# Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Fri Feb 23, 2007; substantive revision Mon Mar 21, 2011*

Ludwig Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics is undoubtedly the most unknown and under-appreciated part of his philosophical opus. Indeed, more than half of Wittgenstein's writings from 1929 through 1944 are devoted to mathematics, a fact that Wittgenstein himself emphasized in 1944 by writing that his “chief contribution has been in the philosophy of mathematics” (Monk 1990, 466).

The core of Wittgenstein's conception of mathematics is very
much set by the *Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus* (1922;
hereafter *Tractatus*), where his main aim is to work out the
language-reality connection by determining what is required for
language, or language usage, to be *about* the world.
Wittgenstein answers this question, in part, by asserting that the only
genuine propositions that we can use to make assertions about reality
are contingent (‘empirical’) propositions, which are true
if they agree with reality and false otherwise (4.022, 4.25, 4.062,
2.222). From this it follows that all other apparent propositions
are pseudo-propositions of various types and that all other uses of
‘true’ and ‘truth’ deviate markedly from the
truth-by-correspondence (or agreement) that contingent propositions
have in relation to reality. Thus, from the *Tractatus* to
at least 1944, Wittgenstein maintains that “mathematical
propositions” are not real propositions and that
“mathematical truth” is essentially non-referential and
purely syntactical in nature. On Wittgenstein's view, we
invent mathematical calculi and we expand mathematics by calculation
and proof, and though we learn from a proof that a theorem *can*
be derived from axioms by means of certain rules in a particular way,
it is *not* the case that this proof-path pre-exists our
construction of it.

As we shall see, Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics
begins in a rudimentary way in the *Tractatus*, develops into a
finitistic constructivism in the middle period (*Philosophical
Remarks* (1929–30) and *Philosophical Grammar* (1931–33),
respectively; hereafter *PR* and *PG*, respectively), and
is further developed in new and old directions in the MSS used for
*Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics* (1937–44; hereafter
*RFM*). As Wittgenstein's substantive views on
mathematics evolve from 1918 through 1944, his writing and
philosophical *styles* evolve from the assertoric, aphoristic
style of the *Tractatus* to a clearer, argumentative style in
the middle period, to a dialectical, interlocutory style in
*RFM* and the *Philosophical Investigations* (hereafter
*PI*).

- 1. Wittgenstein on Mathematics in the
*Tractatus* - 2. The Middle Wittgenstein's Finitistic Constructivism
- 2.1 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Constructive Formalism
- 2.2 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Finitism
- 2.3 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Finitism and Algorithmic Decidability
- 2.4 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Account of Mathematical Induction and Algorithmic Decidability
- 2.5 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Account of Irrational Numbers
- 2.6 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Critique of Set Theory

- 3. The Later Wittgenstein on Mathematics: Some Preliminaries
- 3.1 Mathematics as a Human Invention
- 3.2 Wittgenstein's Later Finitistic Constructivism
- 3.3 The Later Wittgenstein on Decidability and Algorithmic Decidability
- 3.4 Wittgenstein's Later Critique of Set Theory: Non-Enumerability vs. Non-Denumerability
- 3.5 Extra-Mathematical Application as a Necessary Condition of Mathematical Meaningfulness
- 3.6 Wittgenstein on Gödel and Undecidable Mathematical Propositions

- 4. The Impact of Philosophy of Mathematics on Mathematics
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Wittgenstein on Mathematics in the *Tractatus*

Wittgenstein's non-referential, *formalist* conception
of mathematical propositions and terms begins in the
*Tractatus*.^{[1]}
Indeed, insofar as he sketches a
rudimentary Philosophy of Mathematics in the *Tractatus*, he
does so by *contrasting* mathematics and mathematical equations
with genuine (contingent) propositions, sense, thought, propositional
signs and their constituent names, and truth-by-correspondence.

In the *Tractatus*, Wittgenstein claims that a genuine
proposition, which rests upon conventions, is used by us to assert that
a state of affairs (i.e., an elementary or atomic fact;
‘Sachverhalt’) or fact (i.e., multiple states of affairs;
‘Tatsache’) obtain(s) in the one and only real world.
An elementary proposition is isomorphic to the *possible* state
of affairs it is used to represent: it must contain as many names as
there are objects in the possible state of affairs. An elementary
proposition is true *iff* its possible state of affairs (i.e.,
its ‘sense’; ‘Sinn’) obtains.
Wittgenstein clearly states this Correspondence Theory of Truth at
(4.25): “If an elementary proposition is true, the state of
affairs exists; if an elementary proposition is false, the state of
affairs does not exist.” But propositions and their
linguistic components are, in and of themselves, dead—a
proposition only has sense because we human beings have endowed it with
a *conventional* sense (5.473). Moreover, propositional
signs may be *used* to do any number of things (e.g., insult,
catch someone's attention); in order to *assert* that a
state of affairs obtains, a person must ‘project’ the
proposition's sense—its possible state of affairs—by
‘thinking’ of (e.g., picturing) its sense as one speaks,
writes or thinks the proposition (3.11). Wittgenstein connects
*use*, *sense*, *correspondence*, and
*truth* by saying that “a proposition is true if we
*use* it to say that things stand in a certain way, and they
do” (4.062; italics added).

The *Tractarian* conceptions of genuine (contingent)
propositions and the (original and) core concept of truth are used to
construct theories of logical and mathematical
‘propositions’ *by contrast*. Stated boldly
and bluntly, tautologies, contradictions and mathematical propositions
(i.e., mathematical equations) are neither true nor false—we say
that they are true or false, but in doing so we use the words
‘true’ and ‘false’ in very different senses
from the sense in which a contingent proposition is true or
false. Unlike genuine propositions, tautologies and
contradictions “have no ‘subject-matter’”
(6.124), “lack sense,” and “say nothing” about
the world (4.461), and, analogously, mathematical equations are
“pseudo-propositions” (6.2) which, when ‘true’
(‘correct’; ‘richtig’ (6.2321)), “merely
mark[…]… [the] equivalence of meaning [of ‘two
expressions’]” (6.2323). Given that
“[t]autology and contradiction are the limiting
cases—indeed the *disintegration*—of the combination
of signs” (4.466; italics added), where “the conditions of
agreement with the world—the representational
relations—cancel one another, so that [they] do[] not stand in
any representational relation to reality,” tautologies and
contradictions do not picture reality or possible states of affairs and
possible facts (4.462). Stated differently, tautologies and
contradictions do not have sense, which means we cannot use them to
make assertions, which means, in turn, that they cannot be either true
or false. Analogously, mathematical pseudo-propositions are
equations, which indicate or show that two expressions are equivalent
in meaning and therefore are intersubstitutable. Indeed, we
arrive at mathematical equations by “the method of
substitution”: “starting from a number of equations, we
advance to new equations by substituting different expressions in
accordance with the equations” (6.24). We prove
mathematical ‘propositions’ ‘true’
(‘correct’) by ‘seeing’ that two expressions
have the same meaning, which “must be manifest in the two
expressions themselves” (6.23), and by substituting one
expression for another with the same meaning. Just as “one
can recognize that [“logical propositions”] are true from
the symbol alone” (6.113), “the possibility of
proving” mathematical propositions means that we can perceive
their correctness without having to compare “what they
express” with facts (6.2321; cf. (*RFM* App. III,
§4)).

The demarcation between contingent propositions, which can be used
to correctly or incorrectly represent parts of the world, and
mathematical propositions, which can be decided in a purely formal,
syntactical manner, is maintained by Wittgenstein until his death in
1951 (*Zettel* §701, 1947; *PI* II, 2001 Ed., pp.
192–193e, 1949). Given linguistic and symbolic conventions, the
truth-value of a contingent proposition is entirely a function of how
the world is, whereas the “truth-value” of a mathematical
proposition is entirely a function of its constituent symbols and the
formal system of which it is a part. Thus, a second, closely
related way of stating this demarcation is to say that mathematical
propositions are decidable by purely formal means (e.g., calculations),
while contingent propositions, being about the ‘external’
world, can only be decided, if at all, by determining whether or not a
particular fact obtains (i.e., something external to the proposition
and the language in which it resides) (2.223; 4.05).

The Tractarian formal theory of mathematics is, specifically, a
theory of *formal* *operations*. Over the past 10
years, Wittgenstein's theory of operations has received
considerable examination [(Frascolla 1994; 1997), (Marion 1998),
(Potter 2000), and (Floyd 2002)], which has interestingly connected
it and the Tractarian equational theory of arithmetic with elements of
Alonzo Church's λ-calculus and with R. L. Goodstein's
equational calculus (Marion 1998, Chapters 1, 2, and 4). Very
briefly stated, Wittgenstein presents:

- … the sign ‘[
*a*,*x*,*O*’*x*]’ for the general term of the series of forms*a*,*O*’*a*,*O*’*O*’*a*, …. (5.2522) - … the general form of an operation
Ω’(η)
[as]
[ξ,

*N*(ξ)]’(η) (= [η, ξ,*N*(ξ)]). (6.01) - … the general form of a proposition
(“truth-function”) [as]
[
*p*, ξ,*N*(ξ)]. (6) - The general form of an integer [natural number] [as] [0, ξ, ξ + 1]. (6.03)

adding that “[t]he concept of number is… the general
form of a number” (6.022). As Frascolla (and Marion after
him) have pointed out, “the general form of a proposition is a
*particular case* of the general form of an
‘operation’” (Marion 1998, p. 21), and all three
general forms (i.e., of operation, proposition, and natural number) are
modeled on the variable presented at (5.2522) (Marion 1998, p.
22). Defining “[a]n operation [as] the expression of a
relation between the structures of its result and of its bases”
(5.22), Wittgenstein states that whereas “[a] function cannot be
its own argument,… an operation can take one of its own results
as its base” (5.251).

On Wittgenstein's (5.2522) account of ‘[*a*,
*x*, *O*’*x*]’, “the first term
of the bracketed expression is the beginning of the series of forms,
the second is the form of a term *x* arbitrarily selected from
the series, and the third [*O*’*x*] is the form of
the term that immediately follows *x* in the
series.” Given that “[t]he concept of successive
applications of an operation is equivalent to the concept ‘and so
on’” (5.2523), one can see how the natural numbers can be
generated by repeated iterations of the general form of a natural
number, namely ‘[0, ξ, ξ +1]’.
Similarly, truth-functional propositions can be generated, as Russell
says in the Introduction to the *Tractatus* (p. xv), from the
general form of a proposition
‘[*p*,
ξ,
*N*(ξ)]’
by “taking any selection of atomic
propositions [where *p* “stands for all atomic
propositions”; “the bar over the variable indicates that it
is the representative of all its values” (5.501)], negating them
all, then taking any selection of the set of propositions now obtained,
together with any of the originals [where *x* “stands for
any set of propositions”]—and so on
indefinitely.” On Frascolla's (1994, 3ff) account,
“a numerical identity “**t** =
**s**” is an arithmetical theorem if and only if the
corresponding equation “Ω^{t}’*x* =
Ω^{s}’*x*”, which is framed in the
language of the general theory of logical operations, can be
proven.” By proving ‘the equation
“Ω^{2×2}’*x* =
Ω^{4}’*x*”, which translates the arithmetic
identity “2 × 2 = 4” into the operational
language’ (6.241), Wittgenstein thereby outlines “a
translation of numerical arithmetic into a sort of general theory of
operations” (Frascolla 1998, 135).

Despite the fact that Wittgenstein clearly does *not* attempt
to reduce mathematics to logic in either Russell's manner or
Frege's manner, or to tautologies, and despite the fact that
Wittgenstein criticizes Russell's Logicism (e.g., the Theory of
Types, 3.31–3.32; the Axiom of Reducibility, 6.1232, etc.) and
Frege's Logicism (6.031, 4.1272,
etc.),^{[2]}
quite a number of commentators,
early and recent, have interpreted Wittgenstein's Tractarian
theory of mathematics as a variant of Logicism [(Quine 1940 [1981,
55]), (Benacerraf and Putnam 1964, 14), (Black 1966, 340), (Savitt
1979 [1986], 34), (Frascolla 1994, 37; 1997, 354, 356–57, 361;
1998, 133), (Marion 1998, 26 & 29), and (Potter 2000, 164 and
182–183)]. There are at least four reasons proffered for this
interpretation.

- Wittgenstein says that “[m]athematics is a method of logic” (6.234).
- Wittgenstein says that “[t]he logic of the world, which is shown in tautologies by the propositions of logic, is shown in equations by mathematics” (6.22).
- According to Wittgenstein, we
ascertain the
*truth*of*both*mathematical and logical propositions by the symbol alone (i.e., by purely formal operations), without making any (‘external,’ non-symbolic) observations of states of affairs or facts in the world. - Wittgenstein's iterative
(inductive) “interpretation of numerals as exponents of an
operation variable” is a “reduction of arithmetic to
operation theory,” where “operation” is construed as
a “
*logical*operation” (italics added) (Frascolla 1994, 37), which shows that ‘the label “no-classes logicism” tallies with the*Tractatus*view of arithmetic’ (Frascolla 1998, 133; 1997, 354).

Though at least three Logicist interpretations of the
*Tractatus* have appeared within the last 8 years, the following
considerations [(Rodych 1995), (Wrigley 1998)] indicate that none of
these reasons is particularly cogent.

For example, in saying that “[m]athematics is a method of
logic” perhaps Wittgenstein is only saying that since the general
form of a natural number and the general form of a proposition are both
instances of the general form of a (purely formal) operation, just as
truth-functional propositions can be constructed using the general form
of a proposition, (true) mathematical equations can be constructed
using the general form of a natural number. Alternatively,
Wittgenstein may mean that mathematical *inferences* (i.e., not
substitutions) are in accord with, or make use of, logical inferences,
and insofar as mathematical reasoning is logical reasoning, mathematics
is a method of logic.

Similarly, in saying that “[t]he logic of the world” is
shown by tautologies and true mathematical equations (i.e., #2),
Wittgenstein may be saying that since mathematics was invented to help
us count and measure, insofar as it enables us to infer contingent
proposition(s) from contingent proposition(s) (see 6.211 below), it
thereby *reflects* contingent facts and “[t]he logic of
the world.” Though logic—which is inherent in natural
(‘everyday’) language (4.002, 4.003, 6.124) and which has
evolved to meet our communicative, exploratory, and survival
needs—is not *invented* in the same way, a valid logical
inference captures the relationship between possible facts and a
*sound* logical inference captures the relationship between
existent facts.

As regards #3, Black, Savitt, and Frascolla have argued that, since
we ascertain the truth of tautologies and mathematical equations
without any appeal to “states of affairs” or
“facts,” true mathematical equations and tautologies are
*so* analogous that we can “aptly” describe
“the philosophy of arithmetic of the *Tractatus*…
as a kind of logicism” (Frascolla, 1994, 37). The rejoinder
to this is that the similarity that Frascolla, Black and Savitt
recognize does not make Wittgenstein's theory a “kind of
logicism” in Frege's or Russell's sense, because
Wittgenstein does not define numbers “logically” in either
Frege's way or Russell's way, and the similarity (or
analogy) between tautologies and true mathematical equations is neither
an identity nor a relation of reducibility.

Finally, critics argue that the problem with #4 is that there is no
evidence for the claim that the relevant operation is *logical*
in Wittgenstein's or Russell's or Frege's sense of
the term—it seems a purely formal, syntactical operation (Rodych
1995). “Logical operations are performed with propositions,
arithmetical ones with numbers,” says Wittgenstein (*WVC*
218); “[t]he result of a logical operation is a proposition, the
result of an arithmetical one is a number.” In sum, critics
of the Logicist interpretation of the *Tractatus* argue that
##1–4 do not individually or collectively constitute cogent grounds for
a Logicist interpretation of the *Tractatus*.

Another crucial aspect of the *Tractarian* theory of
mathematics is captured in (6.211).

Indeed in real life a mathematical proposition is never what we want. Rather, we make use of mathematical propositionsonlyin inferences from propositions that do not belong to mathematics to others that likewise do not belong to mathematics. (In philosophy the question, ‘What do we actually use this word or this proposition for?’ repeatedly leads to valuable insights.)

Though mathematics and mathematical activity are purely formal and
syntactical, in the *Tractatus* Wittgenstein tacitly
distinguishes between purely formal games with signs, which have no
application in contingent propositions, and mathematical propositions,
which are used to make inferences from contingent proposition(s) to
contingent proposition(s). Wittgenstein does not explicitly say,
however, *how* mathematical equations, which are *not*
genuine propositions, are used in inferences from genuine
proposition(s) to genuine proposition(s) [(Floyd 2002, 309), (Kremer
2002, 293–94)]. As we shall see in §3.5, the later
Wittgenstein returns to the importance of extra-mathematical
application and uses it to distinguish a mere “sign-game”
from a genuine, mathematical language-game.

This, in brief, is Wittgenstein's Tractarian theory of
mathematics. In the Introduction to the *Tractatus*,
Russell wrote that Wittgenstein's “theory of number”
“stands in need of greater technical development,”
primarily because Wittgenstein had not shown how it could deal with
transfinite numbers (Wittgenstein 1922, xx). Similarly, in his
review of the *Tractatus*, Frank Ramsey wrote that
Wittgenstein's ‘account’ does not cover all of
mathematics partly because Wittgenstein's theory of equations
cannot explain inequalities (Ramsey 1923, 475). Though it is
doubtful that, in 1923, Wittgenstein would have thought these issues
problematic, it certainly is true that the Tractarian theory of
mathematics is essentially a sketch, especially in comparison with what
Wittgenstein begins to develop six years later.

After the completion of the *Tractatus* in 1918, Wittgenstein
did virtually no philosophical work until February 2, 1929, eleven
months after attending a lecture by the Dutch mathematician L.E.J.
Brouwer.

## 2. The Middle Wittgenstein's Finitistic Constructivism

There is little doubt that Wittgenstein was invigorated by L.E.J. Brouwer's March 10, 1928 Vienna lecture “Science, Mathematics, and Language” (Brouwer 1929), which he attended with F. Waismann and H. Feigl, but it is a gross overstatement to say that he returned to Philosophy because of this lecture or that his intermediate interest in the Philosophy of Mathematics issued primarily from Brouwer's influence. In fact, Wittgenstein's return to Philosophy and his intermediate work on mathematics is also due to conversations with Ramsey and members of the Vienna circle, to Wittgenstein's disagreement with Ramsey over identity, and several other factors.

Though Wittgenstein seems not to have read any Hilbert or Brouwer
prior to the completion of the *Tractatus*, by early 1929
Wittgenstein had certainly read work by Brouwer, Weyl, Skolem, Ramsey
(and possibly Hilbert) and, apparently, he had had one or more private
discussions with Brouwer in 1928 [(Le Roy Finch 1977, 260), (Van Dalen
2005, 566–567)]. Thus, the rudimentary treatment of mathematics
in the *Tractatus*, whose principal influences were Russell and
Frege, was succeeded by detailed work on mathematics in the middle
period (1929–1933), which was strongly influenced by the 1920s work of
Brouwer, Weyl, Hilbert, and Skolem.

### 2.1 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Constructive Formalism

To best understand Wittgenstein's intermediate Philosophy of
Mathematics, one must fully appreciate his strong variant of formalism,
according to which “[w]e *make* mathematics”
(*WVC* 34, Ft. #1; *PR* §159) by inventing purely
formal mathematical calculi, with ‘stipulated’ axioms
(*PR* §202), syntactical rules of transformation, and
decision procedures that enable us to invent “mathematical
truth” and “mathematical falsity” by algorithmically
deciding so-called mathematical ‘propositions’ (*PR*
§§122, 162).

The *core idea* of Wittgenstein's formalism from 1929
(if not 1918) through 1944 is that mathematics is essentially
syntactical, devoid of reference and semantics. The most obvious
aspect of this view, which has been noted by numerous commentators who
do not refer to Wittgenstein as a ‘formalist’ [(Kielkopf
1970, 360–38), (Klenk 1976, 5, 8, 9), (Fogelin 1968, 267), (Frascolla
1994, 40), (Marion 1998, 13–14)], is that, *contra Platonism*,
the signs and propositions of a mathematical calculus do not
*refer* to anything. As Wittgenstein says at (*WVC*
34, Ft. #1), “[n]umbers are not represented by proxies; numbers
*are there*.” This means not only that numbers are
there in the *use*, it means that the numerals *are* the
numbers, for “[a]rithmetic doesn't talk about numbers, it
works with numbers” (*PR* §109).

What arithmetic is concerned with is the schema | | | |.—But does arithmetic talk about the lines I draw with pencil on paper?—Arithmetic doesn't talk about the lines, itoperateswith them. (PG333)

In a similar vein, Wittgenstein says that (*WVC* 106)
“mathematics is always a machine, a calculus” and
“[a] calculus is an abacus, a calculator, a calculating
machine,” which “works by means of strokes, numerals,
etc.” The “justified side of formalism,”
according to Wittgenstein (*WVC* 105), is that mathematical
symbols “lack a meaning” (i.e.,
‘Bedeutung’)—they do not “go proxy for”
*things* which are “their meaning[s].”

You could say arithmetic is a kind of geometry; i.e. what in geometry are constructions on paper, in arithmetic are calculations (on paper).—You could say it is a more general kind of geometry. (PR§109;PR§111)

This is the core of Wittgenstein's life-long formalism.
When we prove a theorem or decide a proposition, we operate in a
*purely formal*, syntactical manner. In *doing*
mathematics, we do not discover pre-existing truths that were
“already there without one knowing” (*PG*
481)—we *invent* mathematics, bit-by-little-bit.
“If you want to know what 2 + 2 = 4 means,” says
Wittgenstein, “you have to ask how we work it out,” because
“we consider the process of calculation as the essential
thing” (*PG* 333). Hence, the only meaning (i.e.,
sense) that a mathematical proposition has is *intra-systemic*
meaning, which is wholly determined by its syntactical relations to
other propositions of the calculus.

A second important aspect of the intermediate Wittgenstein's
strong formalism is his view that extra-mathematical application
(and/or reference) is *not* a necessary condition of a
mathematical calculus. Mathematical calculi *do not
require* extra-mathematical applications, Wittgenstein argues,
since we “can develop arithmetic completely autonomously and its
application takes care of itself since wherever it's applicable
we may also apply it” (*PR* §109; cf. *PG*
308, *WVC* 104).

As we shall shortly see, the middle Wittgenstein is also drawn to
strong formalism by a new concern with questions of
*decidability*. Undoubtedly influenced by the writings of
Brouwer and David Hilbert, Wittgenstein uses strong formalism to forge
a new connection between mathematical meaningfulness and algorithmic
decidability.

An equation is a rule of syntax. Doesn't that explain why we cannot have questions in mathematics that are in principle unanswerable? For if the rules of syntax cannot be grasped, they’re of no use at all…. [This] makes intelligible the attempts of the formalist to see mathematics as a game with signs. (PR§121)

In Section 2.3, we shall see how Wittgenstein goes beyond both Hilbert
and Brouwer by *maintaining* the Law of the Excluded Middle in
a way that restricts mathematical propositions to expressions that are
algorithmically decidable.

### 2.2 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Finitism

The single most important difference between the Early and Middle
Wittgenstein is that, in the middle period, Wittgenstein rejects
quantification over an infinite mathematical domain, stating that,
contra his *Tractarian* view, such ‘propositions’
are not infinite conjunctions and infinite disjunctions simply because
there are no such things.

Wittgenstein's *principal reasons* for developing a
finitistic Philosophy of Mathematics are as follows.

- Mathematics as Human Invention: According to the middle Wittgenstein, we invent mathematics, from which it follows that mathematics and so-called mathematical objects do not exist independently of our inventions. Whatever is mathematical is fundamentally a product of human activity.
- Mathematical Calculi Consist
Exclusively of Intensions and Extensions: Given that we have invented
only mathematical extensions (e.g., symbols, finite sets, finite
sequences, propositions, axioms) and mathematical intensions (e.g.,
rules of inference and transformation, irrational numbers
*as*rules), these extensions and intensions, and the calculi in which they reside, constitute the entirety of mathematics. (It should be noted that Wittgenstein's usage of ‘extension’ and ‘intension’ as regards mathematics differs markedly from standard contemporary usage, wherein the extension of a predicate is the set of entities that satisfy the predicate and the intension of a predicate is the meaning of, or expressed by, the predicate. Put succinctly, Wittgenstein thinks that the extension of this notion of concept-and-extension from the domain of existent (i.e., physical) objects to the so-called domain of “mathematical objects” is based on a faulty analogy and engenders conceptual confusion. See #1 just below.)

These two reasons have at least five immediate *consequences*
for Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics.

- Rejection of Infinite Mathematical
Extensions: Given that a mathematical extension is a symbol
(‘sign’) or a finite concatenation of symbols
*extended*in space, there is a categorical difference between mathematical intensions and (finite) mathematical extensions, from which it follows that “the mathematical infinite” resides only in recursive rules (i.e., intensions). An infinite mathematical extension (i.e., a*completed*, infinite mathematical extension) is a contradiction-in-terms - Rejection of Unbounded Quantification in Mathematics: Given that the mathematical infinite can only be a recursive rule, and given that a mathematical proposition must have sense, it follows that there cannot be an infinite mathematical proposition (i.e., an infinite logical product or an infinite logical sum).
- Algorithmic Decidability vs.
Undecidability: If mathematical extensions of all kinds are necessarily
*finite*, then,*in principle*, all mathematical propositions are*algorithmically decidable*, from which it follows that an “undecidable mathematical proposition” is a contradiction-in-terms. Moreover, since mathematics is essentially what we have and what we know, Wittgenstein restricts algorithmic decidability to*knowing*how to decide a proposition with a known decision procedure. - Anti-Foundationalist Account of Real Numbers: Since there are no infinite mathematical extensions, irrational numbers are rules, not extensions. Given that an infinite set is a recursive rule (or an induction) and no such rule can generate all of the things mathematicians call (or want to call) “real numbers,” it follows that there is no set of ‘all’ the real numbers and no such thing as the mathematical continuum.
- Rejection of Different Infinite Cardinalities: Given the non-existence of infinite mathematical extensions, Wittgenstein rejects the standard interpretation of Cantor's diagonal proof as a proof of infinite sets of greater and lesser cardinalities.

Since we invent mathematics *in its entirety*, we do not
discover pre-existing mathematical objects or facts or that
mathematical objects have certain properties, for “one cannot
discover any connection between parts of mathematics or logic that was
already there without one knowing” (*PG* 481). In
examining mathematics as a purely human invention, Wittgenstein tries
to determine what exactly we have invented and why exactly, in his
opinion, we erroneously think that there are infinite mathematical
extensions.

If, first, we examine what we have invented, we see that we have
invented formal calculi consisting of finite extensions and intensional
rules. If, more importantly, we endeavour to determine
*why* we believe that infinite mathematical extensions exist
(e.g., why we believe that the actual infinite is intrinsic to
mathematics), we find that we conflate mathematical *intensions*
and mathematical *extensions*, erroneously thinking that there
is “a dualism” of “the law and the infinite series
obeying it” (*PR* §180). For instance, we think
that because a real number “endlessly yields the places of a
decimal fraction” (*PR* §186), it *is*
“a totality” (*WVC* 81–82, Ft. #1), when, in
reality, “[a]n irrational number isn't the extension of an
infinite decimal fraction,… it's a law” (*PR*
§181) which “yields extensions” (*PR*
§186). A law and a list are fundamentally different; neither
can ‘give’ what the other gives (*WVC*
102–103). Indeed, “the mistake in the set-theoretical
approach consists time and again in treating laws and enumerations
(lists) as essentially the same kind of thing” (*PG*
461).

Closely related with this conflation of intensions and extensions is
the fact that we mistakenly act as if the word ‘infinite’
is a “number word,” because in ordinary discourse we answer
the question “how many?” with both (*PG* 463; cf.
*PR* §142). But “‘[i]nfinite’ is
not a *quantity*,” Wittgenstein insists (*WVC*
228); the word ‘infinite’ and a number word like
‘five’ do not have the same syntax. The words
‘finite’ and ‘infinite’ do not function as
adjectives on the words ‘class’ or ‘set,’
(*WVC* 102), for the terms “finite class” and
“infinite class” use ‘class’ in completely
different ways (*WVC* 228). An infinite class is a
recursive rule or “an induction,” whereas the symbol for a
finite class is a list or extension (*PG* 461). It is
because an induction has much in common with the multiplicity of a
finite class that we erroneously call it an infinite class (*PR*
§158).

In sum, because a mathematical extension is necessarily a finite
sequence of symbols, an infinite mathematical extension is a
contradiction-in-terms. This is the foundation of
Wittgenstein's finitism. Thus, when we say, e.g., that
“there are infinitely many even numbers,” we are
*not* saying “there are an infinite number of even
numbers” in *the same sense* as we can say “there
are 27 people in this house”; the infinite series of natural
numbers is nothing but “the infinite possibility of finite series
of numbers”—“[i]t is senseless to speak of the
*whole* infinite number series, as if it, too, were an
extension” (*PR* §144). The infinite is
understood rightly when it is understood, not as a quantity, but as an
“infinite possibility” (*PR* §138).

Given Wittgenstein's rejection of infinite mathematical extensions, he adopts finitistic, constructive views on mathematical quantification, mathematical decidability, the nature of real numbers, and Cantor's diagonal proof of the existence of infinite sets of greater cardinalities.

Since a mathematical set is a finite extension, we cannot
*meaningfully* quantify over an infinite mathematical domain,
simply because there is no such thing as an infinite mathematical
domain (i.e., totality, set), and, derivatively, no such things as
infinite conjunctions or disjunctions [(Moore 1955, 2–3); cf.
(*AWL* 6) and (*PG* 281)].

[I]t still looks now as if the quantifiers make no sense for numbers. I mean: you can't say ‘(n) φn’, precisely because ‘all natural numbers’ isn't a bounded concept. But then neither should one say a general proposition follows from a proposition about the nature of number.But in that case it seems to me that we can't use generality—all, etc.—in mathematics at all. There's no such thing as ‘all numbers’, simply because there are infinitely many. (

PR§126;PR§129)

‘Extensionalists’ who assert that
“ε(0).ε(1).ε(2) and so
on” is an infinite logical product (*PG* 452) assume or
assert that finite and infinite conjunctions are close
cousins—that the fact that we cannot write down or enumerate all
of the conjuncts ‘contained’ in an infinite conjunction is
only a “human weakness,” for God could surely do so and
God could surely survey such a conjunction in a single glance and
determine its truth-value. According to Wittgenstein, however, this is
*not* a matter of *human* limitation. Because we
mistakenly think that “an infinite conjunction” is similar
to “an enormous conjunction,” we erroneously reason that
just as we cannot determine the truth-value of an enormous conjunction
because we don't have enough time, we similarly cannot, due to
human limitations, determine the truth-value of an infinite
conjunction (or disjunction). But the difference here is not one of
degree but of kind: “in the sense in which it is impossible to
check an infinite number of propositions it is also impossible to try
to do so” (*PG* 452). This applies, according to
Wittgenstein, to human beings, but more importantly, it applies also
to God (i.e., an omniscient being), for even God cannot write down or
survey infinitely many propositions because for him too the series is
never-ending or limitless and hence the ‘task’ is not a
genuine task because it cannot, *in principle*, be done (i.e.,
“infinitely many” is not a number word). As Wittgenstein
says at (*PR* 128; cf. *PG* 479): “‘Can God
know all the places of the expansion of π?’ would have been a
good question for the schoolmen to ask,” for the question is
strictly ‘senseless.’ As we shall shortly see, on
Wittgenstein's account, “[a] statement about *all*
numbers is not represented by means of a proposition, but by means of
induction” (*WVC* 82).

Similarly, there is no such thing as a mathematical proposition
about *some* number—no such thing as a mathematical
proposition that existentially quantifies over an infinite domain
(*PR* §173).

What is the meaning of such a mathematical proposition as ‘(∃n) 4 +n= 7’? It might be a disjunction — (4 + 0 = 7) ∨ (4 + 1 = 7) ∨ etc.ad inf.But what does that mean? I can understand a proposition with a beginning and an end. But can one also understand a proposition with no end? (PR§127)

We are particularly seduced by the feeling or belief that an
infinite *mathematical* disjunction makes good sense in the case
where we can provide a recursive rule for generating each next member
of an infinite sequence. For example, when we say “There
exists an odd perfect number” we are asserting that, in the
infinite sequence of odd numbers, there is (at least) one odd number
that is perfect—we are asserting ‘φ(1)
∨
φ(3)
∨
φ(5)
∨
and so on’ and we know what would make it
true and what would make it false (*PG* 451). The mistake
here made, according to Wittgenstein (*PG* 451), is that we are
implicitly ‘*comparing* the proposition
“(∃n)…” with the proposition… “There
are two foreign words on this page”,’ which doesn't
provide the grammar of the former ‘proposition,’ but only
indicates an analogy in their respective rules.

On Wittgenstein's intermediate finitism, an expression
quantifying over an infinite domain is *never* a meaningful
proposition, not even when we have proved, for instance, that a
particular number *n* has a particular property.

The important point is that, even in the case where I am given that 3^{2}+ 4^{2}= 5^{2}, I oughtnotto say ‘(∃x,y,z,n) (x), since taken extensionally that's meaningless, and taken intensionally this doesn't provide a proof of it. No, in this case I ought to express only the first equation. (^{n}+ y^{n}= z^{n}PR§150)

Thus, Wittgenstein adopts the radical position that *all*
expressions that quantify over an infinite domain, whether
‘conjectures’ (e.g., Goldbach's Conjecture, the Twin
Prime Conjecture) or “proved general theorems” (e.g.,
“Euclid's Prime Number Theorem,” the Fundamental
Theorem of Algebra), are *meaningless* (i.e.,
‘senseless’; ‘sinnlos’) expressions as opposed
to “genuine mathematical *proposition*[s]”
(*PR* §168). These expressions are not (meaningful)
mathematical propositions, according to Wittgenstein, because the Law
of the Excluded Middle does not apply, which means that “we
aren't dealing with propositions of mathematics”
(*PR* §151). The crucial question *why* and in
exactly what sense the Law of the Excluded Middle does not apply to
such expressions will be answered in the next section.

### 2.3 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Finitism and Algorithmic Decidability

The middle Wittgenstein has other grounds for rejecting unrestricted quantification in mathematics, for on his idiosyncratic account, we must distinguish between four categories of concatenations of mathematical symbols.

- Proved mathematical propositions in a particular mathematical calculus (no need for “mathematical truth”).
- Refuted mathematical propositions in (or of) a particular mathematical calculus (no need for “mathematical falsity”).
- Mathematical propositions for which
we know we have in hand an applicable and effective decision procedure
(i.e., we know
*how*to decide them). - Concatenations of symbols that are not part of any mathematical calculus and which, for that reason, are not mathematical propositions (i.e., are non-propositions).

In his (van Atten 2004, 18), Mark van Atten says that “[i]ntuitionistically, there are four [“possibilities for a proposition with respect to truth”]:

*p*has been experienced as true*p*has been experienced as false- Neither 1 nor 2 has occurred yet,
but we know a procedure to decide
*p*(i.e., a procedure that will prove*p*or prove ¬*p*) - Neither 1 nor 2 has occurred yet,
and we do not know a procedure to decide
*p*.”

What is immediately striking about Wittgenstein's ##1–3 and Brouwer's ##1–3 [(Brouwer 1955, 114), (Brouwer 1981, 92)] is the enormous similarity. And yet, for all of the agreement, the disagreement in #4 is absolutely crucial.

As radical as the respective #3s are, Brouwer and Wittgenstein agree
that an undecided *φ* is a mathematical proposition (for
Wittgenstein, *of* a particular mathematical calculus) if we
know of an applicable decision procedure. They also agree that
until *φ* is decided, it is neither true nor false (though, for
Wittgenstein, ‘true’ means no more than “proved in
calculus Γ”). What they disagree about is the status of an
ordinary mathematical conjecture, such as Goldbach's
Conjecture. Brouwer admits it as a mathematical proposition,
while Wittgenstein rejects it because we do not know how to
algorithmically decide it. Like Brouwer (1948 [1983, 90]),
Wittgenstein holds that there are no “unknown truth[s]” in
mathematics, but unlike Brouwer he denies the existence of
“undecidable propositions” on the grounds that such a
‘proposition’ would have no ‘sense,’ “and
the consequence of this is precisely that the propositions of logic
lose their validity for it” (*PR* §173). In
particular, if there *are* undecidable mathematical propositions
(as Brouwer maintains), then at least some mathematical propositions
are not propositions of *any existent* mathematical
calculus. For Wittgenstein, however, it is a defining feature of
a mathematical proposition that it is either decided or decidable by a
known decision procedure *in a mathematical calculus*. As
Wittgenstein says at (*PR* §151), “where the law of
the excluded middle doesn't apply, no other law of logic applies
either, because in that case we aren't dealing with propositions
of mathematics. (Against Weyl and Brouwer).” The point here
is *not* that we need truth and falsity in mathematics—we
don't—but rather that every mathematical proposition
(including ones for which an applicable decision procedure is known) is
*known* to be part of a mathematical calculus.

To maintain this position, Wittgenstein distinguishes between
(meaningful, genuine) mathematical propositions, which have
mathematical sense, and meaningless, senseless (‘sinnlos’)
expressions by stipulating that an expression is a meaningful (genuine)
proposition of a mathematical calculus *iff* we *know* of
a proof, a refutation, or an applicable decision procedure
[(*PR* §151), (*PG* 452), (*PG* 366),
(*AWL* 199–200)]. “Only where there's a method
of solution [a “logical method for finding a solution”] is
there a [mathematical] problem,” he tells us (*PR*
§§149, 152; *PG* 393). “We may only put a
question in mathematics (or make a conjecture),” he adds
(*PR* §151), “where the answer runs: ‘I must
work it out’.”

At (*PG* 468), Wittgenstein emphasizes the importance of
algorithmic decidability clearly and emphatically: “In
mathematics *everything* is algorithm and *nothing* is
meaning [‘Bedeutung’]; even when it doesn't look like
that because we seem to be using *words* to talk *about*
mathematical things. Even these words are used to construct an
algorithm.” When, therefore, Wittgenstein says (*PG*
368) that if “[the Law of the Excluded Middle] is supposed not to
hold, we have altered the concept of proposition,” he means that
an expression is only a meaningful mathematical proposition if we
*know* of an applicable decision procedure for deciding it
(*PG* 400). If a genuine mathematical proposition is
*undecided*, the Law of the Excluded Middle holds in the sense
that we *know* that we will *prove or refute* the
proposition by applying an applicable decision procedure (*PG*
379, 387).

For Wittgenstein, there simply is no distinction between syntax and
semantics in mathematics: everything is syntax. If we wish to
demarcate between “mathematical propositions” versus
“mathematical pseudo-propositions,” as we do, then the
*only* way to ensure that there is no such thing as a
meaningful, but *undecidable* (e.g., independent), proposition
of a given calculus is to stipulate that an expression is only a
meaningful proposition *in* a given calculus (*PR*
§153) if either it has been decided or we *know* of an
applicable decision procedure. In this manner, Wittgenstein
defines *both* a mathematical calculus *and* a
mathematical proposition in *epistemic* terms. A calculus
is defined in terms of stipulations [(*PR* §202),
(*PG* 369)], *known* rules of operation, and
*known* decision procedures, and an expression is only a
mathematical proposition *in* a given calculus (*PR*
§155), and only if that calculus *contains* (*PG*
379) a known (and applicable) decision procedure, for “you cannot
have a logical plan of search for a *sense* you don't
know” (*PR* §148).

Thus, the middle Wittgenstein rejects undecidable mathematical
propositions on *two* grounds. First, number-theoretic
expressions that quantify over an infinite domain are not
algorithmically decidable, and hence are not meaningful mathematical
propositions.

If someone says (as Brouwer does) that for (x)f_{1}x=f_{2}x, there is, as well as yes and no, also the case of undecidability, this implies that ‘(x)…’ is meant extensionally and we may talk of the case in which allxhappen to have a property. In truth, however, it's impossible to talk of such a case at all and the ‘(x)…’ in arithmetic cannot be taken extensionally. (PR§174)

“Undecidability,” says Wittgenstein (*PR*
§174) “presupposes… that the bridge *cannot*
be made with symbols,” when, in fact, “[a] connection
between symbols which exists but cannot be represented by symbolic
transformations is a thought that cannot be thought,” for
“[i]f the connection is there,… it must be possible to see
it.” Alluding to algorithmic decidability, Wittgenstein
stresses (*PR* §174) that “[w]e can assert anything
which can be *checked in practice*,” because
“it's a question of the *possibility of
checking*” [italics added].

Wittgenstein's second reason for rejecting an undecidable
mathematical proposition is that it is a
*contradiction-in-terms*. There cannot be
“undecidable propositions,” Wittgenstein argues
(*PR* §173), because an expression that is not decidable in
some *actual* calculus is simply not a *mathematical*
proposition, since “every proposition in mathematics must belong
to a calculus of mathematics” (*PG* 376).

This radical position on decidability results in various radical and
counter-intuitive statements about unrestricted mathematical
quantification, mathematical induction, and, especially, the
*sense* of a newly proved mathematical proposition. In
particular, Wittgenstein asserts that uncontroversial mathematical
conjectures, such as Goldbach's Conjecture (hereafter
‘GC’) and the erstwhile conjecture “Fermat's
Last Theorem” (hereafter ‘FLT’), have no sense (or,
perhaps, no *determinate* sense) and that the
*unsystematic* proof of such a conjecture gives it a sense that
it didn't previously have (*PG* 374) because
“it's unintelligible that I should admit, when I've got the
proof, that it's a proof of precisely *this* proposition,
or of the induction meant by this proposition” (*PR*
§155).

Thus Fermat's [Last Theorem] makes nosenseuntil I cansearchfor a solution to the equation in cardinal numbers. And ‘search’ must always mean: search systematically. Meandering about in infinite space on the look-out for a gold ring is no kind of search. (PR§150)I say: the so-called ‘Fermat's Last Theorem’ isn't a proposition. (Not even in the sense of a proposition of arithmetic.) Rather, it corresponds to an induction. (

PR§189)

To see how Fermat's Last Theorem isn't a proposition and
how it *might* correspond to an induction, we need to examine
Wittgenstein's account of mathematical induction.

### 2.4 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Account of Mathematical Induction and Algorithmic Decidability

Given that one cannot quantify over an infinite mathematical domain,
the question arises: What, if anything, does *any*
number-theoretic proof by mathematical induction actually
*prove*?

On the standard view, a proof by mathematical induction has the following paradigmatic form.

Inductive Base:φ(1) Inductive Step:∀ n(φ(n) → φ(n+ 1))Conclusion:∀ nφ(n)

If, however, “∀*n*φ(*n*)” is
*not* a meaningful (genuine) mathematical proposition, what are
we to make of this proof?

Wittgenstein's initial answer to this question is decidedly
enigmatic. “An induction is the expression for arithmetical
generality,” but “induction isn't itself a
proposition” (*PR* §129).

We are not saying that whenf(1) holds and whenf(c+ 1) follows fromf(c), the propositionf(x) isthereforetrue of all cardinal numbers: but: “the propositionf(x) holds for all cardinal numbers”means“it holds forx= 1, andf(c+ 1) follows fromf(c)”. (PG406)

In a proof by mathematical induction, we do no actually prove the
‘proposition’ [e.g., ∀*n*φ(*n*)] that is
customarily construed as the *conclusion* of the proof
(*PG* 406, 374; *PR* §164), rather this
pseudo-proposition or ‘statement’ stands
‘proxy’ for the “infinite possibility” (i.e.,
“the induction”) that we come to ‘*see*’
by means of the proof (*WVC* 135). “I want to
say,” Wittgenstein concludes, that “once you’ve got
the induction, it's all over” (*PG* 407).
Thus, on Wittgenstein's account, a particular proof by
mathematical induction should be understood in the following way.

Inductive Base:φ(1) Inductive Step:φ( n) → φ(n+ 1)Proxy Statement:φ( m)

Here the ‘conclusion’ of an inductive proof [i.e.,
“what is to be proved” (*PR* §164)] uses
‘*m*’ rather than ‘*n*’ to
indicate that ‘*m*’ stands for any
*particular* number, while ‘*n*’ stands for
any *arbitrary* number. For Wittgenstein, the *proxy
statement* “φ(*m*)” is *not* a
mathematical proposition that “assert[s] its generality”
(*PR* §168), it is an *eliminable*
pseudo-proposition standing proxy for the proved inductive base and
inductive step. Though an inductive proof *cannot*
*prove* “the infinite possibility of application”
(*PR* §163), it enables us “to
*perceive*” that a *direct* proof of any
*particular* proposition can be constructed (*PR*
§165). For example, once we have proved “φ(1)”
and “φ(*n*) → φ(*n* + 1),” we need not
reiterate *modus ponens* *m* − 1 times to prove the
particular proposition “φ(*m*)” (*PR*
§164). The direct proof of, say, “φ(714)” (i.e.,
without 713 iterations of *modus ponens*) “cannot have a
still better proof, say, by my carrying out the derivation as far as
this proposition itself” (*PR* §165).

A second, very important impetus for Wittgenstein's radically
constructivist position on mathematical induction is his rejection of
an *undecidable* mathematical proposition.

In discussions of the provability of mathematical propositions it is sometimes said that there are substantial propositions of mathematics whose truth or falsehood must remain undecided. What the people who say that don't realize is that such propositions,ifwe can use them and want to call them “propositions”, are not at all the same as what are called “propositions” in other cases; because a proof alters the grammar of a proposition. (PG367)

In this passage, Wittgenstein is alluding to Brouwer, who, as early
as 1907 and 1908, states, first, that “the question of the
validity of the principium tertii exclusi is equivalent to the question
*whether unsolvable mathematical problems exist*,” second,
that “[t]here is not a shred of a proof for the
conviction… that there exist no unsolvable mathematical
problems,” and, third, that there are meaningful
propositions/‘questions,’ such as “*Do there occur
in the decimal expansion of* *π* *infinitely many pairs
of consecutive equal digits*?”, to which the Law of the
Excluded Middle does not apply *because* “it must be
considered as uncertain whether problems like [this] are
solvable” (Brouwer, 1908 [1975, 109–110]). ‘A
fortiori it is not certain that any mathematical problem can either be
solved or proved to be unsolvable,’ Brouwer says (1907 [1975,
79]), ‘though HILBERT, in “Mathematische Probleme”,
believes that every mathematician is deeply convinced of it.’

Wittgenstein takes the same data and, in a way, draws the opposite
conclusion. If, as Brouwer says, we are *uncertain*
whether all or some “mathematical problems” are solvable,
then we *know* that we do *not* have in hand an
applicable decision procedure, which means that the alleged
mathematical propositions are *not decidable*, here and now.
“What ‘mathematical questions’ share with
genuine questions,” Wittgenstein says (*PR* §151),
“is simply that they can be answered.” This means
that if we do not know how to decide an expression, then we do not know
how to *make* it either proved (true) or refuted (false), which
means that the Law of the Excluded Middle “doesn't
apply” and, therefore, that our expression is *not* a
mathematical proposition.

Together, Wittgenstein's finitism and his criterion of
algorithmic decidability shed considerable light on his highly
controversial remarks about putatively *meaningful* conjectures
such as FLT and GC. GC is not a mathematical proposition because
we do not *know* *how* to decide it, and if someone like
G. H. Hardy says that he ‘believes’ GC is true (*PG*
381; *LFM* 123; *PI* §578), we must answer that s/he
only “has a hunch about the possibilities of extension of the
present system” (*LFM* 139)—that one can only
*believe* such an expression is ‘correct’ if one
knows *how* to prove it. The only sense in which GC (or
FLT) can be proved is that it can “correspond to a *proof*
by induction,” which means that the unproved inductive step
(e.g., “*G*(*n*) → *G*(*n* + 1)”) and the
expression “∀*n**G*(*n*)” are not mathematical
propositions because we have no algorithmic means of looking for an
induction (*PG* 367). A “general proposition”
is senseless prior to an inductive proof “because the question
would only have made sense if a general method of decision had been
known *before* the particular proof was discovered”
(*PG* 402). Unproved ‘inductions’ or inductive
steps are not meaningful propositions because the Law of the Excluded
Middle does not hold in the sense that we do not know of a decision
procedure by means of which we can prove or refute the expression
(*PG* 400; *WVC* 82).

This position, however, seems to rob us of any reason to search for
a ‘decision’ of a meaningless ‘expression’ such
as GC. The intermediate Wittgenstein says only that “[a]
mathematician is… guided by… certain analogies with the
previous system” and that there is nothing “wrong or
illegitimate if anyone concerns himself with Fermat's Last
Theorem” (*WVC* 144).

If e.g. I have a method for looking at integers that satisfy the equationx^{2}+y^{2}=z^{2}, then the formulax^{n}+y^{n}=z^{n}may stimulate me. I may let a formula stimulate me. Thus I shall say, Here there is astimulus—but not aquestion. Mathematical problems are always such stimuli. (WVC144, Jan. 1, 1931)

More specifically, a mathematician may let a senseless conjecture
such as FLT stimulate her/him if s/he wishes to know whether a calculus
can be extended without altering its axioms or rules (*LFM*
139).

What is here going [o]n [in an attempt to decide GC] is an unsystematic attempt at constructing a calculus. If the attempt is successful, I shall again have a calculus in front of me,only a different one from the calculus I have been using so far. [italics added] (WVC174–75; Sept. 21, 1931)

If, e.g., we succeed in proving GC by mathematical induction (i.e., we
prove “*G*(1)” and “*G*(*n*)
→ *G*(*n* + 1)”), we will then have a proof
of the inductive step, but since the inductive step was not
algorithmically decidable beforehand [(*PR* §§148,
155, 157), (*PG* 380)], in constructing the proof we have
constructed a *new* calculus, a new *calculating
machine* (*WVC* 106) in which we *now* *know*
*how* to use this new “machine-part” (*RFM*
VI, §13) (i.e., the unsystematically proved inductive
step). Before the proof, the inductive step is not a mathematical
proposition with sense (in a particular calculus), whereas after the
proof the inductive step *is* a mathematical proposition, with
a new, determinate sense, in a newly created calculus. This
demarcation of expressions without mathematical sense and proved or
refuted propositions, each with a determinate sense in a particular
calculus, is a view that Wittgenstein articulates in myriad different
ways from 1929 through 1944.

Whether or not it is ultimately defensible—and this is an
absolutely crucial question for Wittgenstein's Philosophy of
Mathematics—this strongly counter-intuitive aspect of
Wittgenstein's account of algorithmic decidability, proof, and
the *sense* of a mathematical proposition is a piece with his
rejection of *predeterminacy* in mathematics. Even in the
case where we algorithmically decide a mathematical proposition, the
connections thereby made do not pre-exist the algorithmic decision,
which means that even when we have a “mathematical
question” that we decide by decision procedure, the expression
only has a determinate sense *qua* proposition when it is
decided. On Wittgenstein's account, both middle and later,
“[a] new proof gives the proposition a place in a new
system” (*RFM* VI, §13), it “locates it in the
whole system of calculations,” though it “does not mention,
certainly does not describe, the whole system of calculation that
stands behind the proposition and gives it sense” (*RFM*
VI, §11).

Wittgenstein's unorthodox position here is a type of
structuralism that partially results from his rejection of mathematical
semantics. We erroneously think, e.g., that GC has a fully
determinate sense because, given “the misleading way in which the
mode of expression of word-language represents the sense of
mathematical propositions” (*PG* 375), we call to mind
false pictures and mistaken, *referential* conceptions of
mathematical propositions whereby GC is *about* a mathematical
reality and so has just a determinate sense as “There exist
intelligent beings elsewhere in the universe” (i.e., a
proposition that *is* determinately true or false, whether or
not we ever know its truth-value). Wittgenstein breaks with this
tradition, in *all* of its forms, stressing that, in
mathematics, unlike the realm of contingent (or empirical)
propositions, “if I am to know what a proposition like
Fermat's last theorem says,” I must know its
*criterion* of truth. Unlike the criterion of truth for an
empirical proposition, which can be known *before* the
proposition is decided, we cannot know the criterion of truth for an
undecided mathematical proposition, though we are “acquainted
with criteria for the truth of *similar* propositions”
(*RFM* VI, §13).

### 2.5 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Account of Irrational Numbers

The intermediate Wittgenstein spends a great deal of time wrestling with real and irrational numbers. There are two distinct reasons for this.

First, the *real* reason many of us are unwilling to abandon
the notion of the actual infinite in mathematics is the prevalent
conception of an irrational number as a *necessarily* infinite
extension. ‘The confusion in the concept of the
“actual infinite” *arises*’ [italics added],
says Wittgenstein (*PG* 471), ‘from the unclear concept of
irrational number, that is, from the fact that logically very different
things are called “irrational numbers” without any clear
limit being given to the concept.’

Second, and more fundamentally, the intermediate Wittgenstein
wrestles with irrationals in such detail because he opposes
foundationalism and especially its concept of a “gapless
*mathematical* continuum,” its concept of a
*comprehensive* theory of the real numbers (Han 2010), and set theoretical
conceptions and ‘proofs’ as a foundation for arithmetic,
real number theory, and mathematics as a whole. Indeed,
Wittgenstein's discussion of irrationals is one with his critique
of set theory, for, as he says, “[m]athematics is ridden through
and through with the pernicious idioms of set theory,” such as
“the way people speak of a line as composed of points,”
when, in fact, “[a] line is a law and isn't composed of
anything at all” [(*PR* §173), (*PR*
§§181, 183, & 191), (*PG* 373, 460, 461, &
473)].

#### 2.5.1 Wittgenstein's Anti-Foundationalism and Genuine Irrational Numbers

Since, on Wittgenstein's terms, mathematics consists
exclusively of extensions and intensions (i.e., ‘rules’ or
‘laws’), an irrational is only an extension insofar as it
is a sign (i.e., a ‘numeral,’ such as ‘√2’
or ‘π’). Given that there is no such thing as an
infinite mathematical *extension*, it follows that an irrational
number is not a unique *infinite* *expansion*, but rather
a unique recursive rule or *law* (*PR* §181) that
yields rational numbers (*PR* §186; *PR*
§180).

The rule for working out places of √2 is itself the numeral for the irrational number; and the reason I here speak of a ‘number’ is that I can calculate with these signs (certain rules for the construction of rational numbers) just as I can with rational numbers themselves. (PG484)

Due, however, to his anti-foundationalism, Wittgenstein takes the radical position that not all recursive real numbers (i.e., computable numbers) are genuine real numbers—a position that distinguishes his view from even Brouwer's.

The problem, as Wittgenstein sees it, is that mathematicians,
especially foundationalists (e.g., set theorists), have sought to
accommodate physical continuity by a theory that
‘describes’ the mathematical continuum (*PR*
§171). When, for example, we think of continuous motion and
the (mere) density of the rationals, we reason that if an object moves
continuously from A to B, and it travels *only* the distances
marked by “rational points,” then it must *skip*
some distances (intervals, or points) *not* marked by rational
numbers. But if an object in continuous motion travels distances
that *cannot* be commensurately measured by rationals alone,
there must be ‘gaps’ between the rationals (*PG*
460), and so we must fill them, first, with recursive irrationals, and
then, because “the set of *all* recursive
irrationals” still leaves gaps, with “lawless
irrationals.”

[T]he enigma of the continuum arises because language misleads us into applying to it a picture that doesn't fit. Set theory preserves the inappropriate picture of something discontinuous, but makes statements about it that contradict the picture, under the impression that it is breaking with prejudices; whereas what should really have been done is to point out that the picture just doesn't fit… (PG471)

We add nothing that is needed to the differential and integral
calculi by ‘completing’ a theory of real numbers with
pseudo-irrationals and lawless irrationals, first because there are no
gaps on the number line [(*PR* §§181, 183, & 191),
(*PG* 373, 460, 461, & 473), (*WVC* 35)] and, second,
because these alleged irrational numbers are not needed for a theory of
the ‘continuum’ simply because there is no mathematical
continuum. As the later Wittgenstein says (*RFM* V,
§32), “[t]he picture of the number line is an absolutely
natural one up to a certain point; that is to say so long as it is not
used for a general theory of real numbers.” We have gone
awry by misconstruing the nature of the geometrical line as a
continuous collection of points, each with an associated real number,
which has taken us well beyond the ‘natural’ picture of the
number line in search of a “general theory of real
numbers” (Han 2010).

Thus, the principal reason Wittgenstein rejects certain constructive (computable) numbers is that they are unnecessary creations which engender conceptual confusions in mathematics (especially set theory). One of Wittgenstein's main aims in his lengthy discussions of rational numbers and pseudo-irrationals is to show that pseudo-irrationals, which are allegedly needed for the mathematical continuum, are not needed at all.

To this end, Wittgenstein demands (a) that a real number must be
“compar[able] with any rational number taken at random”
(i.e., “it can be established whether it is greater than, less
than, or equal to a rational number” (*PR* §191)) and
(b) that “[a] number must measure in and of itself” and if
a ‘number’ “leaves it to the rationals, we have no
need of it” (*PR* §191) [(Frascolla 1980, 242–243);
(Shanker 1987, 186–192); (Da Silva 1993, 93–94); (Marion 1995a, 162,
164); (Rodych 1999b, 281–291); (Lampert 2009)].

To demonstrate that some recursive (computable) reals are not genuine real numbers because they fail to satisfy (a) and (b), Wittgenstein defines the putative recursive real number

5 → 3

√2

as the rule “Construct the decimal expansion for √2,
replacing every occurrence of a ‘5’ with a
‘3’” (*PR* §182); he similarly defines
π′ as

7 → 3

π

(*PR* §186) and, in a later work, redefines π′
as

777 → 000

π

(*PG* 475).

Although a pseudo-irrational such as π′ (on either definition) is “as
unambiguous as… π or √2” (*PG* 476), it is
‘homeless’ according to Wittgenstein because, instead of
using “the idioms of arithmetic” (*PR* §186),
it is dependent upon the particular ‘incidental’ notation
of a particular system (i.e., in some particular base) [(*PR*
§188), (*PR* §182), and (*PG* 475)]. If
we speak of various base-notational systems, we might say that π
belongs to *all* systems, while π′ belongs only to one,
which shows that π′ is not a genuine irrational because
“there can't be irrational numbers of different
types” (*PR* §180). Furthermore,
pseudo-irrationals do *not* measure because they are homeless,
artificial constructions parasitic upon numbers which have a natural
place in a calculus that can be used to measure. We simply do not
need these aberrations, because they are not sufficiently comparable to
rationals and genuine irrationals. They are *not*
irrational numbers according to Wittgenstein's criteria, which
define, Wittgenstein interestingly asserts, “precisely what has
been meant or looked for under the name ‘irrational
number’” (*PR* §191).

For exactly the same reason, if we define a “lawless
irrational” as either (a) a *non*-rule-governed,
non-periodic, infinite expansion in some base, or (b) a
“free-choice sequence,” Wittgenstein rejects “lawless
irrationals” because, insofar as they are not rule-governed, they
are not comparable to rationals (or irrationals) and they are not
needed. “[W]e cannot say that the decimal fractions
developed in accordance with a law still need supplementing by an
infinite set of irregular infinite decimal fractions that would be
‘brushed under the carpet’ if we were to *restrict*
ourselves to those *generated by a law*,” Wittgenstein
argues, for “[w]here is there such an infinite decimal that is
generated by no law” “[a]nd how would we notice that it was
missing?” (*PR* §181; cf. *PG* 473,
483–84). Similarly, a free-choice sequence, like a recipe for
“endless bisection” or “endless dicing,” is not
an infinitely complicated *mathematical law* (or rule), but
rather no law at all, for after each individual throw of a coin, the
point remains “infinitely indeterminate” (*PR*
§186). For closely related reasons, Wittgenstein ridicules
the Multiplicative Axiom (Axiom of Choice) both in the middle period
(*PR* §146) and in the latter period (*RFM* V,
§25; VII, §33).

#### 2.5.2 Wittgenstein's Real Number Essentialism and the Dangers of Set Theory

Superficially, at least, it seems as if Wittgenstein is offering an
essentialist argument for the conclusion that real number arithmetic
*should not* be extended in such-and-such a way. Such an
*essentialist* account of real and irrational numbers seems to
conflict with the actual freedom mathematicians have to extend and
invent, with Wittgenstein's intermediate claim (*PG* 334)
that “[f]or [him] one calculus is as good as another,” and
with Wittgenstein's acceptance of complex and imaginary
numbers. Wittgenstein's foundationalist critic (e.g., set
theorist) will undoubtedly say that we have extended the term
“irrational number” to lawless and pseudo-irrationals
because they are needed for the mathematical continuum and because such
“conceivable numbers” are much more like rule-governed
irrationals than rationals.

Though Wittgenstein stresses differences where others see
similarities (*LFM* 15), in his intermediate attacks on
pseudo-irrationals and foundationalism, he is not just emphasizing
differences, he is attacking set theory's “pernicious
idioms” (*PR* §173) and its “crudest imaginable
misinterpretation of its own calculus” (*PG* 469–70) in an
attempt to dissolve “misunderstandings without which [set theory]
would never have been invented,” since it is “of no other
use” (*LFM* 16–17). Complex and imaginary numbers
have grown organically within mathematics, and they have proved their
mettle in scientific applications, but pseudo-irrationals are
*inorganic* creations invented solely for the sake of mistaken
foundationalist aims. Wittgenstein's main point is
*not* that we cannot create further recursive real
numbers—indeed, we can create as many as we want—his point
is that we can only really speak of different *systems* (sets)
of real numbers (*RFM* II, §33) that are enumerable by a
rule, and any attempt to speak of “the set of all real
numbers” or any piecemeal attempt to add or consider new
recursive reals (e.g., diagonal numbers) is a useless and/or futile
endeavour based on foundational misconceptions. Indeed, in 1930
MS and TS passages on irrationals and Cantor's diagonal, which
were not included in *PR* or *PG*, Wittgenstein says:
“The concept “irrational number” is a dangerous
pseudo-concept” (MS 108, 176; 1930; TS 210, 29; 1930). As
we shall see in the next section, on Wittgenstein's account, if
we do not understand irrationals rightly, we *cannot but*
engender the mistakes that constitute set theory.

### 2.6 Wittgenstein's Intermediate Critique of Set Theory

Wittgenstein's critique of set theory begins somewhat benignly
in the *Tractatus*, where he denounces Logicism and says (6.031)
that “[t]he theory of classes is completely superfluous in
mathematics” because, at least in part, “the generality
required in mathematics is not accidental generality.” In
his middle period, Wittgenstein begins a full-out assault on set theory
that never abates. Set theory, he says, is “utter
nonsense” (*PR* §§145, 174; WVC 102; *PG*
464, 470), ‘wrong’ (*PR* §174), and
‘laughable’ (*PG* 464); its “pernicious
idioms” (*PR* §173) mislead us and the crudest
possible misinterpretation is the very impetus of its invention
(Hintikka 1993, 24, 27).

Wittgenstein's intermediate critique of transfinite set theory
(hereafter “set theory”) has two main components: (1) his
discussion of the intension-extension distinction, and (2) his
criticism of non-denumerability *as cardinality*. Late in
the middle period, Wittgenstein seems to become more aware of the
unbearable conflict between his *strong formalism* (*PG*
334) and his denigration of set theory as a purely formal,
*non*-mathematical calculus (Rodych 1997, 217-219), which, as
we shall see in Section 3.5, leads to the use of an extra-mathematical
application criterion to demarcate transfinite set theory (and other
purely formal sign-games) from mathematical calculi.

#### 2.6.1 Intensions, Extensions, and the Fictitious Symbolism of Set Theory

The search for a comprehensive theory of the real numbers and
mathematical continuity has led to a “fictitious symbolism”
(*PR* §174).

Set theory attempts to grasp the infinite at a more general level than the investigation of the laws of the real numbers. It says that you can't grasp the actual infinite by means of mathematical symbolism at all and therefore it can only be described and not represented. … One might say of this theory that it buys a pig in a poke. Let the infinite accommodate itself in this box as best it can. (PG468; cf.PR§170)

As Wittgenstein puts it at (*PG* 461), “the mistake in
the set-theoretical approach consists time and again in treating laws
and enumerations (lists) as essentially the same kind of thing and
arranging them in parallel series so that one fills in gaps left by the
other.” This is a mistake because it is
‘nonsense’ to say “we cannot enumerate all the
numbers of a set, but we can give a description,” for
“[t]he one is not a substitute for the other” (*WVC*
102; June 19, 1930); “there isn't a dualism [of] the law
and the infinite series obeying it” (*PR* §180).

“Set theory is wrong” and nonsensical (*PR*
§174), says Wittgenstein, because it presupposes a fictitious
symbolism of infinite signs (*PG* 469) instead of an actual
symbolism with finite signs. The grand intimation of set theory,
which begins with “Dirichlet's concept of a function”
(*WVC* 102–03), is that we can *in principle* represent
an infinite set by an enumeration, but because of human or physical
limitations, we will instead *describe* it intensionally.
But, says Wittgenstein, “[t]here can't be possibility and
actuality in mathematics,” for mathematics is an *actual*
calculus, which “is concerned only with the signs with which it
*actually* operates” (*PG* 469). As
Wittgenstein puts it at (*PR* §159), the fact that
“we can't describe mathematics, we can only do it” in
and “of itself abolishes every ‘set
theory’.”

Perhaps the best example of this phenomenon is Dedekind, who in
giving his ‘definition of an “infinite class” as
“a class which is similar to a proper subclass of itself”
(*PG* 464), “tried to *describe* an infinite
class” (*PG* 463). If, however, we try to apply this
‘definition’ to a particular class in order to ascertain
whether it is finite or infinite, the attempt is
‘laughable’ if we apply it to a *finite* class, such
as “a certain row of trees,” and it is
‘nonsense’ if we apply it to “an infinite
class,” for we cannot even attempt “to co-ordinate
it” (*PG* 464), because “the relation *m* =
2*n* [does not] correlate the class of all numbers with one of
its subclasses” (*PR* §141), it is an “infinite
process” which “correlates any arbitrary number with
another.” So, although we *can* use *m* =
2*n* on the *rule* for generating the naturals (i.e., our
domain) and thereby construct the pairs (2,1), (4,2), (6,3), (8,4),
etc., in doing so we do not correlate two *infinite* sets or
extensions (*WVC* 103). If we try to apply
Dedekind's definition as a *criterion* for determining
whether a given set is infinite by establishing a 1–1 correspondence
between two inductive rules for generating “infinite
extensions,” one of which is an “extensional subset”
of the other, we can't possibly learn anything we didn't
already know when we applied the ‘criterion’ to two
inductive rules. If Dedekind or anyone else insists on calling an
inductive rule an “infinite set,” he and we must still mark
the categorical difference between such a set and a finite set with a
determinate, finite cardinality.

Indeed, on Wittgenstein's account, the failure to properly distinguish mathematical extensions and intensions is the root cause of the mistaken interpretation of Cantor's diagonal proof as a proof of the existence of infinite sets of lesser and greater cardinality.

#### 2.6.2 Against Non-Denumerability

Wittgenstein's criticism of non-denumerability is primarily
implicit during the middle period. Only after 1937 does he
provide concrete arguments purporting to show, e.g., that
Cantor's diagonal *cannot* prove that some infinite sets
have greater ‘multiplicity’ than others.

Nonetheless, the intermediate Wittgenstein clearly rejects the notion that a non-denumerably infinite set is greater in cardinality than a denumerably infinite set.

When people say ‘The set of all transcendental numbers is greater than that of algebraic numbers’, that's nonsense. The set is of a different kind. It isn't ‘no longer’ denumerable, it's simply not denumerable! (PR§174)

As with his intermediate views on genuine irrationals and the
Multiplicative Axiom, Wittgenstein here looks at the diagonal proof of
the non-denumerability of “the set of transcendental
numbers” as one that shows only that transcendental numbers
cannot be recursively enumerated. It is nonsense, he says, to go
from the warranted conclusion that these numbers are not, in principle,
enumerable to the conclusion that the *set* of transcendental
numbers is greater in cardinality than the set of algebraic numbers,
which is recursively enumerable. What we have here are two very
different conceptions of a number-type. In the case of algebraic
numbers, we have a decision procedure for determining of any given
number whether or not it is algebraic, *and* we have a method of
enumerating the algebraic numbers such that we can *see* that
‘each’ algebraic number “will be”
enumerated. In the case of transcendental numbers, on the other
hand, we have proofs that some numbers are transcendental (i.e.,
non-algebraic), *and* we have a proof that we cannot recursively
enumerate each and every thing we would call a “transcendental
number.”

At (*PG* 461), Wittgenstein similarly speaks of set
theory's “mathematical pseudo-concepts” leading to a
fundamental difficulty, which begins when we unconsciously presuppose
that there is sense to the idea of ordering the rationals by
size—“that the *attempt* is
thinkable”—and culminates in similarly thinking that it is
possible to enumerate *the real numbers*, which we then discover
is impossible.

Though the intermediate Wittgenstein certainly seems highly critical
of the alleged proof that some infinite sets (e.g., the reals) are
greater in cardinality than other infinite sets, and though he
discusses the “diagonal procedure” in February 1929 and in
June 1930 (MS 106, 266; MS 108, 180), along with a diagonal diagram,
these and other early-middle ruminations did not make it into the
typescripts for either *PR* or *PG*. As we shall
see in Section 3.4, the later Wittgenstein analyzes Cantor's
diagonal and claims of non-denumerability in some detail.

## 3. The Later Wittgenstein on Mathematics: Some Preliminaries

The first and most important thing to note about
Wittgenstein's later Philosophy of Mathematics is that
*RFM*, first published in 1956, consists of *selections*
taken from a number of MSS (1937–1944), most of one large typescript
(1938), and three short typescripts (1938), each of which constitutes
an Appendix to (*RFM* I). For this reason and because some
MSS containing much material on mathematics (e.g., (MS 123)) were not
used at all for *RFM*, philosophers have not been able to read
Wittgenstein's later remarks on mathematics as they were written
in the MSS used for *RFM* and they have not had access (until
the 2000–2001 release of the *Nachlass* on CD-ROM) to much of
Wittgenstein's later work on mathematics. It must be
emphasized, therefore, that this *Encyclopedia* article is being
written during a transitional period. Until philosophers have
used the *Nachlass* to build a comprehensive picture of
Wittgenstein's complete and evolving Philosophy of Mathematics,
we will not be able to say definitively which views the later
Wittgenstein retained, which he changed, and which he dropped. In
the interim, this article will outline Wittgenstein's later
Philosophy of Mathematics, drawing primarily on *RFM*, to a much
lesser extent *LFM* (1939 Cambridge lectures), and, where
possible, previously unpublished material in Wittgenstein's
*Nachlass*.

It should also be noted at the outset that commentators disagree about the continuity of Wittgenstein's middle and later Philosophies of Mathematics. Some argue that the later views are significantly different from the intermediate views [(Frascolla 1994), (Gerrard 1991, 127, 131–32), (Floyd 2005, 105–106)], while others argue that, for the most part, Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics evolves from the middle to the later period without significant changes or renunciations [(Wrigley 1993), (Marion 1998), (Rodych 1997, 2000a, 2000b)]. The remainder of this article adopts the second interpretation, explicating Wittgenstein's later Philosophy of Mathematics as largely continuous with his intermediate views, except for the important introduction of an extra-mathematical application criterion.

### 3.1 Mathematics as a Human Invention

Perhaps the most important constant in Wittgenstein's
Philosophy of Mathematics, middle and late, is that he consistently
maintains that mathematics is our, human invention, and that, indeed,
everything in mathematics is invented. Just as the middle
Wittgenstein says that “[w]e *make* mathematics,”
the later Wittgenstein says that we ‘invent’ mathematics
(*RFM* I, §168; II, §38; V, §§5, 9 and 11;
*PG* 469–70) and that “the mathematician is not a
discoverer: he is an inventor” (*RFM*, Appendix II,
§2; (*LFM* 22, 82). Nothing *exists*
mathematically unless and until we have invented it.

In arguing against mathematical discovery, Wittgenstein is not just
rejecting Platonism, he is also rejecting a rather standard
philosophical view according to which human beings invent mathematical
calculi, but once a calculus has been invented, we thereafter discover
finitely many of its infinitely many provable and true theorems.
As Wittgenstein himself asks (*RFM* IV, §48), “might
it not be said that the *rules* lead this way, even if no one
went it?” If “someone produced a proof [of
“Goldbach's theorem”],” “[c]ouldn't
one say,” Wittgenstein asks (*LFM* 144), “that the
*possibility* of this proof was a fact in the realms of
mathematical reality”—that “[i]n order [to] find it,
it must in some sense be there”—“[i]t must be a
possible structure”?

Unlike many or most philosophers of mathematics, Wittgenstein
resists the ‘Yes’ answer that we discover truths about a
mathematical calculus that *come into existence* the moment we
invent the calculus [(*PR* §141), (*PG* 283, 466),
(*LFM* 139)]. Wittgenstein rejects the modal reification
of possibility as actuality—that provability and constructibility
are (actual) facts—by arguing that it is at the very least
wrong-headed to say with the Platonist that because “a straight
line *can* be drawn between any two points,… the line
already exists even if no one has drawn it”—to say
“[w]hat in the ordinary world we call a possibility is in the
geometrical world a reality” (*LFM* 144; *RFM* I,
§21). One might as well say, Wittgenstein suggests
(*PG* 374), that “chess only had to be
*discovered*, it was always there!”

At (MS 122, 3v; Oct. 18, 1939), Wittgenstein once again emphasizes the difference between illusory mathematical discovery and genuine mathematical invention.

I want to get away from the formulation: “I now know more about the calculus”, and replace it with “I now have a different calculus”. The sense of this is always to keep before one's eyes the full scale of the gulf between a mathematical knowing and non-mathematical knowing.^{[3]}

And as with the middle period, the later Wittgenstein similarly says
(MS 121, 27r; May 27, 1938) that “[i]t helps if one says: the
proof of the Fermat proposition is not to be discovered, but to be
*invented*.”

The difference between the ‘anthropological’ and the mathematical account is that in the first we are not tempted to speak of ‘mathematical facts,’ but rather that in this account thefactsare never mathematical ones, never makemathematicalpropositions true or false. (MS 117, 263; March 15, 1940)

There are no mathematical facts just as there are no (genuine)
mathematical propositions. Repeating his intermediate view, the
later Wittgenstein says (MS 121, 71v; 27 Dec., 1938):
“Mathematics consists of [calculi |
calculations], not of
propositions.” This radical constructivist conception of
mathematics prompts Wittgenstein to make notorious
remarks—remarks that virtually no one else would make—such
as the infamous (*RFM* V, §9): “However queer it
sounds, the further expansion of an irrational number is a further
expansion of mathematics.”

#### 3.1.1 Wittgenstein's Later Anti-Platonism: The Natural History of Numbers and the Vacuity of Platonism

As in the middle period, the later Wittgenstein maintains that
mathematics is essentially syntactical and non-referential, which, in
and of itself, makes Wittgenstein's philosophy of mathematics
anti-Platonist insofar as Platonism is the view that mathematical terms
and propositions *refer* to objects and/or facts and that
mathematical propositions are *true* by virtue of agreeing with
*mathematical facts*.

The later Wittgenstein, however, wishes to ‘warn’ us
that our thinking is saturated with the idea of “[a]rithmetic as
the natural history (mineralogy) of numbers” (*RFM* IV,
§11). When, for instance, Wittgenstein discusses the claim
that fractions cannot be ordered by magnitude, he says that this sounds
‘remarkable’ in a way that a mundane proposition of the
differential calculus does not, for the latter proposition is
associated with an application in physics, “whereas *this
proposition*… seems to [‘solely’]
concern… the natural history of mathematical objects
themselves” (*RFM* II, §40). Wittgenstein
stresses that he is trying to ‘warn’ us against this
‘aspect’—the idea that the foregoing proposition
about fractions “introduces us to the mysteries of the
mathematical world,” which exists somewhere as a completed
totality, awaiting our prodding and our discoveries. The fact
that we regard mathematical propositions as being about mathematical
objects and mathematical investigation “as the exploration of
these objects” is “already mathematical alchemy,”
claims Wittgenstein (*RFM* V, §16), since “it is not
possible to appeal to the meaning [‘Bedeutung’] of the
signs in mathematics,… because it is only mathematics that gives
them their meaning [‘Bedeutung’].” Platonism is
*dangerously misleading*, according to Wittgenstein, because it
suggests a picture of *pre*-existence, *pre*determination
and discovery that is completely at odds with what we find if we
actually examine and describe mathematics and mathematical
activity. “I should like to be able to describe,”
says Wittgenstein (*RFM* IV, §13), “how it comes
about that mathematics appears to us now as the natural history of the
domain of numbers, now again as a collection of rules.”

Wittgenstein, however, does *not* endeavour to
*refute* Platonism. His aim, instead, is to clarify what
Platonism is and what it says, implicitly and explicitly (including
variants of Platonism that claim, e.g., that if a proposition is
*provable* in an axiom system, then there already exists a path
[i.e., a proof] from the axioms to that proposition [(*RFM* I,
§21); (Marion 1998, 13–14, 226), (Rodych 1997; 2000b, 267–280),
(Steiner 2000, 334)]). Platonism is either “a mere
truism” (*LFM* 239), Wittgenstein says, or it is a
‘picture’ consisting of “an infinity of shadowy
worlds” (*LFM* 145), which, as such, lacks
‘utility’ (cf. *PI* §254) because it explains
nothing and it misleads at every turn.

### 3.2 Wittgenstein's Later Finitistic Constructivism

Though commentators and critics do not agree as to whether the later
Wittgenstein is still a finitist and whether, if he is, his finitism is
as radical as his intermediate rejection of unbounded mathematical
quantification (Maddy 1986, 300–301, 310), the overwhelming evidence
indicates that the later Wittgenstein still rejects the actual infinite
(*RFM* V, §21; *Zettel* §274, 1947) and
infinite mathematical extensions.

The first, and perhaps most definitive, indication that the later
Wittgenstein maintains his finitism is his continued and consistent
insistence that irrational numbers are rules for constructing finite
expansions, *not* infinite mathematical extensions.
“The concepts of infinite decimals in mathematical
propositions are not concepts of series,” says Wittgenstein
(*RFM* V, §19), “but of the unlimited technique of
expansion of series.” We are misled by “[t]he
extensional definitions of functions, of real numbers etc.”
(*RFM* V, §35), but once we recognize the Dedekind cut as
“an extensional *image*,” we see that we are not
“led to √2 by way of the concept of a cut”
(*RFM* V, §34). On the later Wittgenstein's
account, there simply is no *property*, no *rule*, no
*systematic means* of defining each and every irrational number
*intensionally*, which means there is *no criterion*
“for the irrational numbers being *complete*”
(*PR* §181).

As in his intermediate position, the later Wittgenstein claims that
‘ℵ_{0}’ and “infinite series”
get their mathematical uses from the use of ‘infinity’ in
ordinary language (*RFM* II, §60). Although, in
ordinary language, we often use ‘infinite’ and
“infinitely many” as answers to the question “how
many?,” and though we associate infinity with the enormously
large, the principal *use* we make of ‘infinite’ and
‘infinity’ is to speak of *the unlimited*
(*RFM* V, §14) and unlimited *techniques*
(*RFM* II, §45; *PI* §218). This fact is
brought out by the fact “that the technique of learning
ℵ_{0} numerals is different from the technique of
learning 100,000 numerals” (*LFM* 31). When we say,
e.g., that “there are an infinite number of even numbers”
we mean that we have a mathematical technique or rule for generating
even numbers which is *limitless*, which is markedly different
from a limited technique or rule for generating a finite number of
numbers, such as 1–100,000,000. “We learn an endless
technique,” says Wittgenstein (*RFM* V, §19),
“but what is in question here is not some gigantic
extension.”

An infinite sequence, for example, is not a gigantic extension
because it is not an extension, and ‘ℵ_{0}’ is not a
cardinal number, for “how is this picture connected with the
*calculus*,” given that “its connexion is not that
of the picture | | | | with 4” (i.e.,
given that ‘ℵ_{0}’ is not connected to a (finite)
extension)? This shows, says Wittgenstein (*RFM* II,
§58), that we ought to avoid the word ‘infinite’ in
mathematics wherever it seems to give a meaning to the calculus, rather
than acquiring its meaning from the calculus and its use in the
calculus. Once we see that the calculus contains nothing
infinite, we should not be ‘disappointed’ (*RFM* II,
§60), but simply note (*RFM* II, §59) that it is not
“really necessary… to conjure up the picture of the
infinite (of the enormously big).”

A second strong indication that the later Wittgenstein maintains his
finitism is his continued and consistent treatment of
‘propositions’ of the type “There are three
consecutive 7s in the decimal expansion of π”
(hereafter
‘PIC’).^{[4]}
In the middle period, PIC (and its putative negation, ¬PIC,
namely, “It is not the case that there are three consecutive 7s
in the decimal expansion of π”) is *not* a meaningful
mathematical “statement at all” (*WVC* 81–82:
Footnote #1). On Wittgenstein's intermediate view, PIC—like FLT,
GC, and the Fundamental Theorem of Algebra—is *not* a
mathematical proposition because we do not have in hand an applicable
decision procedure by which we can decide it in a particular
calculus. For this reason, we can only meaningfully state
*finitistic* propositions regarding the expansion of π, such as
“There exist three consecutive 7s in the first 10,000 places of
the expansion of π” (*WVC* 71; 81–82, Footnote #1).

The later Wittgenstein maintains this position in various passages
in *RFM* (Bernays 1959 [1986, 176]). For example, to
someone who says that since “the rule of expansion
*determine*[*s*] the series completely,” “it
must implicitly determine *all* questions about the structure of
the series,” Wittgenstein replies: “Here you are thinking
of finite series” (*RFM* V, §11). If PIC were a
*mathematical* question (or problem)—if it were
finitistically restricted—it would be algorithmically decidable,
which it is not [(*RFM* V, §21), (*LFM* 31–32, 111,
170), (*WVC* 102–03)]. As Wittgenstein says at
(*RFM* V, §9): “The question… changes its
status, when it becomes decidable,” “[f]or a connexion is
made then, which formerly *was not there*.” And if,
moreover, one invokes the Law of the Excluded Middle to establish that
PIC is a mathematical proposition—i.e., by saying that one of
these “two pictures… must correspond to the fact”
(*RFM* V, §10)—one simply begs the question
(*RFM* V, §12), for if we have doubts about the
mathematical status of PIC, we will not be swayed by a person who
asserts “PIC
∨
¬PIC” (*RFM* VII,
§41; V, §13).

Wittgenstein's finitism, constructivism, and conception of
mathematical decidability are interestingly connected at (*RFM*
VII, §41, par. 2–5).

What harm is done e.g. by saying that God knowsallirrational numbers? Or: that they are already there, even though we only know certain of them? Why are these pictures not harmless?For one thing, they hide certain problems.— (MS 124, p. 139; March 16, 1944)

Suppose that people go on and on calculating the expansion of π. So God, who knows everything, knows whether they will have reached ‘777’ by the end of the world. But can his

omnisciencedecide whether theywouldhave reached it after the end of the world? It cannot. I want to say: Even God can determine something mathematical only by mathematics. Even for him the mere rule of expansion cannot decide anything that it does not decide for us.We might put it like this: if the rule for the expansion has been given us, a

calculationcan tell us that there is a ‘2’ at the fifth place. Could God have known this, without the calculation, purely from the rule of expansion? I want to say: No. (MS 124, pp. 175–176; March 23–24, 1944)

What Wittgenstein means here is that God's omniscience *might*,
by calculation, find that ‘777’ occurs at the interval
[*n*,*n*+2], but, on the other hand, God might go on
calculating forever without ‘777’ ever turning up. Since
π is not a *completed* infinite extension that can be
completely surveyed by an omniscient being (i.e., it is not a fact
that can be known by an omniscient mind), even God has only the rule,
and so God's omniscience is no advantage in this case [(*LFM*
103–04); cf. (Weyl, 1921 [1998, 97])]. Like us, with our modest minds,
an omniscient mind (i.e., God) can only calculate the expansion of π
to some *n*^{th} decimal place—where our
*n* is minute and God's *n* is (relatively)
enormous—and at no *n*^{th} decimal place could
*any mind* rightly conclude that because ‘777’ has
not turned up, it, therefore, will never turn up.

### 3.3 The Later Wittgenstein on Decidability and Algorithmic Decidability

On one fairly standard interpretation, the later Wittgenstein says
that “true in calculus Γ“ is identical to
“provable in calculus Γ” and, therefore, that a
mathematical proposition of calculus Γ is a concatenation of
signs that is either provable (in principle) or refutable (in
principle) in calculus Γ [(Goodstein 1972, 279, 282), (Anderson
1958, 487), (Klenk 1976, 13), (Frascolla 1994, 59)]. On this
interpretation, the later Wittgenstein precludes undecidable
mathematical propositions, but he allows that some *undecided*
expressions are propositions *of* a calculus because they are
decidable in principle (i.e., in the absence of a known, applicable
decision procedure).

There is considerable evidence, however, that the later Wittgenstein
maintains his intermediate position that an expression is a meaningful
mathematical proposition only *within* a given calculus and
*iff* we knowingly have in hand an applicable and effective
decision procedure by means of which we can decide it. For example,
though Wittgenstein vacillates between “provable in PM”
and “proved in PM” at (*RFM* App. III, §6,
§8), he does so in order to use the former to consider the
alleged conclusion of Gödel's proof (i.e., that there exist true
but unprovable mathematical propositions), which he then rebuts with
his own identification of “true in calculus Γ” with
“*proved* in calculus Γ” (i.e., *not*
with “*provable* in calculus Γ“) [(Wang
1991, 253), (Rodych 1999a, 177)]. This construal is corroborated by
numerous passages in which Wittgenstein rejects the received view that
a prov*able* but unproved proposition is true, as he does when
he asserts that (*RFM* III, §31, 1939) a proof
“makes new connexions,” “[i]t does not establish
that they are there” because “they do not exist until it
makes them,” and when he says (*RFM* VII, §10, 1941)
that “[a] new proof gives the proposition a place in a new
system.” Furthermore, as we have just seen, Wittgenstein
rejects PIC as a non-proposition on the grounds that it is not
algorithmically decidable, while admitting finitistic versions of PIC
because they are algorithmically decidable.

Perhaps the most compelling evidence that the later Wittgenstein
maintains algorithmic decidability as his criterion for a mathematical
proposition lies in the fact that, at (*RFM* V, §9, 1942),
he says in two distinct ways that a mathematical
‘question’ can *become* decidable and that when
this *happens*, a new connexion is ‘*made*’
which previously did not exist. Indeed, Wittgenstein cautions us
against appearances by saying that “it *looks* as if a
ground for the decision were already there,” when, in fact,
“it has yet to be invented.” These passages strongly
militate against the claim that the later Wittgenstein grants that
proposition φ is decidable in calculus Γ iff it is provable
or refutable *in principle*. Moreover, if Wittgenstein held
*this* position, he would claim, contra (*RFM* V,
§9), that a question or proposition does not *become*
decidable since it simply (always) *is* decidable. If it is
provable, and we simply don't yet know this to be the case, there
*already is* a connection between, say, our axioms and rules
and the proposition in question. What Wittgenstein says, however, is
that the modalities *provable* and *refutable* are
shadowy forms of reality—that possibility is not actuality in
mathematics [(*PR* §§141, 144, 172), (*PG*
281, 283, 299, 371, 466, 469)], (*LFM* 139)]. Thus, the later
Wittgenstein agrees with the intermediate Wittgenstein that the only
sense in which an *undecided* mathematical proposition
(*RFM* VII, §40, 1944) can be *decidable* is in the
sense that we *know* how to decide it by means of an applicable
decision procedure.

### 3.4 Wittgenstein's Later Critique of Set Theory: Non-Enumerability vs. Non-Denumerability

Largely a product of his *anti-foundationalism* and his
criticism of the extension-intension conflation, Wittgenstein's
later critique of set theory is highly consonant with his intermediate
critique [(*PR* §§109, 168), (*PG* 334, 369,
469), (*LFM* 172, 224, 229), and (*RFM* III, §43,
46, 85, 90; VII, §16)]. Given that mathematics is a
“MOTLEY of techniques of proof” (*RFM* III,
§46), it does not require a foundation (*RFM* VII,
§16) and it cannot be given a *self-evident* foundation
[(*PR* §160), (*WVC* 34 & 62), (*RFM* IV,
§3)]. Since set theory was invented to provide mathematics
with a foundation, it is, minimally, unnecessary.

Even if set theory is unnecessary, it still might constitute a solid
foundation for mathematics. In his core criticism of set theory,
however, the later Wittgenstein denies this, saying that the diagonal
proof does not prove non-denumerability, for “[i]t means nothing
to say: “*Therefore* the X numbers are not
denumerable” (*RFM* II, §10). When the diagonal
is construed as a *proof* of greater and lesser infinite sets it
is a “puffed-up proof,” which, as Poincaré argued
(1913b, 61–62), purports to prove or show more than “its means
allow it” (*RFM* II, §21).

If it were said: “Consideration of the diagonal procedure shews you that the

concept‘real number’ has much less analogy with the concept ‘cardinal number’ than we, being misled by certain analogies, are inclined to believe”, that would have a good and honest sense. But just theoppositehappens: one pretends to compare the ‘set’ of real numbers in magnitude with that of cardinal numbers. The difference in kind between the two conceptions is represented, by a skew form of expression, as difference of extension. I believe, and hope, that a future generation will laugh at this hocus pocus. (RFMII, §22)The sickness of a time is cured by an alteration in the mode of life of human beings… (

RFMII, §23)

The “hocus pocus” of the diagonal proof rests, as always
for Wittgenstein, on a conflation of extension and intension, on the
failure to properly distinguish sets *as rules* for generating
extensions and (finite) extensions. By way of this confusion
“a difference in kind” (i.e., unlimited rule vs. finite
extension) “is represented by a skew form of expression,”
namely as a difference in the *cardinality* of two
*infinite* extensions. Not only can the diagonal
*not* prove that one infinite set is greater in cardinality than
another infinite set, according to Wittgenstein, *nothing* could
prove this, simply because “infinite sets” are not
*extensions*, and hence not *infinite* extensions.
But instead of interpreting Cantor's diagonal proof
honestly, we take the proof to “show there are numbers bigger
than the infinite,” which “sets the whole mind in a whirl,
and gives the pleasant feeling of paradox” (*LFM*
16–17)—a “giddiness attacks us when we think of certain
theorems in set theory”—“when we are performing a
piece of logical sleight-of-hand” (*PI* §412;
§426; 1945). This giddiness and pleasant feeling of paradox,
says Wittgenstein (*LFM* 16), “may be the chief reason
[set theory] was invented.”

Though Cantor's diagonal is not a *proof* of
non-denumerability, when it is expressed in a *constructive
manner*, as Wittgenstein himself expresses it at (*RFM* II,
§1), “it gives sense to the mathematical proposition that
the number so-and-so is different from all those of the system”
(*RFM* II, §29). That is, the proof proves
*non-enumerability*: it proves that for any given
*definite* real number concept (e.g., recursive real), one
cannot enumerate ‘all’ such numbers because one can always
construct a diagonal number, which falls under the same concept and is
not in the enumeration. “One might say,” Wittgenstein
says, “I call number-concept X non-denumerable if it has been
stipulated that, whatever numbers falling under this concept you
arrange in a series, the diagonal number of this series is also to fall
under that concept” (*RFM* II, §10; cf. II,
§§30, 31, 13).

One lesson to be learned from this, according to Wittgenstein
(*RFM* II, §33), is that “there are *diverse
systems* of irrational points to be found in the number
line,” each of which can be given by a recursive rule, but
“no system of irrational numbers,” and “also no
super-system, no ‘set of irrational numbers’ of
higher-order infinity.” Cantor has shown that we can
construct “infinitely many” diverse systems of irrational
numbers, but we cannot construct an *exhaustive* system of
*all* the irrational numbers (*RFM* II, §29).
As Wittgenstein says at (MS 121, 71r; Dec. 27, 1938), three pages after
the passage used for (*RFM* II, §57): “If you now
call the Cantorian procedure one for producing a new real number, you
will now no longer be inclined to speak of *a system of all real
numbers*” (italics added). From Cantor's proof,
however, set theorists erroneously conclude that “the set of
irrational numbers” is greater in multiplicity than any
enumeration of irrationals (or the set of rationals), when the only
conclusion to draw is that there is no such thing as *the set
of* all *the irrational numbers*. The truly dangerous
aspect to ‘propositions’ such as “The real numbers
cannot be arranged in a series” and “The set… is not
denumerable” is that they make concept formation [i.e., our
*invention*] “look like a fact of nature” (i.e.,
something we *discover*) (*RFM* II §§16,
37). At best, we have a vague idea of the concept of “real
number,” but only if we restrict this idea to “recursive
real number” and only if we recognize that *having* the
concept does not mean *having* a set of all recursive real
numbers.

### 3.5 Extra-Mathematical Application as a Necessary Condition of Mathematical Meaningfulness

The principal and most significant change from the middle to later
writings on mathematics is Wittgenstein's (re-)introduction of an
extra-mathematical application criterion, which is used to distinguish
mere “sign-games” from mathematical language-games.
“[I]t is essential to mathematics that its signs are also
employed in *mufti*,” Wittgenstein states, for “[i]t
is the use outside mathematics, and so the *meaning*
[‘*Bedeutung*’] of the signs, that makes the
sign-game into mathematics” (i.e., a mathematical
“language-game”) [(*RFM* V, §2, 1942),
(*LFM* 140–141, 169–70)]. As Wittgenstein says at
(*RFM* V, §41, 1943), “[c]oncepts which occur in
‘necessary’ propositions *must also* occur and have
a meaning [‘Bedeutung’] in non-necessary ones”
[italics added]. If two proofs prove the same proposition, says
Wittgenstein, this means that “both demonstrate it as a suitable
instrument for the same purpose,” which “is an allusion to
*something outside mathematics*” (*RFM* VII,
§10, 1941; italics added).

As we have seen, this criterion was present in the
*Tractatus* (6.211), but noticeably absent in the middle
period. The reason for this absence is probably that the
intermediate Wittgenstein wanted to stress that in mathematics
everything is syntax and nothing is meaning. Hence, in his
criticisms of Hilbert's ‘contentual’ mathematics
(Hilbert 1925) and Brouwer's reliance upon intuition to
determine the meaningful content of (especially undecidable)
mathematical propositions, Wittgenstein couched his finitistic
constructivism in strong formalism, emphasizing that a mathematical
calculus does not need an extra-mathematical application (*PR*
§109; *WVC* 105).

There seem to be two reasons why the later Wittgenstein reintroduces
extra-mathematical application as a necessary condition of a
*mathematical* language-game. First, the later
Wittgenstein has an even greater interest in the *use* of
natural and formal languages in diverse “forms of life”
(*PI* §23), which prompts him to emphasize that, in many
cases, a mathematical ‘proposition’ functions as if it were
an empirical proposition “hardened into a rule”
(*RFM* VI, §23) and that mathematics plays diverse applied
roles in many forms of human activity (e.g., science, technology,
predictions). Second, the extra-mathematical application
criterion relieves the tension between Wittgenstein's
intermediate critique of set theory and his strong formalism according
to which “one calculus is as good as another” (*PG*
334). By demarcating mathematical language-games from
non-mathematical sign-games, Wittgenstein can now claim that,
“for the time being,” set theory is merely a formal
sign-game.

These considerations may lead us to say that 2^{ℵ0}> ℵ_{0}.That is to say: we can

makethe considerations lead us to that.Or: we can say

thisand givethisas our reason.But if we do say it—what are we to do next? In what practice is this proposition anchored? It is for the time being a piece of mathematical architecture which hangs in the air, and looks as if it were, let us say, an architrave, but not supported by anything and supporting nothing. (

RFMII, §35)

It is not that Wittgenstein's later criticisms of set theory
change, it is, rather, that once we see that set theory has no
extra-mathematical application, we will focus on its calculations,
proofs, and prose and “subject the *interest* of the
calculations to a *test*” (*RFM* II,
§62). By means of *Wittgenstein's*
“immensely important” ‘investigation’
(*LFM* 103), we will find, Wittgenstein expects, that set theory
is uninteresting (e.g., that the non-enumerability of “the
reals” is uninteresting and useless) and that our entire interest
in it lies in the ‘charm’ of the mistaken prose
interpretation of its proofs (*LFM* 16). More importantly,
though there is “a solid core to all [its] glistening
concept-formations” (*RFM* V, §16), once we see it as
“as a mistake of ideas,” we will see that propositions such
as “2^{ℵ0} >
ℵ_{0}” are
not anchored in an extra-mathematical practice, that
“Cantor's paradise” “is not a paradise,”
and we will *then* leave “of [our] own accord”
(*LFM* 103).

It must be emphasized, however, that the later Wittgenstein still maintains that the operations within a mathematical calculus are purely formal, syntactical operations governed by rules of syntax (i.e., the solid core of formalism).

It is of course clear that the mathematician, in so far as he really is ‘playing a game’…[is]actingin accordance with certain rules. (RFMV, §1)To say mathematics is a game is supposed to mean: in proving, we need never appeal to the meaning [‘Bedeutung’] of the signs, that is to their extra-mathematical application. (

RFMV, §4)

Where, during the middle period, Wittgenstein speaks of
“arithmetic [as] a kind of geometry” at (*PR*
§109 & §111), the later Wittgenstein similarly speaks of
“the geometry of proofs” (*RFM* I, App. III,
§14), the “geometrical cogency” of proofs
(*RFM* III, §43), and a “geometrical
application” according to which the “transformation of
signs” in accordance with “transformation-rules”
(*RFM* VI, §2, 1941) shows that “when mathematics is
divested of all content, it would remain that certain signs can be
constructed from others according to certain rules” (*RFM*
III, §38). Hence, the question whether a concatenation of
signs is a proposition of a given *mathematical* calculus (i.e.,
a calculus with an extra-mathematical application) is still an
internal, syntactical question, which we can answer with knowledge of
the proofs and decision procedures of the calculus.

### 3.6 Wittgenstein on Gödel and Undecidable Mathematical Propositions

*RFM* is perhaps most (in)famous for Wittgenstein's
(*RFM* App. III) treatment of “true but unprovable”
mathematical propositions. Early reviewers said that “[t]he
arguments are wild” (Kreisel 1958, 153), that the passages
“on Gödel's theorem… are of poor quality or contain
definite errors” (Dummett 1959, 324), and that (*RFM*
App. III) “throws no light on Gödel's work”
(Goodstein 1957, 551). “Wittgenstein seems to want to
legislate [“[q]uestions about completeness”] out of
existence,” Anderson said, (1958, 486–87) when, in fact, he
certainly cannot dispose of Gödel's demonstrations “by
confusing truth with provability.” Additionally, Bernays,
Anderson (1958, 486), and Kreisel (1958, 153–54) claimed that
Wittgenstein failed to appreciate “Gödel's quite explicit
premiss of the consistency of the considered formal system”
(Bernays 1959, 15), thereby failing to appreciate the conditional
nature of Gödel's First Incompleteness Theorem. On the reading of
these four early expert reviewers, Wittgenstein failed to understand
Gödel's Theorem because he failed to understand the mechanics of
Gödel's proof and he erroneously thought he could refute or
undermine Gödel's proof simply by identifying “true in
*PM*” (i.e., *Principia Mathematica*) with
“proved/provable in *PM*.”

Interestingly, we now have two pieces of evidence [(Kreisel 1998,
119); (Rodych 2003, 282, 307)] that Wittgenstein wrote (*RFM*
App. III) in 1937–38 after reading *only* the informal,
‘casual’ (MS 126, 126–127; Dec. 13, 1942) introduction of
(Gödel 1931) and that, therefore, his use of a self-referential
proposition as the “true but unprovable proposition” may be
based on Gödel's introductory, informal statements, namely
that “the undecidable proposition
[*R*(*q*);*q*] states… that
[*R*(*q*);*q*] is not provable” (1931, 598)
and that “[*R*(*q*);*q*] says about itself
that it is not provable” (1931, 599). Perplexingly, only
two of the four famous reviewers even mentioned Wittgenstein's
(*RFM* VII, §§19, 21–22, 1941)) explicit remarks on
‘Gödel's’ First Incompleteness Theorem [(Bernays
1959, 2), (Anderson 1958, 487)], which, though flawed, capture the
number-theoretic nature of the Gödelian proposition *and*
the functioning of Gödel-numbering, probably because Wittgenstein
had by then read or skimmed the body of Gödel's 1931 paper
(Rodych 2003, 304–07).

The first thing to note, therefore, about (*RFM* App. III) is
that Wittgenstein mistakenly thinks—again, perhaps because
Wittgenstein had read only Gödel's Introduction—(a)
that Gödel proves that there are true but unprovable propositions
of *PM* (when, in fact, Gödel syntactically proves that if
*PM* is ω-consistent, the Gödelian proposition is
undecidable in *PM*) and (b) that Gödel's proof uses
a self-referential proposition to semantically show that there are true
but unprovable propositions of *PM*.

For this reason, Wittgenstein has two main aims in (*RFM*
App. III): (1) to refute or undermine, *on its own terms*, the
alleged Gödel proof of true but unprovable propositions of
*PM*, and (2) to show that, on his own terms, where “true
in calculus Γ” is identified with “*proved* in
calculus Γ,” the very idea of a true but unprovable proposition
of calculus Γ is meaningless.

Thus, at (*RFM* App. III, §8) (hereafter simply
‘§8’), Wittgenstein begins his presentation of what he
takes to be Gödel's proof by having someone say: “I
have constructed a proposition (I will use ‘*P*’ to
designate it) in Russell's symbolism, and by means of certain
definitions and transformations it can be so interpreted that it says:
‘*P* is not provable in Russell's
system’.” That is, Wittgenstein's Gödelian
constructs a proposition that is semantically *self-referential*
and which specifically says of itself that it is not provable in
*PM*. With this erroneous, self-referential proposition
*P* [used also at (§10), (§11), (§17),
(§18)], Wittgenstein presents a proof-sketch very similar to
Gödel's own *informal* semantic proof
‘sketch’ in the Introduction of his famous paper (1931,
598).

Must I not say that this proposition on the one hand is true, and on the other hand is unprovable? For suppose it were false; then it is true that it is provable. And that surely cannot be! And if it is proved, then it is proved that it is not provable. Thus it can only be true, but unprovable. (§8)

The reasoning here is a double *reductio*. Assume (a)
that *P* must either be true or false in Russell's system,
and (b) that *P* must either be provable or unprovable in
Russell's system. If (a), *P* must be *true*,
for if we suppose that *P* is false, since *P* says of
itself that it is unprovable, “it is true that it is
provable,” and if it is provable, it must be true (which is a
contradiction), and hence, given what *P* means or says, it is
true that *P* is unprovable (which is a contradiction).
Second, if (b), *P* must be unprovable, for if *P*
“is proved, then it is proved that it is not provable,”
which is a contradiction (i.e., *P* is provable *and* not
provable in *PM*). It follows that *P* “can
only be true, but unprovable.”

To refute or undermine this ‘proof,’ Wittgenstein says
that if you have proved ¬*P*, you have proved that
*P* is provable (i.e., since you have proved that it is
*not* the case that *P* is not provable in
Russell's system), and “you will now presumably give up the
interpretation that it is unprovable” (i.e., ‘*P* is
not provable in Russell's system’), since the contradiction
is only proved if we use or retain this self-referential interpretation
(§8). On the other hand, Wittgenstein argues (§8),
‘[i]f you assume that the proposition is provable in
Russell's system, that means it is true *in the Russell
sense*, and the interpretation “*P* is not
provable” again has to be given up,’ because, once again,
it is only the self-referential interpretation that engenders a
contradiction. Thus, Wittgenstein's
‘refutation’ of “Gödel's proof”
consists in showing that no contradiction arises if we do *not*
interpret ‘*P*’ as ‘*P* is not provable
in Russell's system’—indeed, without this
interpretation, a proof of *P* does not yield a proof of
¬*P* and a proof of ¬*P* does not yield a
proof of *P*. In other words, the mistake in the proof is
the mistaken assumption that a mathematical proposition
‘*P*’ “can be so interpreted that it says:
‘*P* is not provable in Russell's
system’.” As Wittgenstein says at (§11),
“[t]hat is what comes of making up such sentences.”

This ‘refutation’ of “Gödel's
proof” is perfectly consistent with Wittgenstein's
syntactical conception of mathematics (i.e., wherein mathematical
propositions have no meaning and hence cannot have the
‘requisite’ self-referential meaning) and with what he says
before and after (§8), where his main aim is to show (2) that,
*on his own terms*, since “true in calculus Γ” is
identical with “proved in calculus Γ,” the very idea of a
true but unprovable proposition of calculus Γ is a
contradiction-in-terms.

To show (2), Wittgenstein begins by asking (§5), what he takes to
be, the central question, namely, “Are there true propositions
in Russell's system, which cannot be proved in his system?”. To
address this question, he asks “What is called a true
proposition in Russell's system…?,” which he succinctly
answers (§6): “‘*p*’ *is true =
p*.” Wittgenstein then clarifies this answer by
reformulating the second question of (§5) as “Under what
circumstances is a proposition asserted in Russell's game [i.e.,
system]?”, which he then answers by saying: “the answer
is: at the end of one of his proofs, or as a ‘fundamental
law’ (Pp.)” (§6). This, in a nutshell, is
Wittgenstein's conception of “mathematical truth”: a true
proposition of *PM* is an axiom or a proved proposition, which
means that “true in *PM*” is identical with, and
therefore can be supplanted by, “proved in
*PM*.”

Having explicated, to his satisfaction at least, the only real,
non-illusory notion of “true in *PM*,” Wittgenstein
answers the (§8) question “Must I not say that this
proposition… is true, and… unprovable?”
*negatively* by (re)stating his own (§§5–6) conception
of “true in *PM*” as “proved/provable in
*PM*”: “‘True in Russell's system’
means, as was said: proved in Russell's system; and ‘false
in Russell's system’ means: the opposite has been proved in
Russell's system.” This answer is given in a slightly
different way at (§7) where Wittgenstein asks “may there not
be true propositions which are written in this [Russell's]
symbolism, but are not provable in Russell's system?”, and
then answers “‘True propositions’, hence propositions
which are true in *another* system, i.e. can rightly be asserted
in another game.” In light of what he says in
(§§5, 6, and 8), Wittgenstein's (§7) point is that
if a proposition is ‘written’ in “Russell's
symbolism” and it is true, *it must be proved/provable in
another system*, since that is what “mathematical
truth” is. Analogously (§8), “if the proposition
is supposed to be false in some other than the Russell sense, then it
does not contradict this for it to be proved in Russell's
sense,” for ‘[w]hat is called “losing” in chess
may constitute winning in another game.’ This textual
evidence certainly suggests, as Anderson almost said, that Wittgenstein
rejects a true but unprovable mathematical proposition as a
contradiction-in-terms on the grounds that “true in calculus
Γ” means nothing more (and nothing less) than “proved in
calculus Γ.”

On this (natural) interpretation of (*RFM* App. III), the
early reviewers’ conclusion that Wittgenstein fails to understand
the mechanics of Gödel's argument seems reasonable.
First, Wittgenstein erroneously thinks that Gödel's proof is
essentially semantical and that it uses and *requires* a
self-referential proposition. Second, Wittgenstein says
(§14) that “[a] contradiction is unusable” for
“a prediction” that “that such-and-such construction
is impossible” (i.e., that *P* is unprovable in
*PM*), which, superficially at least (Rodych 1999a, 190–91),
seems to indicate that Wittgenstein fails to appreciate the
“consistency assumption” of Gödel's proof
(Kreisel, Bernays, Anderson).

If, in fact, Wittgenstein did not read and/or failed to understand
Gödel's proof through at least 1941, how would he have
responded if and when he understood it as (at least) a proof of the
undecidability of *P* in *PM* on the assumption of
*PM*'s consistency? Given his syntactical conception
of mathematics, even with the extra-mathematical application criterion,
he would simply say that *P*, *qua* expression
syntactically independent of *PM*, is not a proposition of
*PM*, and if it is syntactically independent of all existent
mathematical language-games, it is not a mathematical
proposition. Moreover, there seem to be no compelling
non-semantical reasons—either intra-systemic or
extra-mathematical—for Wittgenstein to accommodate *P* by
including it in *PM* or by adopting a non-syntactical conception
of mathematical truth (such as Tarski-truth (Steiner 2000)).
Indeed, Wittgenstein questions the intra-systemic and
extra-mathematical *usability* of *P* in various
discussions of Gödel in the *Nachlass* (Rodych 2002, 2003)
and, at (§19), he emphatically says that one cannot “make
the truth of the assertion [‘*P*’ or
“Therefore *P*”] plausible to me, since you can make
no use of it except to do these bits of legerdemain.”

After the initial, scathing reviews of *RFM*, very little
attention was paid to Wittgenstein's (*RFM* App. III) and
(*RFM* VII, §§21–22) discussions of Gödel's
First Incompleteness Theorem (Klenk 1976, 13) until Shanker's
sympathetic (1988b). In the last 11 years, however, commentators
and critics have offered various interpretations of
Wittgenstein's remarks on Gödel, some being largely
sympathetic (Floyd 1995, 2001) and others offering a more mixed
appraisal [(Rodych 1999a, 2002, 2003), (Steiner 2001), (Priest
2004), (Berto 2009a)]. Recently, and perhaps most interestingly, (Floyd &
Putnam 2000) and (Steiner 2001) have evoked new and interesting
discussions of Wittgenstein's ruminations on undecidability,
mathematical truth, and Gödel's First Incompleteness Theorem
[(Rodych 2003, 2006), (Bays 2004), (Sayward 2005), and (Floyd &
Putnam 2006)].

## 4. The Impact of Philosophy of Mathematics on Mathematics

Though it is doubtful that all commentators will agree [(Wrigley
1977, 51), (Baker and Hacker 1985, 345), (Floyd 1991, 145, 143;
1995, 376; 2005, 80), (Maddy 1993, 55), (Steiner 1996, 202–204)], the
following passage seems to capture Wittgenstein's
*attitude* to the Philosophy of Mathematics and, in large part,
the way in which he viewed his own work on mathematics.

What will distinguish the mathematicians of the future from those of today will really be a greater sensitivity, andthatwill—as it were—prune mathematics; since people will then be more intent on absolute clarity than on the discovery of new games.Philosophical clarity will have the same effect on the growth of mathematics as sunlight has on the growth of potato shoots. (In a dark cellar they grow yards long.)

A mathematician is bound to be horrified by my mathematical comments, since he has always been trained to avoid indulging in thoughts and doubts of the kind I develop. He has learned to regard them as something contemptible and… he has acquired a revulsion from them as infantile. That is to say, I trot out all the problems that a child learning arithmetic, etc., finds difficult, the problems that education represses without solving. I say to those repressed doubts: you are quite correct, go on asking, demand clarification! (

PG381, 1932)

In his middle and later periods, Wittgenstein believes he is providing
philosophical clarity on aspects and parts of mathematics, on
mathematical conceptions, and on philosophical conceptions of
mathematics. Lacking such clarity and not aiming for absolute clarity,
mathematicians construct new games, sometimes because of a
misconception of the *meaning* of their mathematical
propositions and mathematical terms. Education and especially advanced
education in mathematics does not encourage clarity but rather
represses it—questions that deserve answers are either not asked
or are dismissed. Mathematicians of the future, however, will be more
sensitive and this will (repeatedly) prune mathematical extensions and
inventions, since mathematicians will come to recognize that new
extensions and creations (e.g., propositions of transfinite cardinal
arithmetic) are not well-connected with the solid core of mathematics
or with real-world applications. Philosophical clarity will,
eventually, enable mathematicians and philosophers to “get down
to brass tacks” (*PG* 467).

## Bibliography

### Wittgenstein's Writings

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1913, “On Logic and How Not to Do
It,” The Cambridge Review 34 (1912–13), 351; reprinted
in Brian McGuinness, Wittgenstein: A Life, Berkeley
& Los Angeles, University of California Press: 169–170. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1922, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus,
London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1961; translated by D.F. Pears and
B.F. McGuinness. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1929, “Some Remarks on Logical
Form,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society,
Supplementary Vol. 9: 162–171. |

PI |
Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1953 [2001], Philosophical
Investigations, 3^{rd} Edition, Oxford: Blackwell
Publishing; translated by G. E. M. Anscombe. |

RFM |
Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1956 [1978], Remarks on the Foundations of
Mathematics, Revised Edition, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, G.H. von
Wright, R. Rhees and G.E.M. Anscombe (eds.); translated by G.E.M
Anscombe. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1966 [1999], Lectures & Conversations
on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief, Cyril Barrett,
(ed.), Oxford: Blackwell Publishers Ltd. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1967, Zettel, Berkeley: University of
California Press; G.E.M Anscombe and G.H. von Wright (Eds.); translated
by G.E.M. Anscombe. |

PG |
Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1974, Philosophical Grammar, Oxford:
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PR |
Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1975, Philosophical Remarks, Oxford:
Basil Blackwell; Rush Rhees, (ed.); translated by Raymond Hargreaves
and Roger White. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1979a, Notebooks 1914–1916, Second
Edition, G.H. von Wright and G. E. M. Anscombe (eds.), Oxford: Basil
Blackwell. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1979b, “Notes on Logic” (1913), in
Notebooks 1914–1916, G.H. von Wright and G.E.M. Anscombe
(eds.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1980, Remarks on the Philosophy of
Psychology, Vol. I, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, G.E.M.
Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, (eds.), translated by G.E.M.
Anscombe. |

• | Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 2000, Wittgenstein's Nachlass:
The Bergen Electronic Edition, Oxford: Oxford University
Press. |

### Notes on Wittgenstein's Lectures and Recorded Conversations

AWL |
Ambrose, Alice, (ed.), 1979, Wittgenstein's
Lectures, Cambridge 1932–35: From the Notes of Alice Ambrose
and Margaret Macdonald, Oxford: Basil Blackwell. |

LFM |
Diamond, Cora, (ed.), 1976, Wittgenstein's
Lectures on the Foundations of Mathematics, Ithaca, N.Y.:
Cornell University Press. |

LWL |
Lee, Desmond, (ed.), 1980, Wittgenstein's Lectures,
Cambridge 1930–32: From the Notes of John King and Desmond Lee,
Oxford: Basil Blackwell. |

WVC |
Waismann, Friedrich, 1979, Wittgenstein and the Vienna
Circle, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; edited by B.F. McGuinness;
translated by Joachim Schulte and B.F. McGuinness. |

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## Related Entries

Brouwer, Luitzen Egbertus Jan | Frege, Gottlob | mathematics, philosophy of: formalism | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | mathematics: constructive | private language | Russell, Bertrand | Wittgenstein, Ludwig | Wittgenstein, Ludwig: logical atomism