SUB-1) as well, since y in this case is a particular. A similar problem would arise if composite substances could have essential proper parts, but perhaps this can more plausibly be denied than that they have essential properties. According to the doctrine of mereological essentialism (see further Chisholm 1976), all composite objects have all of their proper parts essentially, which is generally regarded as an excessively extreme claim. But if one rejects that claim, it seems plausible to uphold instead the position mooted earlier, whereby no composite substance has any of its proper parts essentially, because it can undergo a change of any of those parts over time.

Now, what could be a plausible example of an essential particularised property of an individual substance, say Socrates? Recall that particularised properties are conceived of as property instances, such as the particular redness of a certain apple. Of course, an apple can change its colour, so that this is not an example of an essential particularised property of the apple. But what about—in the case of Socrates—his humanity (as it were, his particular being human)? Certainly, if there is such a thing as the particular humanity of Socrates, he cannot lose it without ceasing to exist. But perhaps we can deny that this particularised humanity is anything distinct from Socrates himself: after all, its existence necessarily coincides with his. (We already know, by (P2), that it dependsR for its existence upon him, and given now that it is essential to him it follows that the existential dependenceR between them is mutual.) In short, perhaps we can argue that the distinction, such as it is, between Socrates and his humanity is merely a ‘distinction of reason’. It is not obvious that this strategy will run into conflict with Leibniz's law even if the strategy is extended to all the essential particularised properties of a substance—for, precisely because the notion of an essential particularised property is a somewhat arcane one, it does not appear that we can cite uncontentious examples of predicates true of such a property but false of the substance possessing it, or vice versa. Nor does any problem arise from identifying both Socrates's humanity and his animality, say, with Socrates himself, despite these particularised properties being instances of different universals, for this entirely parallels the fact that Socrates himself is an instance both of human-kind and of animal-kind—indeed, ‘parallels’ is too weak a term on the present view, since on this view these two ways of talking reflect only a distinction of reason.

We may be inclined to endorse the strategy just outlined: that is, to maintain that if indeed there are such things as essential particularised properties that are ‘possessed’ by substances, then they are in fact to be identified with those substances, whence they constitute no threat to (SUB). Yet we are not plausibly entitled to go further and maintain quite generally that wherever items x and y are mutually existentially dependent as defined by (EDR), they are identical. For although too little is independently known about essential particularised properties to dispute an identity between them and the substances possessing them, other cases are more problematic. For instance, consider the relationship between Socrates and the temporally extended event or process that was his life. Clearly, in terms of (EDR), Socrates's life dependsR for its existence upon Socrates—but so, plausibly, does his existence upon it: it is, for Socrates, an inalienable event. And yet there are things true of the life of Socrates that are not true of him and vice versa (for example, that it was so many years long, and that he weighed so many pounds)—so there is no question of their being identical. But perhaps it will be disputed whether Socrates is existentially dependentR upon his life—whether he necessarily would not have existed if it had not—for it may be urged that he might have had or led a different life. Now, it is true enough that his life might have been qualitatively different in many ways, but what is currently at issue is whether he might have had a numerically different life—and it is hard, perhaps, to see how he could. For we have accepted that lives dependR for their existence upon the persons whose lives they are: that is to say, necessarily, x's life exists only if x exists. So suppose, for the sake of argument, that Socrates could have had a numerically different life: then it would still have been a life which could only have been Socrates's—no one other than Socrates could have had that ‘other’ life. But then what could underpin the supposition that it is indeed a life ‘other’ than the life he actually had (except qualitatively)? Other possible worlds clearly do contain lives that do not exist in the actual world, insofar as they contain people who do not exist in the actual world: but there seem to be no strong grounds to suppose that they do so other than for that reason. (Query: if Socrates had lived one day less than he actually did, would not the shorter life that he would then have lived have been numerically different from his actual life, being identical with an event that is only a proper part of his actual life? Possible answer: this shorter possible life of Socrates would inevitably have differed qualitatively in some respects, towards its end, from the event that was Socrates’s actual life minus its last day—so why identify it with the latter event rather than with Socrates’s actual life, which we have already agreed could have been qualitatively different?)

If this judgement is correct, however, then we do after all have a problem with our original definition of substance (SUB), insofar as it entails (P1)—a problem, moreover, which equally afflicts our revised definition of substance (SUB-1). For Socrates is a substance and yet, contrary to (P1), there is something (a particular), not identical with Socrates—his life—such that, necessarily, if Socrates exists then this other thing exists. (It should perhaps be emphasised that we are only interested in the life example as a potential threat to (SUB) and (SUB-1), so that not too much hinges on our assessment of it provided that alternative examples could replace it.) Now, an obvious expedient here would simply be to modify our definition of substance yet again so as to exclude events (including processes) from the category, to give:

(SUB-3) x is a substance =df x is a particular non-event and there is no particular non-event y such that y is not identical with x and x dependsR for its existence upon y.

Again, this seems reasonable and not unduly ad hoc, inasmuch as it incorporates the strong pre-theoretical intuition that substances are continuants rather than events. However, a disadvantage of this approach is that it precludes us from defining events as non-substances, on pain of circularity. Indeed, we are now under some pressure to provide a definition of ‘event’, since this category is certainly no more fundamental than that of substance itself and so cannot be taken as primitive in an adequate definition of substance (cf. Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 1991 and 1994, pp. 67–9). Unfortunately, however, it is quite plausible to hold that events simply are changes in the properties and relations of persisting things (continuants), including substances, so that we are caught in something of a dilemma. The point is that an attractive strategy is to define the category of continuants as embracing substances and collections of substances (the latter being things like armies and piles of stones) and then to define events and processes as changes or sequences of changes in the properties and relations of continuants: but this patently requires us not to define ‘substance’ in terms of ‘event’, as in (SUB-3).

3. Asymmetrical existential dependence

As it happens, however, it seems that there are independent reasons for not adopting (SUB-3) anyway. More particularly, it seems that it is a mistake to respond to the problem raised by Socrates's life by modifying (SUB-1) in this way, because the real source of the problem lies with (SUB)'s reliance on (EDR), the definition of ‘rigid’ existential dependence. It's not that (EDR) does not serve to define a perfectly respectable notion of ontological dependence—just that the notion that it does define is not the one that it is appropriate to call upon in an analysis of the notion of substance. The case of Socrates's life demonstrates that (EDR) permits the possibility of mutual existential dependenceR between non-identical things. But there is something very unsatisfactory about this implication where the definition of ‘substance’ is at issue, because—or so it seems—the intuitive notion of ontological dependence that is in play here is the notion of a distinctly asymmetrical relation (although we shall shortly find reason to modify this claim in a minor way). Take, indeed, the relationship between Socrates and his life. According to (EDR), Socrates is quite as much existentially dependentR upon his life as his life is upon him. And yet there is a strong intuition that, in another and more important sense, Socrates's life is the truly dependent entity here, while Socrates is a wholly independent existent (a substance). We want to say, it seems, that Socrates's life exists only because Socrates does, whereas it would be putting the cart before the horse to say that Socrates exists because his life does. Now, the conjunction ‘because’ is asymmetrical, because it expresses an explanatory relationship and explanation is asymmetrical. Two distinct states of affairs cannot explain each other. (There may, quite conceivably, be self-explanatory states of affairs, so we should only want to urge that non-identical states of affairs cannot be mutually explanatory. Technically, this means that we should strictly describe explanation as an ‘antisymmetric’ rather than as an asymmetric relation—a point to which we shall return, though we may ignore it for the time being.) The asymmetry of explanation is, of course, intimately related to the unacceptability of circular arguments. (Note here that while two distinct propositions may entail one another—at least according to a reasonably fine-grained criterion for the individuation of propositions—nonetheless, insofar as those entailments are exploited to argue for the truth of one or other of those propositions, one must make an exclusive choice as to which proposition is to be regarded as premise and which as conclusion: one cannot have it both ways.)

All this suggests that, for the purpose of defining ‘substance’, (EDR) should be replaced, at least to a first approximation, by something like:

(EDX) x dependsX for its existence upon y =df Necessarily, x exists only because y exists.

We use the subscript ‘X’ because, in line with foregoing remarks, it seems appropriate to call this species of ontological dependence eXplanatory existential dependence. (We shall need the subscript ‘E’ for other use later.) Here it is important to note that the presence of the word ‘only’ in (EDX)'s definiens should not be understood as implying that an object x may not dependX for its existence upon two (or more) different things, y and z. Thus the particularised relation of Mary's loving Tom—supposing such an entity to exist—plausibly exists only because Mary exists, but plausibly also exists only because Tom exists. Furthermore, we may assume that it is not an implication of (EDX) that a composite substance dependsX for its existence upon its proper parts, that is, that it is not the case that it ‘exists only because they exist’—on the grounds that it could still exist in the absence of those particular parts, provided suitable alternative parts were substituted for them. (Thus (EDX) is quite unlike (EDG) in its implications for part-whole dependence relations, as far as substances are concerned.) For the same reason, we may assume that (EDX) does not imply that an ‘Aristotelian’ universal dependsX for its existence upon its particular exemplars. Indeed, we may take it that the definiens of (EDX) entails the definiens of (EDR)—although not vice versa, of course—so that the following is a principle that we should accept:

(P4) If, necessarily, x exists only because y exists, then, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

However, despite these clarifications, it must be conceded that the locution ‘x exists only because y exists’ is hardly very perspicuous, either as to its logical form or as to its exact meaning. Moreover, precisely because we have introduced the conjunction ‘because’ as an explanatory conjunction, it may be felt that it is not well-suited to the ontological role now being devised for it. There are perhaps two sources of worry here: first, that this approach invites a confusion between metaphysics and epistemology; and secondly (but relatedly) that contexts governed by the conjunction ‘because’ are opaque (in the technical sense of the term, in which it implies the non-applicability of Leibniz's law).

Although these latter worries can quite probably be allayed, we should perhaps accept that (EDX) as it stands does not really constitute a satisfactory definition of a species of existential dependence, conceived as an objective metaphysical relation between entities, because it is insufficiently perspicuous. Even so, the considerations which led us away from (EDR) and towards (EDX), in our attempt to capture a notion of ontological dependence suitable for an analysis of the notion of substance, may still have served to point us in the right direction. The fact that (P4) but not its converse is plausibly taken to be a true principle indicates that what we should be trying to frame is a perspicuous definition of a species of ontological dependence that is a relation between x and y stronger than (entailing but not entailed by) ‘necessarily, x exists only if y exists’. This should moreover be (for reasons discussed earlier) an asymmetrical relation—or, more accurately, an antisymmetric relation, that is, a relation R such that if xRy and yRx, then x = y. (This is to allow that an entity may, in the anticipated sense, depend ontologically upon itself, but that where it so depends upon something else, that other thing does not in turn depend in that same sense upon the first entity.)

As we shall see in a moment, a relation of just the sort we seek is the relation of identity-dependence, to be explained below. But first we may should digress for a moment to dismiss the suggestion that the relation we seek might be expressed in terms of the one-sided holding of the relation defined in (EDR). According to this suggestion, we have:

(EDA) x dependsA for its existence upon y =df (i) necessarily, x exists only if y exists and (ii) it is not the case that, necessarily, y exists only if x exists.

Notice that the relation thus defined is asymmetric (rather than antisymmetric): it doesn't permit any object to be existentially dependent upon itself. Indeed, we have chosen to use the subscript ‘A’ here because the relation in question may aptly be called asymmetrical rigid existential dependence. This in itself does not render such a definition unsuitable for deployment in conjunction with a definition of substance on the pattern of either (SUB) or (SUB-1), although it would render otiose the clause ‘y is not identical with x’ in such a definition. A much more serious problem is that the appeal to (EDA) for such a purpose would do nothing to resolve the difficulty raised by the example of Socrates's life. For neither Socrates nor his life is existentially dependentA on the other, since in neither case is clause (ii) of (EDA) satisfied. But we were looking for a sense of ‘ontologically dependent’ in which it is true to say that Socrates's life is ontologically dependent upon him, but not vice versa.

4. Identity-dependence and essence

We spoke a moment ago of the relation of identity-dependence as being a relation of the sort that we seek. Informally speaking, to say that the identity of x depends on the identity of y—or, more briefly, that x depends for its identity upon y—is to say that which thing of its kind y is fixes (or at least helps to fix) which thing of its kind x is. By ‘fixes’ in this context is meant metaphysically determines. A fully perspicuous formal definition of identity-dependence is not easy to frame (for reasons that we shall come to in a moment), but the relation can be made sufficiently clear for most of our present purposes by means of examples. For instance, then, the identity of a set is fixed by the identities of its members. Likewise, the identity of an assassination is (at least partially) fixed by the identity of the person assassinated. These relationships of identity-dependence are direct consequences of the identity-criteria governing the kinds of which the items thus related are instances. (For more on identity-criteria, see Lowe 1989.) Thus, the identity-dependence of a set upon its members is a direct consequence of the Axiom of Extensionality, which functions as a criterion of identity for sets. Notice, here, that we allow that x may be said to depend for its identity upon y even in cases in which the identity of y alone does not suffice to fix the identity of x. So, for example, a set with two or more members depends for its identity upon each of them, although its identity is only completely fixed by the identities of all of them.

Now, although we have not yet presented a formal definition of identity-dependence, it might well seem that a consequence of any such definition should be the following principle:

(P5) If x depends for its identity upon y, then there is a function f such that x is necessarily identical with f(y).

(Note: ‘f(y)’ here may be pronounced ‘the f of y’.) For example: because the identity of a marriage depends on the identities of the two people being married, if x is a marriage and y and z are the two people in question, (P5) is satisfied in respect of x and y in virtue of the fact that x is necessarily identical with the marriage of y with z—so that in this case the required function is the marriage with z function from persons to events. (We here ignore the complications created by the fact that, under some legal systems, the same two persons may be married to one another more than once.) Note that the reason for including the word ‘necessarily’ in (P5) is to ensure that f is a function which picks out x as the referent of the expression ‘the f of y’ in every possible world in which that expression refers to anything at all. Thus, for example, the event that was actually the marriage of y with z could not have been anything other than the marriage of y with z. (By contrast, the first marriage function, for example, does not meet this requirement, because the event that was actually the first marriage of y—say, the marriage of y with z—might not have been the first marriage of y, since y could have married someone else before marrying z.) It seems clear, however, that wherever the identity of an item x depends on the identity of another item y, the criterion of identity for items of x's kind will supply the requisite function f.

Evidently, it would not do simply to replace the conditional connective in (P5) with a biconditional connective and thence attempt to turn it into a definition of identity-dependence, unless at the same time one could impose some suitable restriction on the kind of function involved. For—to give a simple example—if we let y be {x} (that is, the unit set of x), then we see that x is necessarily identical with the sole member of {x}: and yet, intuitively, the identity of {x} depends on the identity of x rather than vice versa. So the sole member function would obviously have to be excluded. How to exclude all and only the intuitively inappropriate functions is a problem of some magnitude which remains to be resolved. However, the most promising strategy would, perhaps, be to exclude the sole member function on the grounds that, whereas it is part of the essence of {x} that it contains x as its sole member, it is not part of the essence of x that it is the sole member of {x}. This is shown by the fact that, whereas one cannot understand what {x} is without thereby understanding that it contains x as its sole member, one certainly can understand what x is without thereby understanding that it is the sole member of {x}—and understanding what x is, in this sense, is precisely a matter of grasping its essence. We could then generalise this reasoning so as to exclude any function f which is not such that it is part of the essence of x that it is the f of y, giving us as our desired definition of identity-dependence the following:

(ID) x depends for its identity upon y =df There is a function f such that it is part of the essence of x that x is f(y).

We can exemplify (ID) by letting x be {z} and y be z, in which case we have, as is intuitively correct, that {z} depends for its identity upon z, because there is a function—namely, the unit set function—such that it is part of the essence of {z} that it is the unit set of z.

Obviously, (ID) entails (P5), since it is necessarily the case that if f is a function such that it is part of the essence of x that x is the f of y, then x is necessarily identical with the f of y—although, as the example of x and its unit set demonstrated, the converse is not necessarily the case. That is, it is not necessarily the case that if f is a function such that x is necessarily identical with the f of y, then it is part of the essence of x that x is the f of y: thus, x is necessarily identical with the sole member of {x}, but (plausibly) it is not part of the essence of x that x is the sole member of {x}. (Cf. Fine 1994a, pp. 4–5; see also Fine 1994b for more on the notion of essence and an account of ontological dependence which is in some ways quite similar to the one presented here.) But, of course, for the foregoing strategy to work and thus for (ID) to be fully vindicated, a perspicuous account of the notion of ‘essence’ would be required—and that is a large task which cannot be undertaken here. However, as a gesture towards such an account one might advert to John Locke's remark that in the ‘proper original signification’ of the word ‘essence’ it denotes ‘the very being of any thing, whereby it is, what it is’ (see Locke Essay, III, III, 15). In this sense, then, a thing's essence may be said to constitute its identity, when one uses the word ‘identity’ in this distinctive manner to speak of a thing's identity, rather than using it to speak of the identity relation. Seen in this light, identity-dependence as defined by (ID) is simply a species of essential dependence, that is, a way in which ‘the very being’ of a certain thing is determined by a relation in which it stands to another thing.

At this point, two principles concerning identity-dependence, as defined by (ID), may plausibly be proposed. First:

(P6) If x depends for its identity upon y, then, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

And second:

(P7) If x is not identical with y and x depends for its identity upon y, then y does not depend for its identity upon x.

An immediate implication of (P6) in conjunction with (EDR) is that if x depends for its identity upon y, then x is rigidly existentially dependent upon y (although not necessarily vice versa, of course). These two principles are, it seems, extremely plausible. As for (P6): surely, x cannot exist unless everything upon which x's identity depends also exists. Thus an assassination surely cannot exist unless the person assassinated exists, and a set surely cannot exist unless its members exist. Indeed, it would seem that we can derive (P6) with the aid of (P5), which we have agreed to be a consequence of (ID). For suppose that x depends for its identity upon y. Then, by (P5), there is a function f such that x is necessarily identical with the f of y. Given, however, that the f of y cannot exist unless y exists—because a relation can obtain only between entities all of which exist—it follows that x, which just is the f of y, likewise cannot exist unless y exists. As for (P7), this seems to follow from the requirement of non-circularity which is a condition on the adequacy of any criterion of identity. (This non-circularity requirement is clearly related to the explanatory status of an adequate criterion of identity—so we have by no means abandoned our earlier idea that explanatory relations are involved in some species of ontological dependence, but have merely specified more precisely what kind of explanation is relevant in such cases.) For example, given that unit sets are not to be identified with their members, we cannot say both that the identity of a unit set depends upon the identity of its member and that the identity of that member depends upon the identity of that unit set, for this would engender a vicious circle which would seem to deprive both unit sets and their members of well-defined identity-conditions.

Note that it may be urged, with some plausibility, that every entity x trivially depends for its identity upon itself. And, certainly, (ID) has this implication, because for any entity x, there is a function—namely, the identity function—such that it is part of the essence of x that x is the entity identical with x. But we must be very careful to distinguish between the claim that an entity depends for its identity upon itself and the claim that an entity depends for its identity solely upon itself. For even if the former claim is trivially true of all entities, the latter claim is certainly not.

Having defined identity-dependence by (ID) as a species of essential dependence, we are now in a position to identify other species of essential dependence, the most obvious being what may aptly be called essential existential dependence, which can be defined as follows:

(EDE) x dependsE for its existence upon y =df It is part of the essence of x that x exists only if y exists.

Note that, whereas—assuming the truth of (P7)—two distinct entities cannot be identity-dependent upon each other, it very plausibly is possible for each of two distinct entities to dependE for its existence on the other. For example, if we think of the top and bottom ‘halves’ of a solid sphere as being geometrically defined entities whose boundaries are specified by reference to the whole sphere of which they equal subdivisions, it seems plausible to say that it is part of the essence of each such hemisphere that it exists only if the other does. (These ‘halves’, it should be emphasised, must not be confused with the portions of matter ‘filling’ them at any given time, and hence should not be thought of as ‘parts’ of the sphere of which it is materially composed.) At the same time, each hemisphere depends for its identity upon the whole sphere—one being identified as the top half of that sphere and the other as the bottom half—whereas the sphere itself does not likewise depend for its identity upon either of these halves. Note also that, very plausibly, if x dependsE for its existence upon y, then x also dependsR for its existence upon y: essential existential dependence entails rigid existential dependence—but not, of course, vice versa.

5. The ontological independence of substance reconsidered

It will be recalled that we were led to the notion of identity-dependence as a result of looking for an asymmetrical—or, at least, an antisymmetrical—relationship of ontological dependence, of a sort that might prove suitable for characterising substances appropriately as ontologically independent entities. Now, perhaps the most promising definition of substance that has been canvassed so far is the following:

(SUB-1) x is a substance =df x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical with x and x dependsR for its existence upon y.

As we have seen (SUB-1) is unsatisfactory for various reasons, on account of its reliance on (EDR). However, we know already that it won't do to replace the notion of existential dependence employed in (SUB-1) by appealing instead to the relation of essential existential dependence, as defined by (EDE), because the latter is neither an asymmetrical nor an antisymmetrical relation. Indeed, this is one lesson of the example of the two hemispheres discussed a moment ago. For, whereas the whole sphere might well be taken to qualify as a substance, neither of its ‘halves’ plausibly can, because they lack the requisite kind of ontological independence. But, while (SUB-1) reinterpreted in terms of (EDE) does indeed have the implication that neither of the hemispheres is a substance—because each dependsE for its existence on the other and hence on a particular distinct from itself—it also has the unwanted implication that the whole sphere is not a substance for the same reason, because it clearly seems to be part of the essence of the sphere as a whole that it exists only if each of its hemispheres exists. However, an obvious remedy is at hand. We can simply replace the appeal to any species of existential dependence in a definition on the pattern of (SUB-1) by an appeal to the relation of identity-dependence, as defined by (ID), to give:

(SUB-4) x is a substance =df x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical with x and x depends for its identity upon y.

Composite substances appear to comply with (SUB-4): for, very plausibly, although they possess proper parts, they do not depend for their identity upon those parts, since which objects those parts are does not help to determine which substances they are parts of (the same objects being capable of becoming parts of many different substances). Moreover, substances quite generally do not depend for their identity upon their (accidental) particularised properties, if such exist, nor upon the events in which they participate, nor upon the places they occupy, nor upon other substances. The particularised properties of substances and the events in which substances participate—that is, items such as the particular redness of this apple and the assassination of Caesar—clearly depend for their identity upon those substances, which precludes the reverse relationship from obtaining, on pain of circularity. (The only admissible exception would be in the case of essential particularised properties of substances, but these, we have suggested, may be identified with the substances themselves.) As for places, although a physical substance must indeed occupy some place, which place it occupies does not determine which substance it is, since substances may exchange places. Again, substances (such as Socrates or this apple) can—in the metaphysical sense of ‘can’, even if not in the causal—exist in the absence of any other substances (other than their own proper parts, if they are composite), whence they cannot depend for their identity upon other substances (including their own proper parts, for reasons already given).

Against this last claim, the thesis of the ‘necessity of origin’ might be urged, implying as it does, for instance, that Socrates is the particular person he is by virtue of being the child of a particular man and a particular woman, or, at least, the product of the union of a particular sperm and a particular egg. (The locus classicus for this thesis is Kripke 1980: see pp. 110 ff.) However, this thesis might be challenged by pointing out the intuitive force of the claim that Socrates—that very person—could, metaphysically, have had no beginning to his existence at all, or have come into existence ex nihilo. We may agree that Socrates—that very person—could not have been born of different parents without conceding that he had to be born of the particular parents that he did have, because we needn't concede that in order to exist he had to be born of parents at all. Likewise, we may agree that no person other than Socrates could have been the product of the particular sperm and egg which produced him, without conceding the crucial point at issue. That being granted, we may conclude that (SUB-4) is plausibly correct in its verdict that substances do not depend for their identity upon anything other than themselves.

It will be recalled that what led us to reject appeal to (EDR), our first definition of existential dependence, for the purpose of analysing the notion of substance was that it permits two different entities to be existentially dependentR upon one another—entities such as Socrates and Socrates's life. (ID), as we have seen, precludes any analogous symmetry where identity-dependence is concerned: indeed, it delivers the intuitively correct verdict that it is Socrates's life that is, in this sense, ontologically dependent upon Socrates, rather than vice versa. For Socrates's life is an extended event or process in which he participates—and which person Socrates is partially determines which event this is, but not vice versa. Or, to put it another way—one which should by now be familiar—it is part of the essence of Socrates's life that it is the life of Socrates, but it is not part of the essence of Socrates that he is the person who lived that life. Of course, we can still acknowledge that the relation defined by (EDR) does hold mutually between Socrates and his life and we can still call this relationship a type of existential dependence—namely, ‘rigid’ existential dependence. Similarly, we can recognise as other species of existential dependence the ‘generic’ existential dependence defined by (EDG), the ‘asymmetrical’ rigid existential dependence defined by (EDA) and the ‘essential’ existential dependence defined by (EDE). (For more on the varieties of ontological dependence, including temporally relativised ones, see Thomasson 1999, pp. 24–34, Correia 2005 and Correia 2008.) The key point is simply that, in the sense of ‘ontological dependence’ in which we are intuitively and pre-theoretically inclined to describe substances as ontologically independent objects, the relationships defined by (EDR), (EDG), (EDA) and (EDE) will not serve our purposes, whereas that defined by (ID) will. The only plausible sense in which a substance is an entity which does not depend ‘ontologically’ upon anything other than itself seems to be the sense in which it does not depend for its identity upon anything else. This still leaves many interesting questions concerning ontological dependence unanswered, notably the question of whether there is a fundamental level or layer of reality, consisting of one or more entities upon which all other existing entities depend ontologically in one way or another (for discussion, see Lowe 1998, pp. 154–73, Schaffer 2003, Cameron 2008 and Paseau forthcoming).


  • Aristotle, Categories and De Interpretatione, trans. J. L. Ackrill, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1963.
  • Armstrong, D., 1978, Universals and Scientific Realism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cameron, R. P., 2008, ‘Turtles All the Way Down: Regress, Priority and Fundamentality’, The Philosophical Quarterly, 58: 1–14.
  • Campbell, K., 1990, Abstract Particulars, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Correia, F., 2005, Existential Dependence and Cognate Notions, München: Philosophia Verlag.
  • Correia, F., 2008, ‘Ontological Dependence’, Philosophy Compass, 3(5): 1013–1032.
  • Chisholm, R. M., 1976, Person and Object: A Metaphysical Study, London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Descartes, R., The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, J. Cottingham et al. (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.
  • Fine, K., 1994a, ‘Essence and Modality’, in J. E. Tomberlin (ed.), Philosophical Perspectives 8: Logic and Language, Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Company.
  • Fine K., 1994b, ‘Ontological Dependence’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 95: 269–90.
  • Hoffman, J. & Rosenkrantz, G. S., 1991, ‘The Independence Criterion of Substance’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 51: 835–52.
  • Hoffman, J. & Rosenkrantz, G. S., 1994, Substance Among Other Categories, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kripke, S. A., 1980, Naming and Necessity, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Locke, J., An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, P. H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Lowe, E. J., 1989, ‘What is a Criterion of Identity?’, The Philosophical Quarterly, 39: 1–21.
  • Lowe, E. J., 1998, The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity, and Time, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mulligan, K., Simons, P. & Smith, B., 1984, ‘Truth-Makers’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 44: 287–321.
  • Paseau, A., 2010, ‘Defining Ultimate Ontological Basis and the Fundamental Layer’, The Philosophical Quarterly, 60: 169–75.
  • Schaffer, J., 2003, ‘Is There a Fundamental Level?’, Noûs, 37: 498–517.
  • Simons, P., 1982, ‘The Formalisation of Husserl's Theory of Parts and Wholes’, in B. Smith (ed.), Parts and Moments: Studies in Logic and Formal Ontology, München: Philosophia Verlag.
  • Thomasson, A. L., 1999, Fiction and Metaphysics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Lowe, E. J., 2001, ‘Recent Advances in Metaphysics’, keynote delivered at the International Conference on Formal Ontology in Information Systems (October 17–19, Ogunquit, Maine), sponsored by The Association for Computing Machinery, Special Interest Group on Artificial Intelligence.

Copyright © 2009 by
E. Jonathan Lowe

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.