Supplement to Commentators on Aristotle

Andronicus of Rhodes

Andronicus of Rhodes is credited with the production of the first reliable edition of Aristotle. Nothing certain is known about his life and work.

According to the tradition, Andronicus was the eleventh successor of Aristotle as head of the Peripatos, the school that Aristotle founded in Athens (Ammonius, In De Int. 5.28–29). We have good reasons to doubt this tradition. To begin with, it is a late tradition, which does not seem to be older than Ammonius (c. 440–520 CE). Moreover, it is not a particularly strong tradition. Elsewhere Ammonius says that Boethus of Sidon was the eleventh successor of Aristotle (Ammonius, In APr. 31.12–13). Finally, it is very unlikely that the school founded by Aristotle in Athens survived the first Mithridatic War (89–84 BCE) and Sulla’s sack of Athens (84 BCE). Although this tradition is late and dubious, it cannot be dismissed altogether. Even if the school of Aristotle ceased to exist as an institution based in Athens, it continued to exist in the form of a philosophical sect (Greek: hairesis). In conclusion, although Andronicus’ alleged headship of the Peripatos cannot be established, the evidence in our possession can be taken as an indication of Andronicus’ leadership among the Peripatetic philosophers of this time.

Andronicus is said to have been the teacher of Boethus (Philoponus, In Cat. 5.18–19). Boethus’ activity can be safely dated to the second half of the 1st century BCE; most likely to the 40s. On the basis of this information, some scholars have inferred that Andronicus lived in the first half of the 1st century BCE, and that his editorial activity took place in the first half of the 1st century BCE; perhaps in the 60s (Gottshalk 1987: 1095–1096) or in the late 70s (Moraux 1973: 5–55). The problem with this inference is that it crucially depends on the tradition preserved by Philoponus (c. 490–570 CE). This tradition is neither older nor stronger than the one preserved by Ammonius. It has been argued than nothing certain was known about Andronicus by the time of Ammonius and Philoponus (Tarán 1981: 495–497). But if nothing certain was known about Andronicus in late antiquity, how can we establish the date of his edition of Aristotle? There is one line of argument that places his editorial activity in the 30s. Although Cicero was well informed about the philosophers of his time, Cicero never mentions Andronicus or his edition of Aristotle. Interestingly enough, Cicero tells us that Cratippus of Pergamum was the leading Peripatetic philosopher of his time (Cicero Off. 1.1.1–2). Cicero’s silence has led some scholars to date Andronicus’ edition of Aristotle after the death of Cicero (43 BCE), and most likely in the 30s (Düring 1957: 420–425).

Last but not least, it is not entirely clear what Andronicus edited and how he did it. His reputation as the editor of Aristotle ultimately rests on the testimony of Porphyry. Porphyry tells us that “Andronicus divided the works of Aristotle and Theophrastus into treatises, collecting related material into the same place” (Porphyry, Vita Plot., chapter 24).

For a discussion of the extant evidence about the Andronican edition and his presumed contribution to the formation of the Aristotelian corpus, see Barnes 1997: 24–44.

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