Supplement to Temporal Consciousness

Interpreting Temporal Illusions

Our perceptual systems are efficient, but not miraculous: due to the finite speed of signal transmission, and delays due to neural processing, changes in our immediate environments do not register in our experience instantaneously. This well-established fact gives rise to a puzzle: how are we able to deal with a fast-changing world as well as we do if we are unable to perceive things in real-time? Part of the answer could be that the perceptual experiences our brains supply us with are based on anticipations of the likely course of events, rather than signals deriving from the events themselves. This is one interpretation of the flash-lag illusion, a version of which is depicted in Figure 25. Subjects are shown a moving figure – in this case a rotating circle – and at some (unpredictable) point during its trajectory a brief flash is shown. In actual fact the flash occurs right next to the arrow – as shown in the figure on the left – and if perceptual experience faithfully mirrored stimuli patterns, this is where it would be seen. But subjects actually see the flash lagging a discernible distance behind the arrow, as shown on the right.

Figure 25. The Flash-Lag Illusion.

Nihjawan (1994: 257) suggests that in such cases the rotating disk has been visible long enough for the brain to be able to extrapolate its likely future positions, and that it uses this information to deliver a perceptual experience which lags less far behind the actual course of events than would otherwise be the case. Since the occurrence of the flash is unpredictable, its location cannot be extrapolated in this manner, and so it seems to lag behind the arrow.

It should be noted, however, that Eagleman and Sejnowski (2000) have offer a different diagnosis of this effect. They conducted a series of experiments in which the direction of rotation of the disk prior to the occurrence of the flash is always the same, but where it is altered, in random fashion, just after the flash occurs. With this protocol it turned out that – contrary to the prediction of the extrapolation model – the perceived location of the flash relative to the ring is independent of the initial (pre-flash) trajectory. They conclude from this that visual awareness is not predictive, but rather is postdictive: the experience the brain ends up associating with the time at which the flash occurs depends on events which occur approximately 80 msec after the flash itself. As they put it: ‘these experiments indicate that the visual system consults the ongoing input of information from the near future of an event before committing to a percept’. (2000: 38). As for how we manage to catch a moving ball, they suggest perceptual extrapolation is not needed, that processing delays can be compensated by appropriate training of our motor systems.[41]

This ‘delayed response’ model of the perceptual process is relevant to a criticism that Grush lays at the door of Extensional approaches (2007: §5). As we have seen, there are a number of cases in which what is perceived at a given time t can (seemingly) effect what is experienced prior to t. By way of an example, take the phi phenomenon. We see a spot on a screen moving smoothly from one location (A) to another location (B); in actual fact, all that appears on the screen are two motionless flashes of light. Why should this be a problem for Extensional theorists? Grush reasons as follows. When the A-flash occurs we have not yet seen the B-flash, and so we perceive a motionless spot of light; after the B-flash occurs, we experience a spot of light moving between A and B. When queried subjects report that they saw the moving spot, but not the stationary spot. Why? Retentionalists can make sense of this sequence of events as follows. The perception of the immobile A-flash occurs in one specious present, the perception of the moving spot occurs in an entirely distinct specious present a short while later; since only the second experience is remembered, when queried subjects report say they only saw a moving light. According to the Extensional theorist, however, there is just one token experience corresponding to the A-flash. Hence the problem: since the A-flash is seen as both immobile and as in motion, this one token experience must possesses an impossibly inconsistent content. Since there cannot be such contents, we have little option but to accept the Retentionalist's interpretation of events.

Figure 26.

Extensional theorists would certainly be unwise to defend inconsistent contents of this sort, but there is another option. Why assume that the initial (stationary) flash is ever experienced as such at all? Recalling Eagleman and Sejnowski's diagnosis of the flash-lag effect, might it not be that our visual systems take some time (perhaps 80–100 msec) before producing experience in response to a given stimulus? And might they not use this time to work out a single coherent version of events before committing it to experience? Applying this to the case of the phi phenomenon – see Figure 26 – although the initial stationary flash is registered at a pre-conscious level, it never actually reaches consciousness: as soon as the second flash registers, our visual systems reach the conclusion that the likely source is a moving light, and this is what we experience. It is thus only to be expected that subjects deliver the reports they do. Until this construal of events can be ruled out, the Extensionalist has little to fear from this sort of case. [42]

Copyright © 2010 by
Barry Dainton <>

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