# Hermann Weyl

*First published Wed Sep 2, 2009; substantive revision Sun Feb 27, 2011*

Hermann Weyl was a great and versatile mathematician of the
20^{th} century. His work had a vast range, encompassing
analysis, algebra, number theory, topology, differential geometry,
spacetime theory, quantum mechanics, and the foundations of
mathematics. His scientific writing is informed by a rare literary
and artistic sensibility—in his words, “Expression and
shape mean almost more to me than knowledge itself”. He was
unusual among scientists and mathematicians of his time in being
attracted to idealist philosophy: his idealist leanings can be seen
particularly in his work on the foundations of mathematics. In his
youth, Kant's doctrines made a great impression on him; later he was
stirred both by Fichte's metaphysical idealism and by Husserlian
phenomenology. Although Weyl came to question the certainties claimed
by idealism, he cleaved always to the primacy of intuition he had
first learned from Kant, and to its expression by Fichte as the
“inner light” of individual consciousness.

- 1. Life and Achievements
- 2. Metaphysics
- 3. Work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics
- 4. Contributions to the Foundations of Physics
- 4.1 Spacetime Geometries and Weyl's Unified Field Theory
- 4.2 The Riemann-Helmholtz-Lie Problem of Space
- 4.3 Weyl's Causal-Inertial Method for determining the Spacetime Metric
- 4.4 The Laws of Motion, Mach's Principle, and Weyl's Cosmological Postulate
- 4.4.1 The Laws of Motion and Mach's Principle
- 4.4.2 Weyl's Critique of Einstein's Machian Ideas
- 4.4.3 Coordinate Transformation Laws of Acceleration
- 4.4.4 Weyl's Field-Body Relationist Ontology and Newton's Laws of Motion
- 4.4.5 Mie's Pure Field Theory, Weyl's ‘Agens Theory’ and Wormhole Theory of Matter
- 4.4.6 Relativistic Cosmology and Weyl's Postulate
- 4.4.7 Discovering Hubble's Law

- 4.5 Quantum Mechanics and Quantum Field Theory
- 4.5.1 Group Theory
- 4.5.2 Weyl's philosophical critique of Cartan's approach to geometry
- 4.5.3 Weyl's New Gauge Principle and Dirac's Special Relativistic Electron
- 4.5.4 Weyl's two-component Neutrino theory
- 4.5.5 The Theory of Groups and Quantum Mechanics
- 4.5.6 Weyl's Early Discussion of the Discrete Symmetries
**C**,**P**,**T**and**CPT** - 4.5.7 Weyl's Philosophical Views about Quantum Mechanics
- 4.5.8 Science as Symbolic Construction

- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Life and Achievements

Hermann Weyl was born on 9 November 1885 in the small town of Elmshorn near Hamburg. In 1904 he entered Göttingen University, where his teachers included Hilbert, Klein and Minkowski. Weyl was particularly impressed with Hilbert's lectures on number theory and resolved to study everything he had written. Hilbert's work on integral equations became the focus of Weyl's (1908) doctoral dissertation, written under Hilbert's direction. In this and in subsequent papers Weyl made important contributions to the theory of self-adjoint operators. Virtually all of Weyl's many publications during his stay in Göttingen until 1913 dealt with integral equations and their applications.

After Weyl's (1910b) habilitation, he became a Privatdozent and was
thereby entitled to give lectures at the University of
Göttingen. Weyl chose to lecture on Riemann's theory of
algebraic functions during the winter semester of 1911–12.
These lectures became the basis of Weyl's (1913) first book *Die
Idee der Riemannschen Fläche* (*The Concept of a Riemann
Surface*). This work, in which function theory, geometry and
topology are unified, constitutes the first modern and comprehensive
treatment of Riemann surfaces. The work also contains the first
construction of an abstract manifold. Emphasizing that the `points of
the manifold' can be quite arbitrary, Weyl based his definition of a
general two-dimensional manifold or surface on an extension of the
neighbourhood axioms that Hilbert (1902) had proposed for the
definition of a plane. The work is indicative of Weyl's exceptional
gift for harmoniously uniting into a coherent whole a patchwork of
distinct mathematical fields.

In 1913 Weyl was offered, and accepted, a professorship at the
Eidgenössische Technische Hochschule—ETH (Swiss Federal
Institute of Technology)—in Zürich. Weyl's years in
Zürich were extraordinarily productive and resulted in some of
his finest work, especially in the foundations of mathematics and
physics. When he arrived in Zürich in the fall of 1913, Einstein
and Grossmann were struggling to overcome a difficulty in their
effort to provide a coherent mathematical formulation of the general
theory of relativity. Like Hilbert, Weyl appreciated the importance
of a close relationship between mathematics and physics. It was
therefore only natural that Weyl should become interested in
Einstein's theory and the potential mathematical challenges it might
offer. Following the outbreak of the First World War, however, in May
1915 Weyl was called up for military service. But Weyl's academic
career was interrupted only briefly, since in 1916 he was exempted
from military duties for reasons of health. In the meantime Einstein
had accepted an offer from Berlin and had left Zürich in 1914.
Einstein's departure had weakened the theoretical physics program at
the ETH and (as reported by Frei and Stammbach (1992, 26) the
administration hoped that Weyl's presence would alleviate the
situation. But Weyl needed no external prompting to work in, and to
teach, theoretical physics: his interest in the subject in general
and, above all, in the theory of relativity, gave him more than
sufficient motivation in that regard. Weyl decided to lecture on the
general theory of relativity in the summer semester of 1917, and
these lectures became the basis of his famous book
*Raum-Zeit-Materie* (*Space-Time-Matter*) of 1918.

During 1917–24, Weyl directed his energies equally to the
development of the mathematical and philosophical foundations of
relativity theory, and to the broader foundations of mathematics. It
is in these two areas that his philosophical erudition, nourished
from his youth, manifests itself most clearly. The year 1918, the
same year in which *Space-Time-Matter* appeared, also saw the
publication of *Das Kontinuum* (*The Continuum*), a
work in which Weyl constructs a new foundation for mathematical
analysis free of what he had come to see as fatal flaws in the
set-theoretic formulation of Cantor and Dedekind. Soon afterwards
Weyl embraced Brouwer's mathematical intuitionism; in the early 1920s
he published a number of papers elaborating on and defending the
intuitionistic standpoint in the foundations of mathematics.

It was also during the first years of the 1920s that Weyl came to
appreciate the power and utility of group theory, initially in
connection with his work on the solution to the Riemann-Helmholtz-Lie
problem of space. Weyl analyzed this problem, the
*Raumproblem*, in a series of articles and lectures during the
period 1921–23. Weyl (1949b, 400) noted that his interest in
the philosophical foundations of the general theory of relativity had
motivated his analysis of the representations and invariants of the
continuous groups:

I can say that the wish to understand what really is the mathematical substance behind the formal apparatus of relativity theory led me to the study of the representations and invariants of groups; and my experience in this regard is probably not unique.

This newly acquired appreciation of group theory led Weyl to what he
himself considered his greatest work in mathematics, a general theory
of the representations and invariants of the classical Lie groups
(Weyl 1924a, 1924f, 1925, 1926a, 1926b, 1926c). Later Weyl (1939)
wrote a book, *The Classical Groups: Their Invariants and
Representations*, in which he returned to the theory of
invariants and representations of semisimple Lie groups. In this work
he realized his ambition “to derive the decisive results for
the most important of these groups by direct algebraic construction,
in particular for the full group of all non-singular linear
transformations and for the orthogonal group.”

Weyl applied his work in group theory and his earlier work in
analysis and spectral theory to the new theory of quantum mechanics.
Weyl's mathematical analysis of the foundations of quantum mechanics
showed that regularities in a physical theory are most fruitfully
understood in terms of symmetry groups. Weyl's (1928) book
*Gruppentheorie und Quantenmechanik* (*Group Theory and
Quantum Mechanics*) deals not only with the theory of quantum
mechanics but also with relativistic quantum electrodynamics. In this
work Weyl also presented a very early analysis of discrete symmetries
which later stimulated Dirac to predict the existence of the positron
and the antiproton.

During his years in Zürich Weyl received, and turned down,
numerous offers of professorships by other
universities—including an invitation in 1923 to become Felix
Klein's successor at Göttingen. It was only in 1930 that he
finally accepted the call to become Hilbert's successor there. His
second stay in Göttingen was to be brief. Repelled by Nazism,
“deeply revolted,,” as he later wrote, “by the
shame which this regime had brought to the German name,” he
left Germany in 1933 to accept an offer of permanent membership of
the newly founded Institute for Advanced Study in Princeton. Before
his departure for Princeton he published *The Open World*
(1932); his tenure there saw the publication of *Mind and
Nature* (1934), the aforementioned *The Classical Groups*
(1939), *Algebraic Theory of Numbers* (1940), *Meromorphic
Functions and Analytic Curves* (1943), *Philosophy of
Mathematics and Natural Science* (1949; an enlarged English
version of a 1927 work *Philosophie der Mathematik und
Naturwissenschaften*), and *Symmetry* (1952). In 1951 he
formally retired from the Institute, remaining as an emeritus member
until his death, spending half his time there and half in
Zürich. He died in Zürich suddenly, of a heart attack, on 9
December 1955.

## 2. Metaphysics

Weyl was first and foremost a mathematician, and certainly not a
“professional” philosopher. But as a German intellectual
of his time it was natural for him to regard philosophy as a pursuit
to be taken seriously. In Weyl's case, unusually even for a German
mathematician, it was idealist philosophy that from the beginning
played a significant role in his thought. Kant, Husserl, Fichte, and,
later, Leibniz, were at various stages major influences on Weyl's
philosophical thinking. As a schoolboy Weyl had been impressed by
Kant's “Critique of Pure Reason.” He was especially taken
with Kant's doctrine that space and time are not inherent in the
objects of the world, existing as such and independently of our
awareness, but are, rather, forms of our intuition As he reports in
Insight and Reflection, (Weyl 1955), his youthful enthusiasm for Kant
crumbled soon after he entered Göttingen University in 1904.
There he read Hilbert's Foundations of Geometry, a tour-de-force of
the axiomatic method, in comparison to which Kant's “bondage to
Euclidean geometry” now appeared to him naïve. After this
philosophical reverse he lapsed into an indifferent positivism for a
while. But in 1912 he found a new and exciting source of
philosophical enlightenment in Husserl's
phenomenology.^{[1]}
It was also at about this time that Fichte's metaphysical idealism
came to “capture his imagination.” Although Weyl later
questioned idealist philosophy, and became dissatisfied with
phenomenology, he remained faithful throughout his life to the
primacy of intuition that he had first learned from Kant, and to the
irreducibility of individual consciousness that had been confirmed in
his view by Fichte and Husserl.

Weyl never provided a systematic account of his philosophical views, and sorting out his overall philosophical position is no easy matter. Despite the importance of intuition and individual consciousness in Weyl's philosophical outlook, it would nevertheless be inexact to describe his outlook as being that of a “pure” idealist, since certain “realist” touches seem also to be present. Indeed his writings indicate that his metaphysics involves three elements, the first two of which may be considered “idealist”, and the third “realist”: these are, respectively, the Ego or “I”, the (Conscious) Other or “Thou”, and the external or “objective” world.

It is the first of these constituents, the Ego, to which Weyl ascribes primacy. Indeed, in Weyl's words,

The world exists only as met with by an ego, as one appearing to a consciousness; the consciousness in this function does not belong to the world, but stands out against the being as the sphere of vision, of meaning, of image, or however else one may call it. (Weyl 1934, 1)

The Ego alone has direct access to the given, that is, to the raw
materials of the existent which are presented to consciousness with
an immediacy at once inescapable and irreducible. The Ego is singular
in that, from its own standpoint, it is unique. But in an act of
self-reflection, through grasping (in Weyl's words) “what I am
for myself”, the Ego comes to recognize that it has a
*function*, namely as “conscious-existing carrier of the
world of phenomena.” It is then but a short step for the Ego to
transcend its singularity through the act of defining an
“ego” to be an entity performing that same function
*for itself*. That is, an ego is precisely what I am for
myself (in other words, what the Ego is for itself)—again a
“conscious-existing carrier of the world of
phenomena”—and yet *other* than myself.
“Thou” is the term the Ego uses to address, and so to
identify, an ego in this sense. “Thou” is thus the Ego
generalized, the Ego refracted through itself. The Ego grasps that it
exists within a world of Thous, that is, within a world of other Egos
similar to itself. While the Ego has, of necessity, no direct access
to any Thou, it can, through analogy and empathy, grasp what it is to
be Thou, a conscious being like oneself. By that very fact the Ego
recognizes in the Thou the same luminosity it sees in itself.

The relationship of the Ego with the external world, the realm of
“objective” reality, is of an entirely different nature.
There is no analogy that the Ego can draw—as it can with the
Thou—between itself and the external world, since that world
(presumably) lacks consciousness. The external world is radically
other, and opaque to the
Ego^{[2]}.
Like Kant's noumenal realm, the external world is outside the
immediacy of consciousness; it is, in a word, *transcendent*.
Since this transcendent world is not directly accessible to the Ego,
as far as the latter is concerned the existence of that world must
arise through *postulation*, “a matter of metaphysics,
not a judgment but an act of acknowledgment or
belief.”^{[3]}
Indeed, according to Weyl, it is not strictly necessary for the Ego
to postulate the existence of such a world, even given the existence
of a world of Thous:

For as long as I do not proceed beyond what is given, or, more exactly, what is given at the moment, there is no need for the substructure of an objective world. Even if I include memory and in principle acknowledge it as valid testimony, if I furthermore accept as data the contents of the consciousness of others on equal terms with my own, thus opening myself to the mystery of intersubjective communication, I would still not have to proceed as we actually do, but might ask instead for the ‘transformations’ which mediate between the images of the several consciousnesses. Such a presentation would fit in with Leibniz's monadology. (Weyl 1949, 117.)

But once the existence of the transcendent world is postulated, its
opacity to the Ego can be partly overcome by constructing a
representation of it through the use of *symbols*, the
procedure called by Weyl *symbolic construction*, (or
*constructive
cognition)*^{[4]}
and which he regarded as the cornerstone of scientific explanation.
He outlines the process as follows (Weyl 1934, 53):

- Upon that which is given, certain reactions are performed by which the given is in general brought together with other elements capable of being varied arbitrarily. If the results to be read from these reactions are found to be independent of the variable auxiliary elements they are then introduced as attributes inherent in the things themselves (even if we do not actually perform those reactions on which their meaning rests, but only believe in the possibility of their being performed).
- By the introduction of symbols, the judgements are split up and a part of the manipulations is made independent of the given and its duration by being shifted onto the representing symbols which are time resisting and simultaneously serve the purpose of preservation and communication. Thereby the unrestricted handling of notions arises in counterpoint to their application, ideas in a relatively independent manner confront reality.
- Symbols are not produced simply “according to demand” wherever they correspond to actual occurrences, but they are embedded into an ordered manifold of possibilities created by free construction and open towards infinity. Only in this way may we contrive to predict the future, for the future is not given actually.

Weyl's procedure thus amounts to the following. In step 1, a given
configuration is subjected to variation. One then identifies those
features of the configuration that remain unchanged under the
variation—the *invariant* features; these are in turn,
through a process of reification, deemed to be properties of an
unchanging substrate—the “things themselves”. It is
precisely the invariance of such features that renders them (as well
as the “things themselves”) capable of being represented
by the “time resisting” symbols Weyl introduces in step
2. As (written) symbols these are communicable without temporal
distortion and can be subjected to unrestricted manipulation without
degradation. It is the flexibility conferred thereby which enables
the use of symbols to be conformable with reality. Nevertheless (step
3) symbols are not haphazardly created in response to immediate
stimuli; they are introduced, rather, in a structured, yet freely
chosen manner which reflects the idea of an underlying
order—the “one real world”—about which not
everything is, or can be, known—it is, like the future,
“open towards infinity”. Weyl observes that the
reification implicit in the procedure of symbolic construction leads
inevitably to its iteration, for “the transition from step to
step is made necessary by the fact that the objects at one step
reveal themselves as manifestations of a higher reality, the reality
of the next step” (Weyl (1934), 32–33). But in the end
“systematic scientific explanation will finally reverse the
order: first it will erect its symbolical world by itself, without
any reference, then, skipping all intermediate steps, try to describe
which symbolical configurations lead to which data of
consciousness” (*ibid*.). In this way the symbolic world
becomes (mistakenly) identified with the transcendent world.

It is symbolic construction which, in Weyl's vision, allows us access
to the “objective” world presumed to underpin our
immediate perceptions; indeed, Weyl holds that the objective world,
being beyond the grasp (the “lighted circle”) of
intuition, can *only* be presented to us in symbolic
form^{[5]}.
We can see a double dependence on the Ego in Weyl's idea of symbolic
construction to get hold of an objective world beyond the mental. For
not only is that world “constructed” by the Ego, but the
materials of construction, the symbols themselves, as signs intended
to convey meaning, have no independent existence beyond their
graspability by a consciousness. By their very nature these symbols
cannot point directly to an external world (even given an unshakable
belief in the existence of that world) lying beyond consciousness.
Weyl's metaphysical triad thus reduces to what might be called a
*polarized dualism*, with the mental (I, Thou) as the primary,
independent pole and objective reality as a secondary, dependent
pole^{[6]}.

In his later years Weyl attempted to enlarge his metaphysical triad (I, Thou, objective world) to a tetrad, by a process of completion, as it were, to embrace the “godhead that lives in impenetrable silence”, the objective counterpart of the Ego, which had been suggested to him by his readings of Eckhart. But this effort remained uncompleted.

During his long philosophical voyage Weyl stopped at a number of
ports of call: in his youth, Kantianism and positivism; then
Husserlian phenomenological idealism; later Brouwerian intuitionism
and finally a kind of theological existentialism. But apart from his
brief flirtation with positivism (itself, as he says, the result of a
disenchantment with Kant's “bondage to Euclidean
geometry”), Weyl's philosophical orientation remained in its
essence idealist (even granting the significant realist elements
mentioned above). Nevertheless, while he continued to acknowledge the
importance of phenomenology, his remarks in *Insight and
Reflection* indicate that he came to regard Husserl's doctrine as
lacking in two essential respects: first, it failed to give due
recognition to the (construction of) transcendent external world,
with which Weyl, in his capacity as a natural scientist, was
concerned; secondly, and perhaps in Weyl's view even more seriously,
it failed to engage with the enigma of selfhood: the fact that I am
the person I am. Grappling with the first problem led Weyl to
identify symbolic construction as providing sole access to objective
reality, a position which brought him close to Cassirer in certain
respects; while the second problem seems to have led him to
existentialism and even, through his reading of Eckhart, to a kind of
religious mysticism.

## 3. Work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics

Towards the end of his *Address on the Unity of Knowledge*,
delivered at the 1954 Columbia University bicentennial celebrations,
Weyl enumerates what he considers to be the essential constituents of
knowledge. At the top of his
list^{[7]}
comes

…intuition, mind's ordinary act of seeing what is given to it. (Weyl 1954, 629)

In particular Weyl held to the view that intuition, or
*insight*—rather than *proof*—furnishes the
ultimate foundation of *mathematical* knowledge. Thus in his
*Das Kontinuum* of 1918 he says:

In the Preface to Dedekind (1888) we read that “In science, whatever is provable must not be believed without proof.” This remark is certainly characteristic of the way most mathematicians think. Nevertheless, it is a preposterous principle. As if such an indirect concatenation of grounds, call it a proof though we may, can awaken any “belief” apart from assuring ourselves through immediate insight that each individual step is correct. In all cases, this process of confirmation—and not the proof—remains the ultimate source from which knowledge derives its authority; it is the “experience of truth”. (Weyl 1987, 119)

Weyl's idealism naturally inclined him to the view that the ultimate
basis of his own subject, mathematics, must be found in the
intuitively given as opposed to the transcendent. Nevertheless, he
recognized that it would be unreasonable to require all mathematical
knowledge to possess intuitive immediacy. In *Das Kontinuum*,
for example, he says:

The states of affairs with which mathematics deals are, apart from the very simplest ones, so complicated that it is practically impossible to bring them into full givenness in consciousness and in this way to grasp them completely. (Ibid., 17)

Nevertheless, Weyl felt that this fact, inescapable as it might be,
could not justify extending the bounds of mathematics to embrace
notions, such as the actual infinite, which cannot be given fully in
intuition even in principle. He held, rather, that such extensions of
mathematics into the transcendent are warranted only by the fact that
mathematics plays an indispensable role in the physical sciences, in
which intuitive evidence is necessarily transcended. As he says in
The Open
World^{[8]}:

… if mathematics is taken by itself, one should restrict oneself with Brouwer to the intuitively cognizable truths … nothing compels us to go farther. But in the natural sciences we are in contact with a sphere which is impervious to intuitive evidence; here cognition necessarily becomes symbolical construction. Hence we need no longer demand that when mathematics is taken into the process of theoretical construction in physics it should be possible to set apart the mathematical element as a special domain in which all judgments are intuitively certain; from this higher standpoint which makes the whole of science appear as one unit, I consider Hilbert to be right. (Weyl 1932, 82).

In *Consistency in Mathematics* (1929), Weyl characterized the
mathematical method as

the a priori construction of the possible in opposition to the a posteriori description of what is actually given.^{[9]}

The problem of identifying the limits on constructing “the
possible” in this sense occupied Weyl a great deal. He was
particularly concerned with the concept of the mathematical
*infinite*, which he believed to elude
“construction” in the naive set-theoretical sense
^{[10]}.
Again to quote a passage from *Das Kontinuum:*

No one can describe an infinite set other than by indicating properties characteristic of the elements of the set…. The notion that a set is a “gathering” brought together by infinitely many individual arbitrary acts of selection, assembled and then surveyed as a whole by consciousness, is nonsensical; “inexhaustibility” is essential to the infinite. (Weyl 1987, 23)

But still, as Weyl attests towards the end of *The Open
World*, “the demand for totality and the metaphysical
belief in reality inevitably compel the mind to represent the
infinite as closed being by symbolical construction”. The
conception of the completed infinite, even if nonsensical, is
inescapable.

### 3.1 *Das Kontinuum*

Another mathematical “possible” to which Weyl gave a
great deal of thought is the *continuum*. During the period
1918–1921 he wrestled with the problem of providing the
mathematical continuum—the real number line—with a
logically sound formulation. Weyl had become increasingly critical of
the principles underlying the set-theoretic construction of the
mathematical continuum. He had come to believe that the whole
set-theoretical approach involved vicious
circles^{[11]}
to such an extent that, as he says, “every cell (so to speak)
of this mighty organism is permeated by contradiction.” In
*Das Kontinuum* he tries to overcome this by providing
analysis with a *predicative* formulation—not, as
Russell and Whitehead had attempted, by introducing a hierarchy of
logically ramified types, which Weyl seems to have regarded as
excessively complicated—but rather by confining the
comprehension principle to formulas whose bound variables range over
just the initial given entities (numbers). Accordingly he restricts
analysis to what can be done in terms of natural numbers with the aid
of three basic logical operations, together with the operation of
substitution and the process of “iteration”, i.e.,
primitive recursion. Weyl recognized that the effect of this
restriction would be to render unprovable many of the central results
of classical analysis—e.g., Dirichlet's principle that any
bounded set of real numbers has a least upper
bound^{[12]}—but
he was prepared to accept this as part of the price that must be paid
for the security of mathematics.

As Weyl saw it, there is an unbridgeable gap between intuitively
given continua (e.g. those of space, time and motion) on the one
hand, and the “discrete” exact concepts of mathematics
(e.g. that of natural
number^{[13]})
on the other. The presence of this chasm meant that the construction
of the mathematical continuum could not simply be “read
off” from intuition. It followed, in Weyl's view, that the
mathematical continuum must be treated as if it were an element of
the transcendent realm, and so, in the end, justified in the same way
as a physical theory. It was not enough that the mathematical theory
be *consistent*; it must also be *reasonable*.

*Das Kontinuum* embodies Weyl's attempt at formulating a
theory of the continuum which satisfies the first, and, as far as
possible, the second, of these requirements. In the following
passages from this work he acknowledges the difficulty of the task:

… the conceptual world of mathematics is so foreign to what the intuitive continuum presents to us that the demand for coincidence between the two must be dismissed as absurd. (Weyl 1987, 108)

… the continuity given to us immediately by intuition (in the flow of time and of motion) has yet to be grasped mathematically as a totality of discrete “stages” in accordance with that part of its content which can be conceptualized in an exact way. (

Ibid., 24)^{[14]}Exact time- or space-points are not the ultimate, underlying atomic elements of the duration or extension given to us in experience. On the contrary, only reason, which thoroughly penetrates what is experientially given, is able to grasp these exact ideas. And only in the arithmetico- analytic concept of the real number belonging to the purely formal sphere do these ideas crystallize into full definiteness. (

Ibid., 94)When our experience has turned into a real process in a real world and our phenomenal time has spread itself out over this world and assumed a cosmic dimension, we are not satisfied with replacing the continuum by the exact concept of the real number, in spite of the essential and undeniable inexactness arising from what is given. (

Ibid., 93)

As these quotations show, Weyl had come to accept that it was in
principle impossible to furnish the continuum as presented to
intuition with an exact mathematical formulation : so, with
reluctance, he lowered his sights. In *Das Kontinuum* his goal
was, first and foremost, to establish the *consistency* of the
mathematical theory of the continuum by putting the
*arithmetical* notion of real number on a firm logical basis.
Once this had been achieved, he would then proceed to show that this
theory is *reasonable* by employing it as the foundation for a
plausible account of continuous process in the objective physical
world.^{[15]}

In §6 of *Das Kontinuum* Weyl presents his conclusions as
to the relationship between the intuitive and mathematical
continua. He poses the question: Does the mathematical
framework he has erected provide an adequate representation of
physical or temporal continuity as it is *actually
experienced*? In posing this question we can see the continuing
influence of Husserl and phenomenological doctrine. Weyl begins his
investigation by noting that, according to his theory, if one asks
whether a given function is continuous, the answer is not fixed once
and for all, but is, rather, dependent on the extent of the domain of
real numbers which have been defined up to the point at which the
question is posed. Thus the continuity of a function must always
remain *provisional*; the possibility always exists that a
function deemed continuous *now* may, with the emergence of
“new” real numbers, turn out to be discontinuous *in
the future*.
^{[16]}

To reveal the discrepancy between this formal account of continuity based on real numbers and the properties of an intuitively given continuum, Weyl next considers the experience of seeing a pencil lying on a table before him throughout a certain time interval. The position of the pencil during this interval may be taken as a function of the time, and Weyl takes it as a fact of observation that during the time interval in question this function is continuous and that its values fall within a definite range. And so, he says,

This observation entitles me to assert that during a certain period this pencil was on the table; and even if my right to do so is not absolute, it is nevertheless reasonable and well-grounded. It is obviously absurd to suppose that this right can be undermined by “an expansion of our principles of definition”—as if new moments of time, overlooked by my intuition could be added to this interval, moments in which the pencil was, perhaps, in the vicinity of Sirius or who knows where. If the temporal continuum can be represented by a variable which “ranges over” the real numbers, then it appears to be determined thereby how narrowly or widely we must understand the concept “real number” and the decision about this must not be entrusted to logical deliberations over principles of definition and the like. (Weyl 1987, 88)

To drive the point home, Weyl focuses attention on the fundamental
continuum of *immediately given phenomenal time*, that is, as
he characterizes it,

… to that constant form of my experiences of consciousness by virtue of which they appear to me to flow by successively. (By “experiences” I mean what I experience, exactly as I experience it. I do not mean real psychical or even physical processes which occur in a definite psychic-somatic individual, belong to a real world, and, perhaps, correspond to the direct experiences.) (Ibid., 88)

In order to correlate mathematical concepts with phenomenal time in
this sense Weyl grants the possibility of introducing a rigidly
punctate “now” and of identifying and exhibiting the
resulting temporal points. On the collection of these temporal points
is defined the relation of *earlier than* as well as a
congruence relation of *equality of temporal intervals*, the
basic constituents of a simple mathematical theory of time. Now Weyl
observes that the discrepancy between phenomenal time and the concept
of real number would vanish if the following pair of conditions could
be shown to be satisfied:

- The immediate expression of the intuitive finding that during
a certain period I saw the pencil lying there were construed in such a
way that the phrase “during a certain period” was replaced
by “in every temporal point which falls within a certain time
span OE”. [Weyl goes on to say parenthetically here that he admits
“that this no longer reproduces what is intuitively present, but
one will have to let it pass,
*if it is really legitimate to dissolve a period into temporal points*.”) - If
*P*is a temporal point, then the domain of rational numbers to which*l*belongs if and only if there is a time point*L*earlier than*P*such that*OL = l.OE*can be constructed arithmetically in pure number theory on the basis of our principles of definition, and is therefore a real number in our sense. (

*Ibid*., 89)

Condition 2 means that, if we take the time span *OE* as a
unit, then each temporal point *P* is correlated with a
definite real number. In an addendum Weyl also stipulates the
converse.

But can temporal intuition itself provide evidence for the truth or falsity of these two conditions? Weyl thinks not. In fact, he states quite categorically that

… everything we are demanding here is obvious nonsense: to these questions, the intuition of time provides no answer—just as a man makes no reply to questions which clearly are addressed to him by mistake and, therefore, are unintelligible when addressed to him. (Ibid., 90)

The grounds for this assertion are by no means immediately evident,
but one gathers from the passages following it that Weyl regards the
experienced *continuous flow* of phenomenal time as
constituting an insuperable barrier to the whole enterprise of
representing the continuum as experienced in terms of individual
points, and even to the characterization of “individual
temporal point” itself. As he says,

The view of a flow consisting of points and, therefore, also dissolving into points turns out to be mistaken: precisely what eludes us is the nature of the continuity, the flowing from point to point; in other words, the secret of how the continually enduring present can continually slip away into the receding past. Each one of us, at every moment, directly experiences the true character of this temporal continuity. But, because of the genuine primitiveness of phenomenal time, we cannot put our experiences into words. So we shall content ourselves with the following description. What I am conscious of is for me both a being-now and, in its essence, something which, with its temporal position, slips away. In this way there arises the persisting factual extent, something ever new which endures and changes in consciousness. (Ibid., 91–92)

Weyl sums up what he thinks can be affirmed about “objectively
presented time”—by which he presumably means
“phenomenal time described in an objective
manner”—in the following two assertions, which he claims
apply equally, mutatis mutandis, to every intuitively given
continuum, in particular, to the continuum of spatial extension.
(*Ibid*., 92):

- An individual point in it is non-independent, i.e., is pure nothingness when taken by itself, and exists only as a “point of transition” (which, of course, can in no way be understood mathematically);
- It is due to the essence of time (and not to contingent imperfections in our medium) that a fixed temporal point cannot be exhibited in any way, that always only an approximate, never an exact determination is possible.

The fact that single points in a true continuum “cannot be
exhibited” arises, Weyl asserts, from the fact that they are
not genuine individuals and so cannot be characterized by their
properties. In the physical world they are never defined absolutely,
but only in terms of a coordinate system, which, in an arresting
metaphor, Weyl describes as “the unavoidable residue of the
eradication of the ego.” This metaphor, which Weyl was to
employ more than
once^{[17]},
again reflects the continuing influence of phenomenological doctrine
in his thinking : here, the thesis that the existent is given in the
first instance as the contents of a consciousness.

### 3.2 Weyl and Brouwerian Intuitionism

By 1919 Weyl had come to embrace Brouwer's views on the intuitive
continuum. Given the idealism that always animated Weyl's thought,
this is not surprising, since Brouwer assigned the thinking subject a
central position in the creation of the mathematical
world^{[18]}.

In his early thinking Brouwer had held that that the continuum is
presented to intuition as a whole, and that it is impossible to
construct all its points as individuals. But later he radically
transformed the concept of “point”, endowing points with
sufficient fluidity to enable them to serve as generators of a
“true” continuum. This fluidity was achieved by admitting
as “points”, not only fully defined discrete numbers such
as 1/9, *e*, and the like—which have, so to speak,
already achieved “being”—but also
“numbers” which are in a perpetual state of
“becoming” in that the entries in their decimal (or
dyadic) expansions are the result of free acts of choice by a subject
operating throughout an indefinitely extended time. The resulting
choice sequences cannot be conceived as finished, completed objects:
at any moment only an initial segment is known. Thus Brouwer obtained
the mathematical continuum in a manner compatible with his belief in
the primordial intuition of time—that is, as an unfinished, in
fact unfinishable entity in a perpetual state of growth, a
“medium of free development”. In Brouwer's vision, the
mathematical continuum is indeed “constructed”, not,
however, by initially shattering, as did Cantor and Dedekind, an
intuitive continuum into isolated points, but rather by assembling it
from a complex of continually changing overlapping parts.

Brouwer's impact looms large in Weyl's 1921 paper, On the New Foundational Crisis of Mathematics. Here Weyl identifies two distinct views of the continuum: “atomistic” or “discrete”; and “continuous”. In the first of these the continuum is composed of individual real numbers which are well-defined and can be sharply distinguished. Weyl describes his earlier attempt at reconstructing analysis in Das Kontinuum as atomistic in this sense:

Existential questions concerning real numbers only become meaningful if we analyze the concept of real number in this extensionally determining and delimiting manner. Through this conceptual restriction, an ensemble of individual points is, so to speak, picked out from the fluid paste of the continuum. The continuum is broken up into isolated elements, and the flowing-into-each other of its parts is replaced by certain conceptual relations between these elements, based on the “larger-smaller” relationship. This is why I speak of theatomisticconception of the continuum. (Weyl 1921, 91)

By this time Weyl had repudiated atomistic theories of the continuum,
including that of Das
Kontinuum.^{[19]}
While intuitive considerations, together with Brouwer's influence,
must certainly have fuelled Weyl's rejection of such theories, it
also had a logical basis. For Weyl had come to regard as meaningless
the formal procedure—employed in Das Kontinuum—of
negating universal and existential statements concerning real numbers
conceived as developing sequences or as sets of rationals. This had
the effect of undermining the whole basis on which his theory had
been erected, and at the same time rendered impossible the very
formulation of a “law of excluded middle” for such
statements. Thus Weyl found himself espousing a
position^{[20]}
considerably more radical than that of Brouwer, for whom negations of
quantified statements had a perfectly clear constructive meaning,
under which the law of excluded middle is simply not generally
affirmable.

Of existential statements Weyl says:

An existential statement—e.g., “there is an even number”—is not a judgement in the proper sense at all, which asserts a state of affairs; existential states of affairs are the empty invention of logicians. (Weyl [1921], 97)

Weyl termed such pseudostatements “judgment abstracts”, likening them, with typical literary flair, to “a piece of paper which announces the presence of a treasure, without divulging its location.” Universal statements, although possessing greater substance than existential ones, are still mere intimations of judgments, “judgment instructions”, for which Weyl provides the following metaphorical description:

If knowledge be compared to a fruit and the realization of that knowledge to the consumption of the fruit, then a universal statement is to be compared to a hard shell filled with fruit. It is, obviously, of some value, however, not as a shell by itself, but only for its content of fruit. It is of no use to me as long as I do not open it and actually take out a fruit and eat it. (Ibid., 98)

Above and beyond the claims of logic, Weyl welcomed Brouwer's
construction of the continuum by means of sequences generated by free
acts of choice, thus identifying it as a “medium of free
Becoming” which “does not dissolve into a set of real
numbers as finished entities”. Weyl felt that Brouwer, through
his doctrine of
Intuitionism^{[21]},
had come closer than anyone else to bridging that “unbridgeable
chasm” between the intuitive and mathematical continua. In
particular, he found compelling the fact that the Brouwerian
continuum is not the union of two disjoint nonempty parts—that
it is, in a word, indecomposable. “A genuine continuum,”
Weyl says, “cannot be divided into separate
fragments.”^{[22]}
In later publications he expresses this more colourfully by quoting
Anaxagoras to the effect that a continuum “defies the chopping
off of its parts with a hatchet.”

Weyl also agreed with Brouwer that all functions everywhere defined
on a continuum are continuous, but here certain subtle differences of
viewpoint emerge. Weyl contends that what mathematicians had taken to
be discontinuous functions actually consist of several continuous
functions defined on separated continua.In Weyl's view, for example,
the “discontinuous” function defined by
*f*(*x*) = for *x* < and
*f*(*x*) = 1 for *x* ≥ in fact consists of
the *two* functions with constant values and 1 respectively
defined on the separated continua {*x*: *x* < 0} and
{*x*: *x* ≥ 0}. (The union of these two continua
fails to be the whole of the real continuum because of the failure of
the law of excluded middle: it is not the case that, for be any real
number *x*, either *x* < or *x* ≥ 0.)
Brouwer, on the other hand, had not dismissed the possibility that
discontinuous functions could be defined on proper parts of a
continuum, and still seems to have been searching for an appropriate
way of formulating this
idea.^{[23]}
In particular, at that time Brouwer would probably have been inclined
to regard the above function *f* as a genuinely discontinuous
function defined on a proper part of the real continuum. For Weyl, it
seems to have been a self-evident fact that all functions defined on
a continuum are continuous, but this is because Weyl confines
attention to functions which turn out to be continuous by definition.
Brouwer's concept of function is less restrictive than Weyl's and it
is by no means immediately evident that such functions must always be
continuous.

Weyl defined real functions as mappings correlating each interval in the choice sequence determining the argument with an interval in the choice sequence determining the value “interval by interval” as it were, the idea being that approximations to the input of the function should lead effectively to corresponding approximations to the input. Such functions are continuous by definition. Brouwer, in contrast, considers real functions as correlating choice sequences with choice sequences, and the continuity of these is by no means obvious. The fact that Weyl refused to grant (free) choice sequences—whose identity is in no way predetermined—sufficient individuality to admit them as arguments of functions betokens a commitment to the conception of the continuum as a “medium of free Becoming” even deeper, perhaps, than that of Brouwer.

There thus being only minor differences between Weyl's and Brouwer's accounts of the continuum, Weyl accordingly abandoned his earlier attempt at the reconstruction of analysis, and joined Brouwer. He explains:

I tried to find solid ground in the impending state of dissolution of the State of analysis (which is in preparation, although still only recognized by few)without forsaking the order on which it is founded, by carrying out its fundamental principle purely and honestly. And I believe I was successful—as far as this is possible. Forthis order is itself untenable, as I have now convinced myself, and Brouwer—that is the revolution!… It would have been wonderful had the old dispute led to the conclusion that the atomistic conception as well as the continuous one can be carried through. Instead the latter triumphs for good over the former. It is Brouwer to whom we owe the new solution of the continuum problem. History has destroyed again from within the provisional solution of Galilei and the founders of the differential and the integral calculus. (Weyl 1921, 98–99)

Weyl's initial enthusiasm for intuitionism seems later to have waned.
This may have been due to a growing belief on his part that the
mathematical sacrifices demanded by adherence to intuitionistic
doctrine (e.g., the abandonment of the least upper bound principle,
and other important results of classical analysis) would prove to be
intolerable to practicing mathematicians. Witness this passage from
*Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science*:

Mathematics with Brouwer gains its highest intuitive clarity. He succeeds in developing the beginnings of analysis in a natural manner, all the time preserving the contact with intuition much more closely than had been done before. It cannot be denied, however, that in advancing to higher and more general theories the inapplicability of the simple laws of classical logic eventually results in an almost unbearable awkwardness. And the mathematician watches with pain the greater part of his towering edifice which he believed to be built of concrete blocks dissolve into mist before his eyes. (Weyl [1949], 54)

Nevertheless, it is likely that Weyl remained convinced to the end of his days that intuitionism, despite its technical “awkwardness”, came closest, of all mathematical approaches, to capturing the essence of the continuum.

### 3.3 Weyl and Hilbert

Weyl's espousal of the intuitionistic standpoint in the foundations of mathematics in 1920–21 inevitably led to friction with his old mentor Hilbert. Hilbert's conviction had long been that there were in principle no limitations on the possibility of a full scientific understanding of the natural world, and, analogously, in the case of mathematics, that once a problem was posed with the required precision, it was, at least in principle, soluble. In 1904 he was moved to respond to Emil du Bois-Reymond's famous declaration concerning the limits of science, ignoramus et ignorabimus (“we are ignorant and we shall remain ignorant”):

We hear within us the perpetual call. There is the problem. Seek the solution. You can find it by pure reason, for in mathematics there is no ignorabimus.^{[24]}

Hilbert was unalterably opposed to any restriction of mathematics
“by decree”, an obstacle he had come up against in the
early stages of his career in the form of Leopold Kronecker's (the
influential 19^{th} century German mathematician)
anathematization of all mathematics venturing beyond the finite. In
Brouwer's intuitionistic program—with its draconian
restrictions on what was admissible in mathematical argument, in
particular, its rejection of the law of excluded middle,
“pure” existence proofs, and virtually the whole of
Cantorian set theory—Hilbert saw the return of Kroneckerian
constaints on mathematics (and also, perhaps, a trace of du
Bois-Reymond's “ignorabimus”) against which he had
struggled for so long. Small wonder, then, that Hilbert was upset
when Weyl joined the Brouwerian
camp.^{[25]}

Hilbert's response was to develop an entirely new approach to the
foundations of mathematics with the ultimate goal of establishing
beyond doubt the consistency of the whole of classical mathematics,
including arithmetic, analysis, and Cantorian set theory. With the
attainment of that goal, classical mathematics would be placed
securely beyond the destructive reach of the intuitionists. The core
of Hilbert's program was the translation of the whole apparatus of
classical mathematical demonstration into a simple, finitistic
framework (which he called “metamathematics”) involving
nothing more, in principle, than the straightforward manipulation of
symbols, taken in a purely formal sense, and devoid of further
meaning.^{[26]}
Within metamathematics itself, Hilbert imposed a standard of
demonstrative evidence stricter even than that demanded by the
intuitionists, a form of finitism rivalling (ironically) that of
Kronecker. The demonstration of the consistency of classical
mathematics was then to be achieved by showing, within the
constraints of strict finitistic evidence insisted on by Hilbert,
that the formal metamathematical counterpart of a classical proof in
that system can never lead to an assertion evidently false, such as
= 1.

Hilbert's program rested on the insight that, *au fond*, the
only part of mathematics whose reliability is entirely beyond
question is the *finitistic*, or *concrete* part: in
particular, finite manipulation of surveyable domains of distinct
objects including mathematical symbols presented as marks on paper.
Mathematical propositions referring only to concrete objects in this
sense Hilbert called *real*, *concrete*, or
*contentual* propositions, and all other mathematical
propositions he distinguished as possessing an *ideal*, or
*abstract* character. (Thus, for example, 2 + 2 = 4 would
count as a real proposition, while *there exists an odd perfect
number* would count as an ideal one.) Hilbert viewed ideal
propositions as akin to the ideal lines and points “at
infinity” of projective geometry. Just as the use of these does
not violate any truths of the “concrete” geometry of the
usual Cartesian plane, so he hoped to show that the use of ideal
propositions—even those of Cantorian set theory—would
never lead to falsehoods among the real propositions, that, in other
words, such use *would never contradict any self-evident fact
about concrete objects*. Establishing this by strictly concrete,
and so unimpeachable means was thus the central aim of Hilbert's
program. Hilbert may be seen to have followed Kant in attempting to
ground mathematics on the apprehension of spatiotemporal
configurations; but Hilbert restricted these configurations to
concrete signs (such as inscriptions on paper). Hilbert regarded
consistency as the touchstone of existence, and so for him the
important thing was the fact that no inconsistencies can arise within
the realm of concrete signs, since correct descriptions of concrete
objects are always mutually compatible. In particular, within the
realm of concrete signs, actual infinity cannot generate
inconsistencies since, again along with Kant, he held that this
concept cannot correspond to any concrete object. Hilbert's view
seems accordingly to have been that the formal soundness of
mathematics issues ultimately, not from a *logical* source,
but from a *concrete*
one^{[27]},
in much the same way as the consistency of truly reported empirical
statements is guaranteed by the concreteness of the external
world^{[28]}.

Weyl soon grasped the significance of Hilbert's program, and came to
acknowledge its “immense significance and
scope”^{[29]}.
Whether that program could be successfully carried out was, of
course, still an open question. But independently of this issue Weyl
was concerned about what he saw as the loss of content resulting from
Hilbert's thoroughgoing formalization of mathematics. “Without
doubt,” Weyl warns, “if mathematics is to remain a
serious cultural concern, then some *sense* must be attached
to Hilbert's game of formulae.” Weyl thought that this sense
could only be supplied by “fusing” mathematics and
physics so that “the mathematical concepts of number, function,
etc. (or Hilbert's symbols) generally partake in the theoretical
construction of reality in the same way as the concepts of energy,
gravitation, electron,
etc.”^{[30]}
Indeed, in Weyl's view, “it is the function of mathematics to
be at the service of the natural sciences”. But still:

The propositions of theoretical physics… lack that feature which Brouwer demands of the propositions of mathematics, namely, that each should carry within itself its own intuitively comprehensible meaning…. Rather, what is tested by confronting theoretical physics with experience is the system as a whole. It seems that we have to differentiate between phenomenal knowledge or insight—such as is expressed in the statement: “This leaf (given to me in a present act of perception) has this green color (given to me in this same perception)”—and theoretical construction. Knowledge furnishes truth, its organ is “seeing” in the widest sense. Though subject to error, it is essentially definitive and unalterable. Theoretical construction seems to be bound only to one strictly formulable rational principle, concordance, which in mathematics, where the domain of sense data remains untouched, reduces to consistency; its organ is creative imagination. (Weyl 1949, 61–62)

Weyl points out that, just as in theoretical physics, Hilbert's account of mathematics “already… goes beyond the bounds of intuitively ascertainable states of affairs through… ideal assumptions.” (Weyl 1927, 484.) If Hilbert's realm of contentual or “real” propositions—the domain of metamathematics—corresponds to that part of the world directly accessible to what Weyl terms “insight” or “phenomenal knowledge”, then “serious” mathematics—the mathematics that practicing mathematicians are actually engaged in doing—corresponds to Hilbert's realm of “ideal” propositions. Weyl regarded this realm as the counterpart of the domain generated by “symbolic construction”, the transcendent world focussed on by theoretical physics. Hence his memorable characterization:

The set-theoretical approach is the stage of naive realism which is unaware of the transition from the given to the transcendent. Brouwer represents idealism, by demanding the reduction of all truth to the intuitively given. In [Hilbert's] formalism, finally, consciousness makes the attempt to “jump over its own shadow”, to leave behind the stuff of the given, to represent the transcendent—but, how could it be otherwise?, only through the symbol. (Weyl 1949, 65–66)

In Weyl's eyes, Hilbert's approach embodied the “symbolic
representation of the transcendent, which demands to be
satisfied”, and so he regarded its emergence as a natural
development. But by 1927 Weyl saw Hilbert's doctrine as beginning to
prevail over intuitionism, and in this an adumbration of *“a
decisive defeat of the philosophical attitude of pure
phenomenology*, which thus proves to be insufficient for the
understanding of creative science even in the area of cognition that
is most primal and most readily open to
evidence—mathematics.”^{[31]}
Since by this time Weyl had become convinced that “creative
science” must *necessarily* transcend what is
phenomenologically given, he had presumably already accepted that
pure phenomenology is incapable of accounting for theoretical
physics, let alone the whole of existence. But it must have been
painful for him to concede the analogous claim in the case of
*mathematics*. In 1932, he asserts: “If mathematics is
taken by itself, one should restrict oneself with Brouwer to the
intuitively cognizable truths … nothing compels us to go
farther.” If mathematics could be “taken by
itself”, then there would be no need for it to justify its
practices by resorting to “symbolic construction”, to
employ symbols which in themselves “signify
nothing”—nothing, at least, accessible to intuition. But,
unlike Brouwer, Weyl seems finally to have come to terms with the
idea that mathematics could not simply be “taken by
itself”, that it has a larger role to play in the world beyond
its service as a paradigm, however pure, of subjective certainty.

The later impact of Gödel's incompleteness theorems on Hilbert's
program led Weyl to remark in
1949:^{[32]}

The ultimate foundations and the ultimate meaning of mathematics remain an open problem; we do not know in what direction it will find its solution, nor even whether a final objective answer can be expected at all. “Mathematizing” may well be a creative activity of man, like music, the products of which not only in form but also in substance defy complete objective rationalization. The undecisive outcome of Hilbert's bold enterprise cannot fail to affect the philosophical interpretation. (Weyl 1949, 219)

The fact that “Gödel has left us little hope that a
formalism wide enough to encompass classical mathematics will be
supported by a proof of consistency” seems to have led Weyl to
take a renewed interest in “axiomatic systems developed before
Hilbert without such ambitious dreams”, for example Zermelo's
set theory, Russell's and Whitehead's ramified type theory and
Hilbert's own axiom systems for geometry (as well, possibly, as
Weyl's own system in *Das Kontinuum*, which he modestly fails
to mention). In one of his last papers, *Axiomatic Versus
Constructive Procedures in Mathematics*, written sometime after
1953, he saw the battle between Hilbertian formalism and Brouwerian
intuitionism in which he had participated in the 1920s as having
given way to a “dextrous blending” of the axiomatic
approach to mathematics championed by Bourbaki and the algebraists
(themselves mathematical descendants of Hilbert) with constructive
procedures associated with geometry and topology.

It seems appropriate to conclude this account of Weyl's work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics by allowing the man himself to have the last word:

This history should make one thing clear: we are less certain than ever about the ultimate foundations of (logic and) mathematics; like everybody and everything in the world today, we have our “crisis”. We have had it for nearly fifty years. Outwardly it does not seem to hamper our daily work, and yet I for one confess that it has had a considerable practical influence on my mathematical life: it directed my interests to fields I considered relatively “safe”, and it has been a constant drain on my enthusiasm and determination with which I pursued my research work. The experience is probably shared by other mathematicians who are not indifferent to what their scientific endeavours mean in the contexts of man's whole caring and knowing, suffering and creative existence in the world. (Weyl 1946, 13)

## 4. Contributions to the Foundations of Physics

### 4.1 Spacetime Geometries and Weyl's Unified Field Theory

Weyl's clarification of the role of coordinates, invariance or symmetry principles, his important concept of gauge invariance, his group-theoretic results concerning the uniqueness of the Pythagorean form of the metric, his generalization of Levi-Civita's concept of parallelism, his development of the geometry of paths, his discovery of the causal-inertial method which prepared the way to empirically determine the spacetime metric in a non-circular, non-conventional manner, his deep analysis of the concept of motion and the role of Mach's Principle, are but a few examples of his important contributions to the philosophical and mathematical foundations of modern spacetime theory.

Weyl's book, *Raum-Zeit-Materie*, beautifully exemplifies the
fruitful and harmonious interplay of mathematics, physics and
philosophy. Here Weyl aims at a mathematical and philosophical
elucidation of the problem of space and time in general. In the
preface to the great classical work of 1923, the fifth German
edition, after mentioning the importance of mathematics to his work,
Weyl says:

Despite this, the book does not disavow its basic, philosophical orientation: its central focus isconceptual analysis; physics provides the experiential basis, mathematics the sharp tools. In this new edition, this tendency has been further strengthened; although the growth of speculation was trimmed, the supporting foundational ideas were more intuitively, more carefully and more completely developed and analyzed.

#### 4.1.1 Weyl's metric-independent construction of the symmetric linear connection

Extending and abstracting from Gauss's treatment of curved surfaces
in Euclidian space, Riemann constructed an infinitesimal geometry of
*n*-dimensional manifolds. The coordinate assignments
*x*^{k}(*p*) [*k* ∈ {1, … ,
*n*}] of the points *p* in such an *n*-dimensional
Riemannian manifold are quite arbitrary, subject only to the
requirement of arbitrary differential coordinate
transformations.^{[33]}
Riemann's assumption that in an infinitesimal neighbourhood of a
point, Euclidean geometry and hence Pythagoras's theorem holds, finds
its formal expression in Riemann's equation

ds^{2}= ∑_{i,j}g_{ij}(x^{k}(p))dx^{i}dx^{j}[whereg_{ij}(x^{k}(p)) =g_{ji}(x^{k}(p))](1)

for the square of the length *ds* of an infinitesimal line
element that leads from the point *p* = *x*(*p*) =
(*x*^{1}(*p*), … ,
*x*^{n}(*p*)) to an arbitrary infinitely
near point *p*′ = *x*(*p*′) =
(*x*^{1}(*p*) +
*d**x*^{1}(*p*), … ,
*x*^{n}(*p*) +
*d**x*^{n}(*p*)).

The assumption that Euclidean geometry holds in the infinitesimally
small means that the *d**x*^{i}(*p*)
transform *linearly *under arbitrary coordinate
transformations. Using the *Einstein summation*
*convention*^{[34]},
equation (1) can simply be written as

ds^{2}=g_{ij}(x^{k}(p))dx^{i}dx^{j}.(2)

Riemann assumed the validity of the Pythagorean metric only in the
infinitely small. Riemannian geometry is essentially a geometry of
infinitely near points and conforms to the requirement that all laws
are to be formulated as *field* laws. Field laws are
*close-action-laws *which relate the field magnitudes only to
infinitesimally neighbouring points in
space.^{[35]}
The value of some field magnitude at each point depends only on the
values of other field magnitudes in the infinitesimal neighbourhoods
of the corresponding points. The field magnitudes consist of partial
derivatives of position functions at some point, and this requires
the knowledge of the behavior of the position functions only with
respect to the neighbourhood of that point. To construct a field law,
only the behavior of the world in the infinitesimally small is
required.^{[36]}

Riemann's ideas were brought to a concrete realization fifty years
later in Einstein's general theory of relativity. The basic idea
underlying the general theory of relativity was Einstein's
recognition that the metric field, which has such powerful real
effects on matter, cannot be a rigid once and for all given geometric
structure of the spacetime, but must itself be something real, that
not only has effects on matter, but is in turn also affected by
matter. Riemann had already suggested that analogous to the
electromagnetic field, the metric field reciprocally interacts with
matter. Einstein came to this idea of reciprocity between matter and
field independently of Riemann, and in the context of his theory of
general relativity, applied this principle of reciprocity to four
dimensional spacetime. Thus Einstein could adopt Riemann's
infinitesimal geometry with the important difference: given the
causal requirements of Einstein's theory of special relativity,
Riemann's quadratic form is not positive definite but indefinite; it
has signature
1.^{[37]}
Weyl (1922a) says:

All our considerations until now were based on the assumption, that the metric structure of space is something that is fixed and given. Riemann already pointed to another possibility which was realized through General Relativity. The metrical structure of the extensive medium of the external world is a field of physical reality, which is causally dependent on the state of matter.

And in another place Weyl (1918b) remarks:

The metric is not a property of the world [spacetime] in itself, rather spacetime as a form of appearance is a completely formless four-dimensional continuum in the sense of analysis situs, but the metric expresses something real, something which exists in the world, which exerts through centrifugal and gravitational forces physical effects on matter, and whose state is conversely conditioned through the distribution and nature of matter.

After Einstein applied Riemannian geometry to his theory of general
relativity, Riemannian geometry became the focus of intense research.
In particular, G. Ricci and T. Levi-Civita's so-called *Absolute
Differential Calculus* developed and clarified the Riemannian
notions of an *affine connection *and *covariant
differentiation*. The decisive step in this development, however,
was T. Levi-Civita's discovery in 1917 of the concept of
*infinitesimal parallel* *vector displacement*, and the
fact that such parallel vector displacement is uniquely determined by
the metric field of Riemannian geometry. Levi-Civita's construction
of infinitesimal parallel transport on a manifold required the
process of embedding the manifold into a flat higher-dimensional
metric space. In 1918, Weyl generalized Levi-Civita's concept of
parallel transport by means of an *intrinsic *construction
that does not require the process of such an embedding, and is
therefore independent of a metric. Weyl's intrinsic construction
results in a *metric-independent, symmetric linear
connection*. Weyl simply referred to the latter as
*affine*
*connection*.^{[38]}

Weyl defines what he means by an *affine connection *in the
following way: A point *p* on the manifold *M* is affinely
connected with its immediate neighborhood, if and only of for every
tangent vector *v*_{p} at *p*, a tangent
vector *v*_{q} at *q* is determined to which
the tangent vector *v*_{p} gives rise under
parallel displacement from *p* to the infinitesimally
neighboring point *q*. This definition merely says that a
manifold is affinely connected if it admits the process of
infinitesimal parallel displacement of a vector.

Weyl's next definition characterizes the *essential nature *of
infinitesimal parallel displacement. The definition says that at any
arbitrary point of the manifold there exists a *geodesic
coordinate system *such that the components of any vector at that
point are not altered by an infinitesimal parallel displacement with
respect to it. This is a geometrical way of expressing Einstein's
requirement that the gravitational field can always be made to vanish
locally. According to Weyl (1923b, 115), it characterizes the
*nature *of an affine connection on the manifold. A manifold
which is an affine manifold is homogeneous in this sense. Moreover,
manifolds do not exist whose affine structure is of a different
*nature*.

The transport of a tangent vector *v*_{p} at
*p* to an infinitesimally nearby point *q* results in the
tangent vector *v*_{q} at *q*, namely,

v_{q}=v_{p}+dv_{p}.(3)

This infinitesimal tangent vector transport Weyl defines as
*infinitesimal parallel displacement *if and only if there
exists a coordinate system *x*, called a *geodesic coordinate system*
for the neighborhood of *p*, relative to which the transported
tangent vector *v*_{q} at *q*
possesses the same components as the original tangent vector *v*_{p} at *p*; that is,

viq−vip=dvip= 0.(4)

Figure 1: Parallel transport in a geodesic coordinate system x |

For an arbitrary coordinate system *x* the components
*d**v**i**p* vanish whenever *v**i**p* or
*d**x**i**p* vanish. Consequently,
*d**v**i**p* is *bi-linear *in
*v**i**p* and *d**x**i**p*;
that is,

dvip= −Γijk(x^{i}(p))vjpdxkp,(5)

where, in the case of four dimensions, the 4^{3} = 64
coefficients Γ*i**jk*(*x*^{i}(*p*))
are coordinate functions, that is, functions of
*x*^{i}(*p*) (*i* = 1, … , 4),
and the minus sign is introduced to agree with convention.

Figure 2: Parallel transport in an arbitrary coordinate system x |

It is important to understand that there is no intrinsic notion of
infinitesimal parallel displacement on a differentiable manifold. A
notion of “parallelism” is not something that a manifold
would possess merely by virtue of being a smooth manifold; additional
structure has to be introduced which resides on the manifold and
which permits the notion of infinitesimal parallelism. A manifold is
an “affine manifold” (M, Γ) if in addition to its
manifold structure (differential topological structure) it is also
endowed with an affine structure Γ that assigns to each of its
points 64 coefficients Γ*i**jk*(*x*^{i}(*p*))
satisfying the symmetry condition Γ*i**jk*(*x*^{i}(*p*))
= Γ*i**kj*(*x*^{i}(*p*)).

An *n*-dimensional manifold *M*, which is an affinely
connected manifold, Weyl (1918b) interprets physically as an
*n*-dimensional world (spacetime) filled with a gravitational
field. Weyl says, “…the affine connection appears in
physics as the *gravitational field*…” Since
there exists at each spacetime point a geodesic coordinate system in
which the components Γ*i**jk* of the symmetric linear
connection vanish, the gravitational field can be made to vanish at
each point of the manifold.

The *classical theory of physical geometry*, developed by
Helmholtz, Poincaré and Hilbert, regarded the concept of
“metric congruence” as the only basic relation of
geometry, and constructed physical geometry from this one notion
alone in terms of the relative positions and displacements of
physical congruence standards. Although Einstein's general theory of
relativity championed a *dynamical view* *of spacetime
geometry *that is very different from the *classical theory of
physical geometry*, Einstein initially approached the problem of
the structure of spacetime from the metrical point of view. It was
Weyl (1923b) who emphasized and developed the metric-independent
construction of the symmetric linear connection and who pointed out
the rationale for doing so. In both the non-relativistic and
relativistic contexts, it is the symmetric linear connection, and not
the metric, which plays the essential role in the formulation of all
physical laws that are expressed in terms of differential equations.
It is the symmetric linear connection that relates the state of a
system at a spacetime point to the states at neighboring spacetime
events and enters into the differentials of the corresponding
magnitudes. In both Newtonian physics and the theory of general
relativity, all dynamical laws presuppose the projective and affine
structure and hence the Law of Inertia. In fact, the whole of tensor
analysis with its covariant derivatives is based on the affine
concept of infinitesimal *parallel displacement *and *not
*on the metric.

Weyl's metric independent construction not only led to a deeper understanding of the mathematical characterization of gravity, it also prepared the way for new constructions and generalizations in differential geometry and the general theory of relativity. In particular, it led to

- The development of the
*geometry of paths*, first introduced by Weyl in 1918. - Weyl's discovery of the
*causal-inertial method*which prepared the way to empirically determine the spacetime metric in a non-circular, non-conventional manner. - Weyl's generalization of Riemannian geometry in his attempt to unify gravity and electromagnetism.
- Weyl's introduction of the concept of gauge in the context of his attempt to unify gravity and electromagnetism.

For more detail on Weyl's metric independent construction of the affine connection (linear symmetric connection), see the supplement.

#### 4.1.2 Projective Geometry or the Geometry of Paths

Weyl's metric-independent construction of the affine structure led to
the development of differential *projective* geometries or the
*geometries of paths. *The interest in projective geometry is
in the *paths*, that is, in the continuous set of points of
the *image set of curves*, rather than in the possible
parameter descriptions of curves. A curve has one degree of freedom;
it depends on one parameter, and its image set or path is a
one-dimensional continuous set of points of the manifold. One
represents a *curve *on a manifold *M* as a smooth map
(i.e., *C*^{∞}) γ from some open interval
*I* = (−ϵ, ϵ) of the real line ℝ into
*M*.

Figure 3: A curve on the manifold *M* is the smooth map γ
: *I* ⊂ ℝ → *M*

It is important to understand that what one means by a
“curve” is the map (the parametric description) itself,
and *not *the set of its image points, the path. Consequently,
two curves are mathematically considered to be different curves if
they are given by different maps (different parameter descriptions),
*even if their image set, that is, their* *path, is the
same*. If we change a curve's parameter description we change the
curve but not its image set (its path), the points it passes through.
A path is therefore sometimes defined as an equivalence class of
curves under arbitrary parameter transformations. Hence, projective
geometry may be defined as an equivalence class of affine geometries.

A geodesic curve in *flat space* is a straight line. Its
tangent at one point is parallel to the tangent at previous or
subsequent points. A straight line in Euclidean space is the only
curve that parallel-transports its own tangent vector. This notion of
parallel transport of the tangent vector also characterizes geodesic
curves in *curved space*. That is, a curve γ in curved
space, which parallel-transports its own tangent vector along all of
its points, is called a *geodesic *curve. Given a manifold
with an affine structure and some arbitrary local coordinate system,
the coordinate functions (components) γ^{i} of a
geodesic curve γ satisfy the second-order non-linear
differential equations

+ Γ

d^{2}γ^{i}ds^{2}ijk

dγ^{j}ds= 0.

dγ^{k}ds(6)

One may characterize the *projective geometry *Π on an
affine manifold either in terms of an equivalence class of geodesic
curves under arbitrary parameter
diffeomorphisms^{[39]},
thereby eliminating all the parameter descriptions and hence all
possible notions of distance along the curves satisfying
(6),^{[40]}
or one may take the process of *autoparallelism of directions
*as fundamental in defining a projective structure.

Figure 4: A path ξ is an equivalence class [γ] of curves under all parameter diffeomorphisms μ: ℝ → ℝ; λ ↦ μ(λ)

Weyl took the latter approach. According to Weyl, the infinitesimal
process of parallel displacements of vectors contains, as a special
case, the infinitesimal displacement of a *direction* into its
own *direction*. Such an infinitesimal autoparallelism of
*directions* is characteristic of the projective structure of
an affinely connected manifold.

Infinitesimal Autoparallelism of a Direction:

Aninfinitesimal autoparallelism of a directionRat an arbitrary pointpconsists in the parallel displacement ofRatpto a neighbouring pointp′ which lies in the directionRatp.

A curve is geodesic if and only if its *tangent direction
**R* experiences infinitesimal autoparallelism when moved
along all the points of the curve. This characterization of a
geodesic curve constitutes an abstraction from affine geometry.
Through this abstraction, a geodesic curve is definable exclusively
in terms of autoparallelism of tangent *directions *, and not
tangent *vectors*. Roughly speaking, an affine geometry is
essentially a projective geometry with the notion of distance defined
along the curves. By eliminating all possible notion of distance
along curves, or equivalently, all the parameter descriptions of the
curves, one abstracts the projective geometry form affine geometry.

As mentioned above, a projective geometry Π may be defined as an
equivalence class of affine geometries, that is, an equivalence class
of *projectively related *affine connections [Γ]. Weyl
presented the details of his approach to projective geometry, which
uses the notion of *autoparallelism of direction*, in a set of
lectures delivered in Barcelona and Madrid in the spring of 1922
(Weyl (1923a); see also Weyl (1921c)). Weyl began with the following
necessary and sufficient condition for the invariance of the
projective structure Π under a transformation Γ →Γ of the affine
structure:

Projective Transformation:

A transformation Γ →Γ preserves the projective structure Π of a manifold with an affine structure Γ, and is called aprojective transformation, if and only if

(Γ − Γ) ijkv^{j}v^{k}∝v^{i},(7) where

v^{i}is an arbitrary vector.

Weyl's definition says that a change in the affine structure of the
manifold *M* preserves the projective structure Π of *M*
if the vectors *v**i**q* and *v**i**q* at
*q* that result from the vector *v**i**p* at
*p* by parallel transport under Γ and Γ respectively,
differ at most in length but not in
direction.^{[41]}

A spacetime manifold *M* is a “projective manifold”
(M, Π) if in addition to its manifold structure (differential
topological structure) it is also endowed with a projective structure
Π that assigns to each of its manifold points 64 coefficients
Π*i**jk*(*x*^{i}(*p*))
satisfying certain symmetry
conditions.^{[42]}
These projective coefficients characterize the equivalence class
[Γ] of projectively equivalent connections, that is,
connections equivalent under the *projective transformation*
(7).

In physical spacetime the projective structure has an immediate
intuitive significance according to Weyl. The real world is a
non-empty spacetime filled with an inertial-gravitational field,
which Weyl calls the *guiding field*
(*F**ü**hrungsfeld*)^{[43]}.
It is an indubitable fact, according to Weyl (1923a, 13), that a body
which is let free in a certain spacetime direction (time-like
direction) carries out a uniquely determined natural motion from
which it can only be diverted through an external force. The process
of autoparallelism of direction appears, thus, as the tendency of
persistence of the spacetime direction of a free particle whose
motion is governed by, what Weyl calls the *guiding field
*(*F**ü**hrungsfeld*). This natural
motion occurs on the basis of an effective infinitesimal tendency of
persistence, which parallelly displaces the spacetime direction
*R* of a body at an arbitrary point *p* on its trajectory
to a neighbouring point *p*′ that lies in the direction
*R* at *p*.

If external forces exert themselves on a body, then a motion results which is determined through the conflict between the tendency of persistence due to the guiding field and the force. The tendency of persistence of the guiding field is a type of constraining guidance, which the inertial-gravitational field exerts on every body. Weyl (1923b, 219) says:

Galilei's inertial law shows, that there exists a type of constraining guidance in the

world[spacetime] which imposes on a body that is let free in some definite world direction a unique natural motion from which it can only be diverted through external forces; this occurs on the basis of an effective infinitesimal tendency of persistence from point to point, whichauto-parallellytransfers the world directionrof the body at an arbitrary pointPto an infinitesimally close neighboring pointP′, that lies in the directionratP.

#### 4.1.3 Conformal Geometry, Weyl Geometry, and Weyl's Unified Field Theory

Shortly after the completion of the general theory of relativity in
1915, Einstein, Weyl and others began to work on a unified field
theory. It was natural to assume at that
time^{[44]}
that this task would only involve the unification of gravity and
electromagnetism. In Einstein's geometrization of gravity, the
Newtonian gravitational potential and the Newtonian gravitational
force are respectively replaced by the components of the metric
tensor *g*_{ij}(*x*) and the components of
the symmetric linear connection Γ*i**jk*(*x*). In the general
theory of relativity the gravitational field is thus accounted for in
terms of the curvature of spacetime, but the electromagnetic field
remains completely unrelated to the spacetime geometry. Einstein's
mathematical formulation of his theory of general relativity does
not, however, provide room for the geometrization of the other long
range force field, the electromagnetic
field.^{[45]}
It was therefore natural to ask whether nature's only two long range
fields of force have a common origin. Consequently, it was quite
natural to suggest that the electromagnetic field might also be
ascribed to some property of spacetime, instead of being merely
something embedded in spacetime. Since, however, the components
*g*_{ij}(*x*) of the metric tensor are
already sufficiently determined by Einstein's field equations, this
would require setting up a more general differential geometry than
the one which underlies Einstein's theory, in order to make room for
incorporating electromagnetism into spacetime geometry. Such a
generalized differential geometry would describe both long range
forces, and a new theory based on this geometry would constitute a
unified field theory of electromagnetism and gravitation.

In 1918, Weyl proposed such a theory. In Weyl (1918a, 1919a) and in
the third edition (1920) of *Raum-Zeit-Materie*, Weyl
presented his ingenious attempt to unify gravitation and
electromagnetism by constructing a gauge-invariant geometry (see
below), or what he called a *purely infinitesimal
‘metric’ geometry*. Since the conformal structure
*C* (see below) of spacetime does not determine a unique
symmetric linear connection Γ but only an equivalence class K =
[Γ] of *conformally equivalent symmetric linear
connections*, Weyl was able to show that this degree of freedom
in a conformal structure of spacetime provides just enough room for
the geometrization of the electromagnetic potentials. The resulting
geometry, called a *Weyl geometry*, is an intermediate
geometric structure that lies between the conformal and Riemannian
structures.^{[46]}

The metric tensor field that is locally described by

ds^{2}=g_{ij}(x(p))dx^{i}dx^{j},(8)

is characteristic of a Riemannian geometry. That geometry requires of
the symmetric linear connection Γ that the infinitesimal
parallel transport of a vector always preserves the length of the
vector. Therefore, the metric field in Riemannian geometry determines
a unique symmetric linear connection, a “metric
connection” that satisfies the length-preserving condition of
parallel transport. This means that the metric field, locally
represented by (8), is invariant under parallel transport. The
coefficients of this unique symmetric linear *metric
*connection are given by

Γ ijk=

1 2 g^{ir}(g_{rj, k}+g_{kr, j}−g_{jk, r}).(9)

If *v*_{p} is a vector at p ∈ M, its length
is given by

| v_{p}|^{2}=g_{ij}(x(p))vipvjp.(10)

Moreover, the angle between two vectors *v*_{p}
and *w*_{p} at p ∈ M is given by

cos θ = .

g_{ij}(x(p))vipwjp| v_{p}||w_{p}|(11)

While in Riemannian geometry the parallel transport of length is
*path independent*, that is, it is possible to compare the
lengths of any two vectors, even if they are located at two finitely
different points, a vector suffers a *path-dependent *change
in *direction *under parallel transport; that is, it is not
possible to define the angle between two vectors, located at
different points, in a path-independent way. Consequently, the angle
between two vectors at a given point is invariant under parallel
transport if and only if both vectors are transported *along the
same path*. In particular, a vector which is carried around a
closed circuit by a continual parallel displacement back to the
starting point, will have the same length, but will not in general
return to its initial direction.

Figure 5: The parallel transport of a vector by a
two-dimensional creature, from A → B
→ C → A around a geodesic triangle on a
two-dimensional surface S^{2}, ends up pointing in a
different direction upon returning to A. |

For a closed loop which circumscribes an infinitesimally small
portion of space, the rotation of the vector per unit area
constitutes the measure of the local curvature of space.
Consequently, whether or not finite parallel displacement of
direction is *integrable*, that is, path-independent, depends
on whether or not the curvature tensor vanishes.

According to Weyl, Riemannian geometry, is not a pure or genuine
*infinitesimal *differential (metric) geometry, since it
permits the comparison of length at a finite distance. In his seminal
1918 paper entitled *Gravitation und*
*Elektrizit**ä**t *(*Gravitation and
Electricity*) Weyl (1918a) says:

However, in the Riemannian geometry described above, there remains a last distant-geometric [ferngeometrisches] element—without any sound reason, as far as I can see; the only cause of this appears to be the development of Riemannian geometry from the theory of surfaces. The metric permits the comparison of length of two vectors not only at the same point, but also at any arbitrarily separated points.

A true near-geometry (Nahegeometrie), however, may recognizeonly a principle of transferring a length at a point to an infinitesimal neighbouring point, and then it is no more reasonable to assume that the transfer of length from a point to a finitely distant point is integrable, then it was to assume that the transfer of direction is integrable.

Weyl wanted a metric geometry which would not permit *distance
comparison of length *between two vectors located at finitely
different points. In a *pure infinitesimal geometry*, Weyl
argued, if attention is restricted to a single point of the manifold,
then some standard of length or *gauge *must be chosen
arbitrarily before the lengths of vectors can be determined.
Therefore, all that is intrinsic to the notion of a pure
infinitesimal metric differential geometry is the ability to
determine the *ratios of the lengths *of any two vectors and
the angle between any two vectors, *at a point*. Such a pure
*infinitesimal *metric manifold must have at least a
*conformal *structure *C*.

The defining characteristic of a conformal spacetime structure is given by the equation

0 = ds^{2}=g_{ij}(x(p))dx^{i}dx^{j},(12)

which determines the light cone at *p*. A gauge transformation
of the metric is a map

g_{ij}(x(p)) → λ(x(p))g_{ij}(x(p)) =g_{ij}(x(p)),

which preserves the metric up to a positive and smooth but otherwise
arbitrary scalar factor or gauge function
λ(*x*(*p*)). In the case of a pseudo-Riemannian
structure such a gauge transformation leaves the light cones
unaltered. The angle between two vectors at *p* is given by
(11). Clearly, the gauge transformation g_{ij}(*x*(*p*)) =
λ(*x*(*p*))*g*_{ij}(*x*(*p*))
is angle preserving, that is, conformal. Two metrics which are
related by a conformal gauge transformation are called
*conformally equivalent. *A conformal structure does not
determine the length of any one vector at a point. Only the relative
lengths, the ratio of lengths, of any two vectors
|*v*_{p}| / |*w*_{p}| is
determined.

Weyl exploited these features of the conformal structure, and
suggested that given a conformal structure, a *gauge *could be
chosen at each point in a smooth but otherwise arbitrary manner, such
that the metric (8) at any point of the manifold is conventional or
undetermined to the extent that the metric

ds^{2}= λ(x(p))g_{ij}(x(p))dx^{i}dx^{j}(13)

is equally valid.

However, a conformal structure by itself does not determine a unique
symmetric linear connection; it only determines an equivalence class
of conformally equivalent connections K = [Γ], namely
connections which preserve the conformal structure *C* during
parallel transport. The difference between any two conformally
equivalent symmetric linear connections Γ*i**jk*, Γ*i**jk*
∈ [Γ] is given by

Γ ijk− Γijk=(δ

1 2 ijθ_{k}+ δikθ_{j}−g_{jk}g^{ir}θ_{r}),(14)

where

θ _{j}(x(p))dx^{j}(15)

is an arbitrary one-form field.

Since the conformal structure determines only an equivalence class of
conformally equivalent symmetric linear connections K = [Γ],
the affine connection in this type of geometry is not uniquely
determined, and the parallel transport of vectors is not generally
well defined. Moreover, the ratio of the lengths of two vectors
located at different points is not determined even in a
path-dependent way. According to Weyl, it is a fundamental principle
of infinitesimal geometry that the metric structure on a manifold
*M* determines a unique affine structure on *M*. As was
pointed out earlier, this principle is satisfied in Riemannian
geometry where the metric determines a unique symmetric linear
connection, namely, the metric connection according to (9). Evidently
this fundamental principle of infinitesimal geometry is not satisfied
for a structure which is merely a conformal structure, since the
conformal structure only determines an equivalence class of
conformally equivalent symmetric connections. Weyl showed that
besides the conformal structure an additional structure is required
in order to determine a unique symmetric linear connection from the
equivalence class K = [Γ] of conformally equivalent symmetric
linear connections. Weyl showed that this additional structure is
provided by the *length connection *or *gauge field
**A*_{j} that governs the *congruent
displacement of lengths*. Weyl called this additional structure
the “metric connection” on a manifold; however, we shall
use the term “length connection” instead, in order to
avoid confusion with the modern usage of the term “metric
connection”, which today denotes the symmetric linear
connection that is uniquely determined by a Riemannian metric tensor
according to (9).

Weyl's Length Connection:

A pointpislength connectedwith its infinitesimal neighborhood, if and only if for every length atp, there is determined at every pointqinfinitesimally close topa length to which the length atpgives rise when it iscongruentlydisplaced fromptoq.

This definition merely says that a manifold is “length connected” if it admits the process of infinitesimal congruent displacement of length. The only condition imposed on the concept of congruent displacement of length is the following:

Congruent Displacement of Length:

With respect to a choice of gauge for a neighborhood ofp, the transport of a lengthl_{p}atpto an infinitesimally neighboring pointqconstitutes acongruentdisplacement if and only if there exists a choice of gauge for the neighborhood ofprelative to which the transported lengthl_{q}has the same value asl_{p}; that is

l_{q}−l_{p}=dl_{p}= 0.(16)

Weyl called such a gauge at *p* a *geodesic gauge *at
*p*.^{[47]}
Weyl's proof of the following theorem closely parallels the proof of
theorem A.3 in
the supplement on Weyl's metric independent construction of the affine connection.

Theorem:

If for every pointpin a neighborhoodUofM, there exists a choice of gauge such that the change in an arbitrary length atpunder congruent displacement to an infinitesimally near pointqis given by

dl_{p}= 0,(17) then locally with respect to any other choice of gauge,

dl= −lA_{j}(x(p))dx^{j},(18) and conversely.

Making use of

dvip= −Γ ijk(x(p))vjpdx^{k}l_{p}= g_{ij}(x(p))vipvjpdl_{p}= − l_{p}A_{j}x(p)dx^{j}

Weyl (1923a, 124–125) shows that the conformal structure
supplemented with the structure of a *length connection *or
*gauge field* *A*_{j}(*x*) singles
out a unique connection from the equivalence class K = [Γ] of
conformally equivalent
connections.^{[48]}
This unique connection, which is called the *Weyl connection*,
is given by

Γ ijk=

1 2 g^{ir}(g_{rj, k}+g_{kr, j}−g_{jk, r}) +

1 2 g^{ir}(g_{rj}A_{k}+g_{kr}A_{j}−g_{jk}A_{r})=

1 2 g^{ir}(g_{rj, k}+g_{kr, j}−g_{jk, r}) +(δ

1 2 ijA_{k}+ δikA_{j}−g_{jk}g^{ir}A_{r}),(19)

which is analogous to (14). The first term of the Weyl connection is identical to the metric connection (9) of Riemannian geometry, whereas the second term represents what is new in a Weyl geometry. The Weyl connection is invariant under the gauge transformation

g_{ij}(x)= e^{θ(x)}g_{ij}(x)A_{j}(x)= A_{j}(x) − ∂_{j}θ(x),(20)

where the gauge function is λ(*x*) =
*e*^{θ(x)}. Thus, a conformal structure
plus *length connection *or *gauge field*
*A*_{j}(*x*) determines a *Weyl geometry
*equipped with a unique *Weyl connection*. Therefore, the
fundamental principle of infinitesimal geometry also holds in a Weyl
geometry; that is, the metric structure of a Weyl geometry determines
a unique affine connection, namely, the Weyl connection.

In Weyl's physical interpretation of his purely infinitesimal metric
geometry (Weyl geometry), the gauge field
*A*_{j}(*x*) is identified with the
electromagnetic four potential, and the electromagnetic field tensor
is given by

F_{jk}(x) = ∂_{j}A_{k}(x) − ∂_{k}A_{j}(x).(21)

A spacetime that is formally characterizable as a Weyl geometry,
would not only have a *curvature of direction*
(*Richtungskr**ü**mmung*) but would also
have a *curvature of length
*(*Streckenkr**ü**mmung*). Because of
the latter property the formal characterization of the congruent
displacement of length would be non-integrable, that is,
path-dependent, in a Weyl geometry.

Figure 6: In a Weyl geometry parallel displacement of a vector along different paths not only changes its direction but also its length |

Suppose physical spacetime corresponds to a Weyl geometry. Then two
identical clocks *A* and *B* at an event *p* with a
common unit of time, that is, a timelike vector of given length
*l*_{p}, which are separated and moved along
different world lines to an event *q*, will not only differ with
respect to the elapsed time (first clock effect (i.e., relativistic
effect)), but in general the clocks will differ with respect to their
common unit of time (rate of ticking) at *q* (second clock
effect). That is, congruent time displacement in a Weyl geometry is
such that two congruent time intervals at *p* will not in
general be congruent at *q*, when congruently displaced in
parallel along different world lines from *p* to *q*, that
is, *l**A**q* ≠ *l**B**q*.
This means that a twin who travels to a distant star and then returns
to earth would not only discover that the other twin on earth had
aged much more, but also that all the clocks on earth tick at a
different rate. Hence, in the presence of a non-vanishing
electromagnetic field *F*_{jk}(*x*) the
clock rates will not in general be the same; that is, there will be a
second clock effect in addition to the relativistic effect (first
clock effect). Thus, *l**A**q* = *l**B**q* if
and only if the curl of *A*_{j}(*x*)
vanishes, that is, if and only if the electromagnetic field tensor
*F*_{jk}(*x*) vanishes, namely,

F_{jk}(x) = ∂_{j}A_{k}(x) − ∂_{k}A_{j}(x) = 0.

In that case the second term of the Weyl connection vanishes and (19) reduces to the metric connection (9) of Riemannian geometry.

In a Weyl geometry there are no ideal absolute “meter
sticks” or “clocks”. For example, the rate at which
any clock measures time is a function of its history. However, as
Einstein pointed out in a *Nachtrag *(addendum) to Weyl
(1918a), it is precisely this situation which suggests that Weyl's
geometry conflicts with experience. In Weyl's geometry, the frequency
of the spectral lines of atomic clocks would depend on the location
and past histories of the atoms. But experience indicates otherwise.
The spectral lines are well-defined and sharp; they appear to be
independent of an atom's history. Atomic clocks define units of time,
and experience shows they are integrably transported. Thus, if we
assume that the atomic time and the gravitational standard time are
identical, and that the gravitational standard time is determined by
the Weyl geometry, then the electromagnetic field tensor is zero. But
if that is the case, then a Weyl geometry reduces to the standard
Riemannian geometry that underlies general relativity, since the
vanishing of Weyl's *Streckenkr**ü**mmung
*(*length curvature*) is necessary and sufficient for the
existence of a Riemannian metric *g*_{ij}. When
quantum theory was developed a few years later it became clear that
Weyl's theory was in conflict with experience in an even more
fundamental way since there is a direct relation between clock rates
and masses of particles in quantum theory. A particle with a certain
rest mass *m* possesses a natural frequency which is a function
of its rest mass, the speed of light *c*, and Planck's constant
*h*. This means that in a Weyl geometry not only clocks would
depend on their histories but also the masses of particles. For
example, if two protons have different histories then they would also
have different masses in a Weyl geometry. But this violates the
quantum mechanical principle that particles of the same kind—in
this case, protons—have to be exactly identical.

However, in 1918 it was still possible for Weyl to defend his theory in the following way. In response to Einstein's criticism Weyl noted that atoms, clocks and meter sticks are complex objects whose real behavior in arbitrary gravitational and electromagnetic fields can only be inferred from a dynamical theory of matter. Since no detailed and reliable dynamical models were available at that time, Weyl could argue that there is no reason to assume that, for example, clock rates are correctly modelled by the length of a timelike vector. Weyl (1919a, 67) said:

At first glance it might be surprising that according to the purely close-action geometry, length transfer is non-integrable in the presence of an electromagnetic field. Does this not clearly contradict the behaviour of rigid bodies and clocks? The behaviour of these measurement instruments, however, is a physical process whose course is determined by natural laws and as such has nothing to do with the ideal process of ‘congruent displacement of spacetime distance’ that we employ in the mathematical construction of the spacetime geometry. The connection between the metric field and the behaviour of rigid rods and clocks is already very unclear in the theory of Special Relativity if one does not restrict oneself to quasi-stationary motion. Although these instruments play an indispensable role in praxis as indicators of the metric field, (for this purpose, simpler processes would be preferable, for example, the propagation of light waves), it is clearly incorrect to

definethe metric field through the data that are directly obtained from these instruments.

Weyl elaborated this idea by suggesting that the dynamical nature of
such time keeping systems was such that they continually *adapt
*to the spacetime structure in such a way that their rates remain
constant. He distinguished between quantities that remain constant as
a consequence of such *dynamical adjustment*, and quantities
that remain constant by *persistence *because they are
isolated and undisturbed. He argued that all quantities that maintain
a perfect constancy probably do so as a result of *dynamical
adjustment*. Weyl (1921a, 261) expressed these ideas in the
following way:

What is the cause of this discrepancy between the idea of congruent transfer and the behaviour of measuring-rods and clocks? I differentiate between the determination of a magnitude in Nature by “persistence” (

Beharrung) and by “adjustment” (Einstellung). I shall make the difference clear by the following illustration: We can give to the axis of a rotating top any arbitrary direction in space. This arbitrary original direction then determines for all time the direction of the axis of the top when left to itself, by means of atendency of persistencewhich operates from moment to moment; the axis experiences at every instant a parallel displacement. The exact opposite is the case for a magnetic needle in a magnetic field. Its direction is determined at each instant independently of the condition of the system at other instants by the fact that, in virtue of its constitution, the systemadjustsitself in an unequivocally determined manner to the field in which it is situated.A prioriwe have no ground for assuming as integrable a transfer which results purely from the tendency of persistence. …Thus, although, for example, Maxwell's equations demand the conservational equationde/dt= for the chargeeof an electron, we are unable to understand from this fact why an electron, even after an indefinitely long time, always possesses an unaltered charge, and why the same chargeeis associated with all electrons. This circumstance shows that the charge is not determined by persistence, but by adjustment, and that there can exist onlyonestate of equilibrium of the negative electricity, to which the corpuscle adjusts itself afresh at every instant. For the same reason we can conclude the same thing for the spectral lines of atoms. The one thing common to atoms emitting the same frequency is their constitution, and not the agreement of their frequencies on the occasion of an encounter in the distant past. Similarly, the length of a measuring-rod is obviously determined by adjustment, for I could not givethismeasuring-rod inthisfield-position any other length arbitrarily (say double or treble length) in place of the length which it now possesses, in the manner in which I can at will pre-determine its direction. The theoretical possibility of a determination of length by adjustment is given as a consequence of theworld-curvature, which arises from the metrical field according to a complicated mathematical law. As a result of its constitution, the measuring-rod assumes a length which possesses this or that value,in relation to the radius of curvature of the field.

Weyl's response to Einstein's criticism that a Weyl geometry
conflicts with experience, took advantage of the fact that the
underlying dynamical laws of matter which govern clocks and rigid
rods, were not known at that time. Weyl could thus argue that it is
at least *theoretically *possible that there exists an
underlying dynamics of matter, such that a Weyl geometry, according
to which length transfer is non-integrable, nonetheless coheres with
*observable *experience, according to which length transfer
*appears *to be integrable. However, as was clearly pointed
out by Wolfgang Pauli, Weyl's plausible defence comes at a
cost.^{[49]}
Pauli (1921/1958, 196) argued that Weyl's defence of his theory
deprives it of its inherent convincing power from a physical point of
view.

Weyl's present attitude to this problem is the following:

The ideal process of the congruenttransference of world lengths… has nothing to do with the real behaviour of measuring rods andclocks; the metric field must not be defined by means of information taken from these measuringinstruments.In this case the quantitiesg_{ik}and ϕ_{i}are, be definition, no longer observable, in contrast to the line elements of Einstein's theory. This relinquishment seems to have very serious consequences. While there now no longer exists a direct contradiction with experiment, the theory appears nevertheless to have been robbed of its inherent convincing power, from a physical point of view. For instance, the connexion between electromagnetism and world metric is not now essentially physical, but purely formal. For there is no longer an immediate connection between the electromagnetic phenomena and the behaviour of measuring rods and clocks. There is only an interrelation between the former and the ideal process which is mathematically defined as congruent transference of vectors. Besides, there exists only formal, and not physical, evidence for a connection between world metric and electricity.^{[50]}

Pauli concluded his critical assessment of Weyl's theory with the following statement:

Summarizing, we can say that Weyl's theory has not succeeded in getting any nearer to solvingthe problem of the structure of matter.As will be argued in more detail … there is, on the contrary, something to be said for the view that a solution of this problem cannot at all be found in this way.

It should be noted, however, that Weyl's defence of his theory
implicitly addresses an important methodological consideration
concerning the relation between theory and evidence. As Pauli puts it
above, according to Weyl “*the metric field must not be
defined by means of information taken from these measuring*
*instruments *[rigid rods and ideal clocks]”. That is,
Weyl rejects Einstein's *operational *standpoint which gives
*operational significance *to the metric field in terms of the
*observable *behaviour of ideal rigid rods and ideal
clocks.^{[51]}
Unlike light propagation and freely falling (spherically symmetric,
neutral) particles, rigid rods and ideal clocks are relativistically
ill defined probative systems, and are thus unsuitable for the
determination of the inherent structures of spacetime postulated by
the theory of relativity. Weyl (1918a) clearly recognized this when
he said in response to Einstein's critique “because of the
problematic behaviour of yardsticks and clocks I have in my book
*Space-Time-Matter *restricted myself for the specific
measurement of the *g*_{ik}, exclusively to the
observation of the arrival of light signals.” It is interesting
to note parenthetically that in the first edition of his book Weyl
thought that it was possible to have an intrinsic method of comparing
the lengths of arbitrary spacetime intervals with an interval between
two fiducial spacetime events, by using light signals only. It was
Lorentz who pointed out to Weyl that not only the world lines of
light rays but also the world lines of material bodies are required
for an intrinsic method of comparing lengths. Not only did Weyl
correct this mistake in subsequent editions, but already in 1921,
Weyl (1921c) discovered the causal-inertial method for determining
the spacetime metric (see §4.3) by proving an important theorem
that shows that the spacetime metric is already fully determined by
the inertial and causal structure of spacetime. Weyl (1949a, 103)
remarks “… therefore mensuration need not depend on
clocks and rigid bodies but … light signals and mass points
moving under the influence of inertia alone will suffice.” It
is clear that Weyl regarded the use of clocks and rigid rods as an
undesirable makeshift within the context of the special and general
theory. Since neither spatial nor temporal intervals are invariants
of spacetime, the invariant spacetime interval *ds* cannot be
directly ascertained by means of standard clocks and rigid rods. In
addition, the latter presuppose quantum theoretical principles for
their justification and therefore lie outside the relativistic
framework because the laws which govern their physical processes are
not
known.^{[52]}

Weyl (1929c, 233) abandoned his unified field theory only with the
advent of the quantum theory of the electron. He did so because in
that theory a different kind of gauge invariance associated with
Dirac's theory of the electron was discovered, which more adequately
accounted for the conservation of electric charge. Weyl's
contributions to quantum mechanics, and his construction of a new
principle of gauge invariance, are discussed in
§4.5.3.^{[53]}

Weyl's unified field theory was revived by Dirac (1973) in a slightly
modified form, which incorporated a real scalar field
β(*x*). Dirac also argued that the time intervals measured
by atomic clocks need not be identified with the lengths of timelike
vectors in the Weyl
geometry.^{[54]}

### 4.2 The Riemann-Helmholtz-Lie Problem of Space

Prior to the works of Gauss, Grassmann and Riemann, the study of geometry tended to emphasize the employment of empirical intuitions and images of the three dimensional physical space. Physical space was thought of as having definite metrical attributes. The task of the geometer was to take physical mensuration devices in that space and work with them.

Under the influence of Gauss and Grassmann, Riemann's great
philosophical contribution consisted in the demonstration that,
unlike the case of a discrete manifold, where the determination of a
set necessarily implies the determination of its quantity or cardinal
number, in the case of a continuous manifold, the concept of such a
manifold and of its continuity properties, can be separated form its
metrical structure. Using modern terminology, Riemann separated a
manifold's local differential topological structure from its metrical
structure. Thus Riemann's separation thesis gave rise to the
*space problem*, or as Weyl called it, *das
Raumproblem*: how can metric relations be determined on a
continuous manifold *M*?

A metric manifold is a manifold on which a distance function *f*
: *M* × *M* → ℝ is defined. Such a
distance function must satisfy the following minimal conditions: for
all *p*, *q*, *r* ∈ *M*,

*f*(*p*,*q*) ≥ 0, and if*f*(*p*,*q*) = 0, then*p*=*q*,*f*(*p*,*q*) =*f*(*q*,*p*), (symmetry)*f*(*p*,*q*) +*f*(*q*,*r*) ≥*f*(*p*,*r*) (triangle inequality).

In his famous inaugural lecture at Göttingen, entitled
*Ü**ber die Hypothesen, welche der Geometrie zu*
*Grunde liegen *(*About the hypotheses which lie at the
basis of geometry*), Riemann (1854) examined how metric relations
can be determined on a continuous manifold; that is, what specific
form *f* : *M* × *M* → ℝ should
have. Consider the coordinates *x*^{i}(*p*)
and *x*^{i} (*p*) +
*d**x*^{i} (*p*) of two neighboring
points *p*, *q* ∈ *M*. The measure of the
distance *d**s* = *f*(*p*, *q*) must
be some function *F*_{p} at *p* of the
differential increments
*d**x*^{i}(*p*); that is,

ds=F_{p}(dx^{1}(p), … ,dx^{n}(p)).(22)

Riemann states that *F*_{p} should satisfy the
following requirements:

Functional Homogeneity:

If λ > andds=F_{p}(dx(p)), then

λ ds= λF_{p}(dx(p)) =F_{p}(λdx(p)).(23)

Sign Invariance:

A change in sign of the differentials should leave the value ofdsinvariant.

Sign invariance is satisfied by every positive homogeneous function
of degree 2*m* (*m* = 1, 2, 3, …). In the simple
case *m* = 1, and the length element *ds* is the square
root of a homogeneous function of second degree, which can be
expressed in the standard form

ds=∑ ni=1(dx^{i}(p))^{2}^{1/2}.(24)

That is, at each point of *M* there exists a coordinate system
(defined up to an element of the orthogonal group *O*(*n*)
in which the square root of the homogeneous function of second degree
can be expressed in the above standard form. Riemann's well-known
general expression for the measure of length at p ∈ M with
respect to an arbitrary coordinate system is given by

ds^{2}=g_{ij}(x(p))dx^{i}(p)dx^{j}(p),(25)

where the components of the metric tensor satisfy the symmetry
condition *g*_{ij} =
*g*_{ji}.

The assumption that *d**s*^{2} = *F*2*p* is a
quadratic differential form is not only the simplest one, but also
the preferred one for other important reasons. Riemann himself was
well aware of other possibilities; for example, the possibility that
*ds* could be the 4th root of a homogeneous polynomial of 4th
order in the differentials. But Riemann restricted himself to the
special case m = 1 because he was pressed for time and because he
wanted to give specific geometric interpretations of his results. As
Weyl points out Riemann's own answer to the space problem is
inadequate since Riemann's mathematical justification for the
restriction to the Pythagorean case are not very compelling. The
first satisfactory justification of the Pythagorean form of the
Riemannian metric, although limited in scope because it presupposed
the full homogeneity of Euclidean space, was provided by the
investigations of Hermann von Helmholtz. Helmholtz diverged from
Riemann's analytic approach and made use merely of the fundamental
concept of geometry, namely, the concept of *congruent
mapping*, and characterized the geometric structure of space by
requiring of space the full homogeneity of Euclidean space. His
analysis was thereby restricted to the cases of constant positive,
zero, or negative curvature. Abstracting from our experience of the
movement of rigid bodies, Helmholtz was able to mathematically derive
Riemann's distance formula from a number of axioms about rigid body
motion in space. Helmholtz (1868) argued that Riemann's hypothesis
that the metric structure of space is determined locally by a
quadratic differential form, is really a consequence of the facts
(*Tatsachen*) of rigid-body motion.

Considering the general case of *n* dimensions, and using Lie
groups and Lie algebras, Sophus Lie, (Lie (1886/1935, 1890a,b)),
later developed and improved Helmholtz's justification. However, the
Helmholtz-Lie treatment of, and solution to, the problem of space,
lost its relevance with the arrival of Einstein's theory of general
relativity. As Weyl (1922b) points out, instead of a
three-dimensional continuum we must now consider a four-dimensional
continuum, the metric of which is not *positive definite *but
is given instead by an *indefinite *quadratic form. In
addition, Helmholtz's presupposition of metric homogeneity no longer
holds, since we are now dealing with an inhomogeneous metric field
that causally depends on the distribution of matter. Consequently,
Weyl provided a reformulation of the space problem that is compatible
with the causal and metric structures postulated by the theory of
general relativity. But Weyl went further. Such a reformulation
should not only incorporate Riemann's *infinitesimal*
standpoint, as required by Einstein's general theory, it should also
cohere with Weyl's requirements of a **pure
***infinitesimal geometry *developed earlier in the
context of his construction of a unified field theory.

More precisely, Weyl generalized the so-called
*Riemann-Helmholtz-Lie *problem of space in two ways: First,
he allowed for *indefinite metrics *in order to encompass the
general theory of relativity. Secondly, he considered metrics with
variable gauge λ(*x*(*p*)) together with an
associated *length connection*, in order to obtain a
*purely *infinitesimal geometry. Thus each member of a general
class of geometries under consideration is locally determined
relative to a choice of variable gauge by two structural fields
(Strukturfelder): (1) a possibly indefinite *Finsler *metric
field^{[55]}
*F*_{p} (dx), and (2) a *length connection
*that is determined by a 1-form field θ_{i
}*d**x*^{i}. Weyl's task was to prove:

If the geometry satisfies the

Postulate of Freedom, (the nature of space imposes no restrictions on admissible metrical relations), and determines a unique, symmetric, linear connection Γ, then the Finsler metric fieldF_{p}(dx) must be a Riemannian metric field of some signature.^{[56]}

In a Riemannian space the concept of parallel displacement is defined by two conditions:

- The components of a vector remain unchanged during an infinitesimal parallel displacement in a suitably chosen coordinate system (geodesic coordinate).
^{[57]}This condition is satisfied if*d**v**i**p*= −Γ*i**jk**v**j**p**d**x**k**p*and Γ*i**jk*= Γ*i**kj*. - The length of a vector remains unchanged during an infinitesimal parallel displacement.

It follows from these conditions that a Riemannian space possesses a
definite symmetric linear connection—a symmetric linear
*metric
*connection^{[58]}—which
is uniquely determined by the Pythagorean-Riemannian metric. Weyl
calls this:

The Fundamental Postulate of Riemannian Geometry:

Among thepossiblesystems of parallel displacements of a vector to infinitely near points, that is among thepossiblesets of symmetric linear connection coefficients, there exists one and only one set, and hence one and only one system of parallel displacement, which islength preserving.

In his
lectures^{[59]}
on the mathematical analysis of the problem of space delivered in
1922 at Barcelona and Madrid, Weyl sketched a proof demonstrating
that the following is also true:

Uniqueness of the Pythagorean-Riemannian Metric:

Among all the possible infinitesimal metrics that can be put on a differentiable manifold, the Pythagorean-Riemannian metric is the only type of metric that uniquely determines a symmetric linear connection.

Weyl begins his proof with two natural assumptions. First, the
*nature *of the metric should be coordinate independent. If
*ds* is given by an expression
*F*_{p}(*d**x*^{1}, … ,
*d**x*^{n}) with respect to a given system
of coordinates, then with respect to another system of coordinates,
*ds* is given by a function that is related to
*F*_{p}(*d**x*^{1}, … ,
*d**x*^{n}) by a linear, homogeneous
transformation of its arguments *d**x*^{i}.
Second, it is reasonable to assume that the *nature *of the
metric is the same everywhere, in the sense that at every point of
the manifold, and with respect to every coordinate system for a
neighborhood of the point in question, *ds* is represented by an
element of the equivalence class [*F*] of functions generated by
any one such function, say
*F*_{p}(*d**x*^{1}, … ,
*d**x*^{n}), by all linear, homogeneous
transformations of its arguments *d**x*^{i}.

For the case in which *F*_{p} is Pythagorean in
form, namely the square root of a positive-definite quadratic form,
there exists just one possible equivalence class [*F*], because
every function that is the square root of a positive-definite
quadratic form can be transformed to the standard expression

F= [(dx^{1})^{2}+ ⋯ + (dx^{n})^{2}]^{1/2}(26)

by means of a linear, homogeneous transformation.

To every possible equivalence class [*F*] of homogeneous
functions, there corresponds a *type *of metrical space. The
Pythagorean-Riemannian space, for which *F*2*p* =
(*d**x*^{1})^{2} + ⋯ +
(*d**x*^{n})^{2}, is one among
several types of possible metrical spaces. The problem, therefore, is
to single out the equivalence class [*F*], where *F*
corresponds to *F*2*p* =
(*d**x*^{1})^{2} + ⋯ +
(*d**x*^{n})^{2}, from the other
possibilities, and to provide arguments for this preference.

By the term ‘metric’ Weyl means *any
*infinitesimal *distance function*
*F*_{p} ∈ [*F*], where the equivalence
class [*F*] represents a *type *of metric structure or
metric field. Any such type of metric field structure has a
microsymmetry group *G*_{p} at each *p*
∈ *M*.

**Definition 4.1 (Microsymmetry Group)** *A
microsymmetry of a structural field (Strukturfeld) at a*
*point* *p* ∈ *M* *is a local diffeomorphism
that takes* *p* ∈ *M* *into* *p*
*and preserves the structural field at* *p* ∈
*M*. *The microsymmetry group of a field at* *p*
∈ *M* *is the group of its microsymmetries at*
*p* ∈ *M* *under the operation of composition.*

A microsymmetry group *G*_{p}, at *p* ∈
*M*, of a metric structure, is a set of invertible, linear maps
of the tangent space *T*(*M*_{p}) onto
itself, which preserve the infinitesimal distance function at
*p* ∈ *M*. For every *p* ∈ *M*,
*G*_{p} is isomorphic to one and the same
abstract group.

For a Riemannian type of metric structure the congruent linear maps
of the tangent space T(*M*_{p}) onto itself form
a group *G*_{p} which is isomorphic to the
orthogonal group *O*(*n*). The Pythagorean-Riemannian
metric at *p* is therefore determined through the concrete
realization of the *orthogonal *group at *p* which leaves
the fundamental quadratic differential form at *p* invariant.
Thus the Pythagorean-Riemannian *type *of metric is
characterized by the abstract microsymmetry group *O*(*n*).
For a metric which is not of the Pythagorean-Riemannian metric type,
the abstract microsymmetry group *G*_{p} will be
different from *O*(*n*) and will be some other subgroup of
*GL*(*n*). At each point of the manifold the microsymmetry
group will be a concrete realization of this subgroup of
*GL*(*n*). Weyl now states what he calls

The Postulate of Freedom:

If only thenature(of whatever type) of the metric is specified, that is, if only the corresponding abstract microsymmetry groupG_{p}is specified, and the metric in question is otherwise left arbitrary, then themutual orientationsof the corresponding microsymmetry groups at different points are also left arbitrary.

Weyl emphasizes that the *Postulate of Freedom *provides the
general framework for a concise formulation of

The Hypothesis of Dynamical Geometry:

Whatever the nature or type of the metric may be—provided it is the same everywhere—the variations in themutual orientationsof the concrete microsymmetry groups from point to point are causally determined by the material content that fills space.

In contrast with Helmholtz's analysis, which presupposes the
homogeneity of space, the *Postulate of Freedom *allows for
the possibility of replacing Helmholtz's homogeneity requirement with
the possibility of subjecting the metric field to arbitrary,
infinitesimal change. *To assert this dynamical possibility does
not require that the nature of the metric be specified*.

Next, Weyl points out that what has been provided so far is merely an
explication of the concepts *metric*, *length*
*connection *and *symmetric linear connection*. Some
claim which goes beyond conceptual analysis has to be made, according
to Weyl, in order to prove that among the various types of possible
metrical structures that can be put on a differentiable manifold
representing physical space, the Pythagorean-Riemannian form is
unique. Weyl suggests the following hypothesis:

Weyl's Hypothesis:

Whatever determination the essentially free length connection at some pointpof the manifold may realize with the points in its infinitesimal neighborhood, there always exists among the possible systems of parallel displacements of the tangent spaceT(M_{p}), one and only one, which is at the same time a system of infinitesimalcongruent transport.

Weyl shows that this hypothesis does in fact single out metrics of the Pythagorean-Riemannian type by proving the following theorem:

**Theorem 4.2** *If a specific length connection is
such that it determines a unique symmetric linear connection, then
the metric must be of the Pythagorean-Riemannian form (for some
signature).*

Thus the *Postulate of Freedom* and *Weyl's Hypothesis
*together entail the existence, at each *p* ∈ *M*,
of a non-degenerate quadratic form that is unique up to a choice of
gauge at *p* ∈ *M*, and that is invariant under the
action of the microsymmetry group *G*_{p} that is
isomorphic to an orthogonal group of some signature.

This formulation suggests, according to Weyl, an intuitive contrast
between Euclidean ‘distance-geometry’ and the
‘*near*-geometry’ (*Nahegeometrie*) or
‘*field*-geometry’ of Riemann. Weyl (1949a, 88)
compared Euclidean ‘distance-geometry’ to a crystal
“built up from uniform unchangeable atoms in the rigid and
unchangeable arrangement of a lattice”, and the latter
[Riemannian *field-geometry*] to a liquid, “consisting
of the same indiscernible unchangeable atoms, whose arrangement and
orientation, however, are mobile and yielding to forces acting upon
them.”

The *nature *of the metric field, that is the *nature
*of the metric everywhere, is the same and is, therefore,
absolutely determined. It reflects according to Weyl, the *a
priori *structure of space or spacetime. In contrast, what is
*posteriori*, that is, accidental and capable of continuous
change being causally dependent on the material content that fills
space, are the mutual *orientations *of the metrics at
different points. Hence, the demarcation between the *a*
*priori *and the *a posteriori *has shifted, according
to Weyl: Euclidean geometry is still preserved for the infinitesimal
neighborhood of any given point, but the coordinate system in which
the metrical law assumes the standard form
*d**s*^{2} =∑*n*i=1(*d**x*^{i})^{2}
is in general different from place to place.

Weyl's *a priori* and *a posteriori* distinction must
not be confused with Kant's distinction. Weyl (1949a, 134) remarks:
“In the case of physical space it is possible to
counterdistinguish aprioristic and aposterioristic features in a
certain objective sense without, like Kant, referring to their
cognitive source or their cognitive character.” Weyl makes the
same remark in (Weyl, 1922b, 266). See also the discussion in
§4.5.8.

In the context of his group-theoretical analysis, Weyl (1922b, p. 266) makes the following interesting and important statement:

I remark from an epistemological point of view: it is not correct to say that space or the world [spacetime] is in itself, prior to any material content, merely a formless continuous manifold in the sense of analysis situs; the

natureof the metric [its infinitesimal Pythagorean-Riemannian character] is characteristic of space in itself, only the mutual orientation of the metrics at the various points is contingent, a posteriori and dependent on the material content.

Within the context of general relativity, empty spacetime is
impossible, if ‘empty’ is understood to mean not merely
empty of all *matter *but also empty of all *fields*.
At another place, Weyl (1949a, Engl. edn, 172) says:

Geometry unites organically with the field theory; space is not opposed to things (as it is in substance theory) like an empty vessel into which they are placed and which endows them with far-geometrical relationships. No empty space exists here; the assumption that the field omits a portion of the space is absurd.

According to Weyl, the metric field does not cease to exist in a
world devoid of matter but is in a state of rest: As a *rest*
field it would possess the property of *metric homogeneity*;
the mutual *orientations *of the *orthogonal *groups
characterizing the Pythagorean-Riemannian nature of the metric
everywhere would not differ from point to point. *This means that
in a matter-empty universe the metric is fixed. Consequently, the set
of congruence relations on* *spacetime is uniquely determined.
*Since the metric uniquely determines the symmetric linear
connection, the homogeneous *metric *field (rest field)
determines an *integrable *affine structure. Therefore, a flat
Minkowski spacetime consistent with the complete absence of matter is
endowed with an *integrable* *connection *and thus
determines all (hypothetical) free motions. According to Weyl, there
exists in the absence of matter a homogeneous metric field, a
structural field (*Strukturfeld*), which has the character of
a *rest *field, and which constitutes an all pervasive
background that cannot be eliminated. The structure of this *rest
*field determines the *extension *of the spacetime
congruence relations and determines Lorentz invariance. The *rest
*field possesses no net energy and makes no contribution to
curvature.

The contrast with Helmholtz and Lie is this: both of them require
homogeneity and isotropy for physical space. From a general
Riemannian standpoint, the latter characteristics are valid only for
a matter-empty universe. Such a universe is flat and Euclidean,
whereas a universe that contains matter is *inhomogeneous,
anisotropic and of variable* *curvature*.

It is important to note here that the validity of Weyl's assertion
that the metric field does not cease to exist but is in a state of
rest, has its source in the mathematical fact that the metric field
is a G-structure. A G-structure may be flat or non-flat; but a
G-structure can never vanish. Consequently, geometric fields
characterizable as G-structures, such as the projective, conformal,
affine and metric structures, do not
vanish.^{[60]}

### 4.3 Weyl's Causal-Inertial Method for determining the Spacetime Metric

#### 4.3.1 Weyl's Field Ontology of Spacetime Geometry

Riemann searched for the most general type of an *n*-dimensional
manifold. On this manifold, Euclidean geometry turns out to be a
special case resulting from a certain form of the metric. Weyl takes
this general structure, the manifold structure, which has certain
continuity and order properties, as basic, but leaves the
determination of the other geometrical structures, such as the
projective, conformal, affine and metric structures, open. The
metrical axioms are no longer dictated, as they were for Kant, by
pure intuition. According to Weyl (1949a, 87), for Riemann the metric
is not, as it was for Kant, “part of the static homogeneous
form of phenomena, but of their ever changing material
content”. Weyl (1931a, 338) says:

We differentiate now between the amorphous continuum and its metrical structure. The first has retained its

a prioricharacter,^{[61]}… whereas the structural field [Strukturfeld] is completely subjected to the power-play of the world; being a real entity, Einstein prefers to call it the ether.

There is no indication in Riemann's work on gravitation and electromagnetism that would indicate that he anticipated the conceptual revolution underlying Einstein's theory. However, Weyl's interpretation of Riemann's work suggests that Riemann foresaw something like its possibility in the following sense:

By formally separating the post-topological structures such as the affine, projective, conformal and metric structures from the manifold, so that these structures are no longer rigidly tied to it, Riemann deprived them of their formal geometric rigidity and, on the basis of his infinitesimal geometric standpoint or “near-geometry”, allowed for the possibility of interpreting them as mathematical representations of flexible, dynamical physical structural fields [Strukturfelder] on the manifold of spacetime, geometrical fields that reciprocally interact with matter.

Riemann's separation thesis together with his adoption of the infinitesimal standpoint, were prerequisite steps for the development of differential geometry as the mathematics of differentiable geometric fields on manifolds. When interpreted physically, these mathematical structures or geometrical fields correspond, as Weyl says, to physical structural fields (Strukturfelder). Analogous to the electromagnetic field, these structural fields act on matter and are in turn acted on by matter. Weyl (1931a, 337) remarks:

I now come to the crucial idea of the theory of General Relativity.

Whatever exerts as powerfuland real effects as does the metric structure of the world, cannot be a rigid, once and for all,fixed geometrical structure of the world, but must itself be something real which not only exertseffects on matter but which in turn suffers them through matter.Riemann already suggested for space the idea that the structural field, like the electromagnetic field, reciprocally interacts with matter.

Weyl (1931a, 338) continues:

We already explained with the example of inertia, that the structural field [Strukturfeld] must, as a close-action [Nahewirkung], be understood infinitesimally. How this can occur with the metric structure of space, Riemann abstracted from Gauss's theory of curved surfaces.

The various geometrical fields are not “intrinsic” to the
manifold structure of spacetime. The manifold represents an amorphous
four-dimensional differentiable continuum in the sense of
*analysis situs *and has no properties besides those that fall
under the concept of a manifold.

The amorphous four-dimensional differentiable manifold possesses a
high degree of symmetry. Because of its homogeneity, all points are
alike; there are no objective geometric properties that enable one to
distinguish one point from another. This full homogeneity or symmetry
of space must be described by its group of *automorphisms*,
the one-to-one mappings of the point field onto itself which leave
all relations of objective significance between points undisturbed.
If a geometric object *F*, that is a point set with a definite
relational structure is given, then those automorphisms of space that
leave *F* invariant, constitute a group and this group describes
exactly the symmetry which *F* possesses. For instance, to use
an example by Weyl (1938b) (see also Weyl (1949a, 72–73) and
Weyl (1952)), if
R(*p*_{1}, *p*_{2}, *p*_{3}
) is a ternary relation that asserts
*p*_{1}, *p*_{2}, *p*_{3}
lie on a straight line, then we require that any three points,
satisfying this relation *R*, are mapped by an automorphism into
three other points
*p*_{1}′, *p*_{2}′, *p*_{3}′,
fulfilling the same relation.

The group of automorphisms of the *n*-dimensional number space
contains only the identity map, since all numbers of
ℝ^{n} are distinct individuals. It is
essentially for this reason that the real numbers are used for
coordinate descriptions. Whereas the continuum of real numbers
consists of individuals, the continua of space, time, and spacetime
are homogeneous. Spacetime points do not admit of an absolute
characterization; they can be distinguished, according to Weyl, only
by “a demonstrative act, by pointing and saying
here-now”.

In a little book entitled *Riemanns geometrische Ideen, ihre
Auswirkung und ihre Verkn**ü**pfung* *mit
der Gruppentheorie*, published posthumously in 1988, Weyl (1988,
4–5) makes this interesting comment:

Coordinates are introduced on the Mf [manifold] in the most direct way through the mapping onto the number space, in such a way, that all coordinates, which arise through one-to-one continuous transformations, are equally possible. With this the coordinate concept breaks loose from all special constructions to which it was bound earlier in geometry. In the language of relativity this means: The coordinates are not measured, their values are not read off from real measuring rods which react in a definite way to physical fields and the metrical structure, rather they are a priori placed in the world arbitrarily, in order to characterize those physical fields including the metric structure numerically. The metric structure becomes through this, so to speak, freed from space; it becomes an existing field within the remaining structure-less space. Through this, space as form of appearance contrasts more clearly with its real content: The content is measured after the form is arbitrarily related to coordinates.

By mapping a given spacetime homeomorphically onto the real number space, providing through the arbitrariness of the mapping, what Weyl calls, a qualitatively non-differentiated field of free possibilities—the continuum of all possible coincidences—we represent spacetime points by their coordinates corresponding to some coordinate system. The four-dimensional arithmetical space can be utilized as a four-dimensional schema for the localization of events of all possible “here-nows”.

Physical dynamical quantities in spacetime, such as the geometrical
structural fields on the four-dimensional spacetime continuum, are
describable as functions of a variable point which ranges over the
four-dimensional number space ℝ^{4}. Instead of
thinking of the spacetime points as real substantival entities, and
any talk of fields as just a convenient way of describing geometrical
relations between points, one thinks of the geometrical fields such
as the projective, conformal causal, affine and metric fields, as
real physical entities with dynamical properties, such as energy,
momentum and angular momentum, and the field points as mere
mathematical abstractions. Spacetime is not a medium in the sense of
the old ether concept. No ether in that sense exists here. Just as
the electromagnetic fields are not states of a medium but constitute
independent realities which are not reducible to anything else, so,
according to Weyl, the geometrical fields are independent irreducible
physical
fields.^{[62]}

A class of geometric structural fields of a given type is
characterized by a particular Lie group. A geometric structural field
belonging to a given class has a microsymmetry group (see definition
4.1) at each point *p* ∈ *M* which is isomorphic to
the Lie group that is characteristic of the class. In relativity
theory, this microsymmetry group is isomorphic to the Lorentz group
and leaves invariant a pseudo-Riemannian metric of Lorentzian
signature.

The different types of geometric, structural fields may be
represented from a modern mathematical point of view as cross
sections of appropriate fiber bundles over the manifold *M*;
that is, the amorphous manifold *M* has associated with it
various geometric fields in terms of a mapping of a certain kind
(called a cross section) from the manifold *M* to the
corresponding bundle space over
*M*.^{[63]}
In particular, Einstein's general theory of relativity postulates a
physical field, the metrical field, which, mathematically speaking,
may be characterized as a cross section of the bundle of
non-degenerate, second-order, symmetric, covariant tensors of Lorentz
signature over *M*. Weyl (1931a, 336) says of this world
structure:

However this structure is to be exactly and completely described and whatever its inner ground might be, all laws of nature show that it constitutes the most decisive influence on the evolution of physical events: the behavior of rigid bodies and clocks is almost exclusively determined through the metric structure, as is the pattern of the motion of a force-free mass point and the propagation of a light source. And only through these effects on the concrete natural processes can we recognize this structure.

The views of Weyl are diametrically opposed to geometrical
conventionalism and some forms of relationalism. According to Weyl,
we *discover *through the behavior of physical phenomena an
already determined metrical structure of spacetime. The metrical
relations of physical objects are determined by a physical field, the
metric field, which is represented by the second rank metric tensor
field. Contrary to geometric conventionalism, spacetime geometry is
not about rigid rods, ideal clocks, light rays or freely falling
particles, except in the derivative sense of providing information
about the physically real metric field which, according to Weyl, is
as physically real as is the electromagnetic field, and which
determines and explains the metrical behavior of congruence standards
under transport. The metrical field has physical *and
*metrical significance, and the metrical significance does not
consist in the mere articulation of relations obtaining between, say,
rigid rods or ideal clocks.

The special and general, as well as the non-relativistic spacetime
theories postulate various structural constraints which events are
held to satisfy. When interpreted physically, these mathematical
structures or constraints correspond to physical structural fields
(*Strukturfelder*). Analogous to the electromagnetic field,
these structural fields act on matter and are, within the context of
the general theory of relativity, in turn acted on by matter. An
*n*-dimensional manifold *M* whose sole properties are
those that fall under the concept of a manifold, Weyl (1918b)
physically interprets as an *n*-dimensional empty world, that
is, a world empty of both matter and fields. On the other hand, an
*n*-dimensional manifold *M* that is an affinely connected
manifold, Weyl physically interprets as an *n*-dimensional world
filled with a gravitational field, and an *n*-dimensional
manifold *M* endowed with a projective structure represents an
*n*-dimensional non-empty world filled with an
inertial-gravitational field, or what Weyl calls the *guiding
field *(*F**ü**hrungsfeld*). In a
similar vein, an *n*-dimensional manifold *M* that
possesses a conformal structure of Lorentz type, represents a
non-empty *n*-dimensional world filled with a causal field.
Finally, an *n*-dimensional manifold *M* endowed with a
metrical structure may be interpreted physically as an
*n*-dimensional non-empty world filled with a metric field.

#### 4.3.2 The Causal and Inertial Field uniquely determine the Metric

The mathematical model of physical spacetime is the four-dimensional
pseudo-Riemannian manifold. Weyl (1921c) distinguished between two
primitive substructures of that model: the *conformal *and
*projective *structures and showed that the conformal
structure, modelling the *causal field *governing light
propagation, and the projective structure, modelling the inertial or
*guiding field *governing all free (fall) motions, uniquely
determine the metric. That is, Weyl (1921c) proved

**Theorem 4.3** *The projective and conformal
structure of a metric space determine the metric uniquely.*

A metric *g* on a manifold determines a first-order conformal
structure on the manifold, namely, an equivalence class of
conformally related metrics

[ g] = {g|g=e^{θ}g}.(27)

A metric *g* also uniquely determines a symmetric linear
connection Γ on the manifold. Under a conformal transformation

g→e^{θ}g=g,(28)

the change of the components of the symmetric linear connection is given by (14), that is,

Γ ijk→Γijk= Γijk+(δ

1 2 ijθ_{k}+ δikθ_{j}−g_{jk}g^{ir}θ_{r}).(29)

Thus the set of all arbitrary conformal transformations of the metric
induces an equivalence class *K* of conformally related
symmetric linear connections. This equivalence class *K*
constitutes a second-order conformal structure on the manifold and
the difference between any two connections in the equivalence class
is given by (29). Weyl shows that a conformal transformation (29)
preserves the projective structure and hence is a projective
transformation (that is, a conformal transformation which also
satisfies (7)), if and only if θ_{j} = 0, in
which case the conformal and projective structures are compatible.
Weyl remarks after the proof:

If it is possible for us, in the real world, to discern causal propagation, and in particular light propagation, and if moreover, we are able to recognize and observe as such the motion of free mass points which follow the guiding field, then we are able to read off the metric field from this alone, without reliance on clocks and rigid rods.

Elsewhere, Weyl (1949a, 103) says:

As a matter of fact it can be shown that the metrical structure of the world is already fully determined by its inertial and causal structure, that therefore mensuration need not depend on clocks and rigid bodies but that light signals and mass points moving under the influence of inertia alone will suffice.

The use of clocks and rigid rods is, within the context of either
theory, an undesirable makeshift for two reasons. First, since
neither spatial nor temporal intervals are invariants of the
four-dimensional spacetime of the special theory of relativity and
the general theory of relativity, the invariant spacetime interval
*ds* cannot be directly ascertained by means of standard clocks
and rigid rods. Second, the concepts of a rigid body and a periodic
system (such as pendulums or atomic clocks) are not fundamental or
theoretically self-sufficient, but involve assumptions that
presuppose quantum theoretical principles for their justification and
thus lie outside the present conceptual relativistic framework.
Therefore, methodological and ontological considerations decidedly
favor Weyl's causal-inertial method for determining the spacetime
metric.

From the physical point of view, Weyl emphasized the roles of light propagation and free (fall) motion in revealing the conformal-causal and the projective structures respectively. However, from the mathematical point of view, Weyl did not use these two structures directly in order to derive from them and their compatibility relation, the metric field. Rather, Weyl regarded the metric and affine structures as fundamental and showed that the conformal and the projective structures respectively arise from those structures by mathematical abstraction.

Figure 7: Weyl took the metric and affines structures as fundamental and showed that the conformal and projective structures respectively arise from them by mathematical abstraction.

#### 4.3.3 The Ehlers, Pirani, Schild Construction of the Causal-Inertial Method

Ehlers et al. (1972) generalized Weyl's causal-inertial method by
deriving the metric field *directly *from the conformal and
projective fields and derived a unique pseudo-Riemannian spacetime
metric solely as a consequence of a set of natural, physically
well-motivated, constructive, “geometry-free” axioms
concerning the incidence and differential properties of light
propagation and free (fall) motion. Ehlers, Pirani and Schild adopt
Reichenbach's (1924) term, *constructive axiomatics *to
describe the nature of their approach. The
“geometry-free” axioms are propositions about a few
general qualitative assumptions concerning free (fall) motion and
light propagation that can be verified directly through experience in
a way that does not presuppose the full blown edifice of the general
theory of relativity. From these axioms, the theoretical basis of the
theory is reconstructed step by step.

The constructive axiomatic approach to spacetime structure is roughly this:

**Primitive Notions.**The constructive axiomatic approach is based on a triple of sets⟨

*M*,*P*, L⟩of objects corresponding respectively to the notions of

*events, particle paths*and*light rays*, which are taken as primitive. The set*M*of events is assumed to have a Hausdorff topology with a countable basis in order to state local axioms through the use of such terms as “neighborhood”. Members of the sets= {*P**P*,*Q*,*P*_{1},*Q*_{1}, …} and L = {*L*,*N*,*L*_{1},*N*_{1}, …} are subsets of*M*that represent the possible or actual paths of massive particles and light rays in spacetime.**Differential Structure.**The differential structure is not presupposed; rather through the first few axioms a differential-manifold structure is introduced on the set of events*M*that is sufficient for the localization of events by means of local coordinates, such as radar coordinates. Once*M*is given a differential-manifold structure through the introduction of local radar coordinates by means of particles and light rays (such that any two radar coordinates are smoothly related to one another), one can do calculus on*M*and one may speak of tangent and direction spaces.It is important to emphasize that the members of

represent possible or actual paths of*P**arbitrary*massive particles that may have some internal structure such as higher order gravitational and electromagnetic multipole moments and that may therefore interact in complicated ways with various physical fields. In order to constructively establish the projective structure of spacetime, it is necessary to single out a subset of, namely*P**P*_{f}, the set of possible or actual paths of spherically symmetric, electrically neutral particles (that is, the world lines of freely falling particles). However, the set*P*_{f}⊂, can be properly characterized only after a coordinate system (differential structure) is available.*P**Consequently, one must employ*arbitrary*particles in the statement of those axioms that lead to the local differential structure of spacetime.***Second-Order Conformal Structure.**The*Law of Causality*asserts the existence of a unique first-order conformal structure on spacetime (27), that is, a field of infinitesimal light cones.Only null one-directions are determined. Therefore no special choice of parameters along light rays is determined by this structure. The first-order conformal structure can be measured using only the local differential-topological structure. Moreover, by a purely mathematical process involving only differentiation, the first-order conformal structure determines a second-order conformal structure, namely, an equivalence class

*K*of conformally related symmetric linear connections.**Projective Structure.**The motions of freely falling particles governed by the guiding field reveal the geodesics of spacetime, that is, the geodesics corresponding to an equivalence class Π of projectively equivalent symmetric linear connections. Only geodesic one-directions are determined, that is, no special choice of parameters is involved in characterizing free fall motion.**Compatibility between the Conformal and Projective Structures.**That the conformal and projective structures are compatible is suggested by high energy experiments, according to Ehlers, Pirani and Schild: “A massive particle (m > 0), though always slower than a photon, can be made to chase a photon arbitrarily closely.” Ehlers, Pirani and Schild therefore assume an axiom of compatibility between the conformal and projective structures, and this leads to a*Weyl space*: If the projective and conformal structures are compatible, then the intersectionΠ ∩ K = Γ (Weyl connection)

of the equivalence class

*K*of conformally equivalent symmetric linear connections, and the equivalence class Π of projectively equivalent symmetric linear connections, contains a unique symmetric linear connection, a*Weyl connection*. Thus light propagation and free (fall) motion reveal on spacetime a unique Weyl connection which determines the parallel transport of vectors, preserving their timelike, null or spacelike character, and for any pair of non-null vectors, the Weyl connection leaves invariant the ratio of their lengths and the angle between them, provided the vectors are transported along the same path.**Pseudo-Riemannian Metric.**Since length transfer is non-integrable (i.e., path-dependent) in a Weyl space, a Weyl geometry reduces to a pseudo-Riemannian geometry if and only if Weyl's*length-curvature*(*Streckenkr**ü**mmung*) tensor equals zero, in which case the length of a vector is path-independent under parallel transport, and there exists no second clock effect.

#### 4.3.4 The Philosophical Significance of the Causal-Inertial Method

Can it be argued that Ehlers, Pirani and Schild's generalization of Weyl's causal-inertial method for determining the spacetime metric constitutes a convention-free, and – in relevant respects – theory-independent body of evidence that can adjudicate between spacetime geometries, and hence between spacetime theories that postulate them? As Weyl showed, we can empirically determine the metric field, provided certain epistemic conditions are satisfied, that is, provided we can measure the conformal-causal structure, and provided “we are able to recognize and observe as such the motion of free mass points which follow the guiding field.” Criticisms of Ehlers, Pirani and Schild's constructive axiomatics suggest that the causal-inertial method is not convention-free and that it is ineffective epistemologically in providing a possible solution to the controversy between geometrical realism and conventionalism in favor of realism. Basically, all of the charges laid against Ehlers, Pirani and Schild's constructive axiomatics concentrate on the roles which massive particles play in their construction. One of the constructive axioms employed by Ehlers, Pirani and Schild, the projective axiom, is a statement of the infinitesimal version of the Law of Inertia, the law of free (fall) motion which contains Newton's first law of motion as a special case in the absence of gravitation. Since Ehlers, Pirani and Schild do not provide an independent, non-circular criterion by which to characterize free (fall) motion, their approach has been charged with circularity by philosophers such as Grünbaum (1973), Salmon (1977), Sklar (1977) and Winnie (1977).

The problem is a familiar one; how to introduce a class of preferred
motions, that is, how to characterize that particular path structure
that would govern the motions of free particles *P*_{f} , that
is, neutral, spherically symmetric, non-rotating test bodies, while
avoiding the circularity problem surrounding the notion of a *free
particle*: The only way of knowing when no forces act on a body
is by observing that it moves as a free particle along the geodesics
of spacetime. But how, without already knowing the geodesics or the
projective structure of spacetime is it possible to determine which
particles are free and which are not? And to determine the projective
structure of spacetime it is necessary to use free particles.

Coleman and Korté (1980) have addressed these and related
difficulties by providing a non-conventional procedure for the
empirical determination of the projective
structure.^{[64]}

It is worth emphasizing that Weyl's approach to differential
geometry, in which the affine, projective and conformal structures
are treated in their own right rather than as mere aspects of the
metric, was instrumental for his discovery of the non-circular and
non-conventional geodesic method for the empirical determination of
the spacetimet metric. The old notion of a ‘geodesic
path’ had its inception in the context of classical
*metrical *geometry and ‘geodesicity’ was
characterized in terms of *extremal *paths of curves, which
presupposed a metric. It was Weyl's metric-independent construction
of the symmetric linear connection that led him to introduce the
geometry of paths and the metric-independent characterization of a
*geodesic *path in terms of the process of autoparallelism of
its tangent direction.

### 4.4 The Laws of Motion, Mach's Principle, and Weyl's Cosmological Postulate

Weyl provided a general conceptual/mathematical clarification of the concept of motion that applies to any spacetime theory that is based on a differential manifold. In particular, Weyl's penetrating analysis shows that Einstein's understanding of the role and significance of Mach's Principle for the general theory of relativity and cosmology is actually inconsistent with the basic principles of general relativity.

Weyl's major contribution to cosmology is known as “Weyl's
Hypothesis”. The name was coined by Weyl (1926d) himself in an
article in the *Encyclopedia of*
*Britannica*.^{[65]}
According to Weyl's Postulate, the worldlines of all galaxies are
non-intersecting diverging geodesics that have a common origin in the
distant past. From this system of worldlines Weyl derived a common
cosmic time. On the basis of his postulate, Weyl (1923c, Appendix
III) was also the first to show that there is an approximately
*linear *relation between the redshift of galactic spectra and
distance. Weyl had basically discovered *Hubble's Law *six
years prior to Hubble's formulation of it in 1929. Another
contribution to cosmology is Weyl's (1919b) spherically symmetric
static exact solution to Einstein's
linearized^{[66]}
field equations.

#### 4.4.1 The Laws of Motion and Mach's Principle

There are essentially two ways to understand Mach's Principle: (1)
Mach's Principle rejects the absolute character of the inertial
structure of spacetime, and (2) Mach's Principle rejects the inertial
structure of spacetime *per se*. Version (2) might be
characterized as *Leibnizian relativity *or *body
relationalism*; that is, one understands by relative motion the
motion of *bodies *with respect only to other observable
*bodies *or observable *bodily *reference frames. The
relative motion of a body with respect to absolute space or to the
inertial structure of space (Newton) or spacetime is ruled out on
epistemological and/or metaphysical grounds.

In the context of his general theory of relativity, what Einstein is
objecting to in Newtonian Mechanics, and by implication, the theory
of special relativity, is the *absolute *character of the
inertial structure; he is not asserting its *fictitious
*character. That is, the general theory of relativity
incorporates Mach's Principle as expressed in version (1) by treating
the inertial structure as dynamical and not as absolute.

However, Einstein also tried to extend and generalize the special
theory of relativity by incorporating version (2) of Mach's Principle
into the general theory of relativity. Einstein was deeply influenced
by Mach's empiricist programme and accepted Mach's insistence on the
primacy of observable facts of experience: *only observable facts
of* *experience may be invoked to account for the phenomena of
motion*. As a consequence, Einstein restricted the concept of
relative motions to relative motions between bodies. Newton thought
that the plane of Foucault's pendulum remains aligned with respect to
absolute space. Since the fixed stars are at rest with respect to
absolute space the plane of Foucault's pendulum remains aligned to
them as well, and rotates relative to the earth. But according to
Einstein, Newton's intermediary notion of absolute space is as
questionable as it is unnecessary in explaining the behaviour of
Foucault's pendulum. Not absolute space, but the actually existing
masses of the fixed stars of the whole cosmos guide the plane of
Foucault's pendulum.

Einstein (1916) argued that the general theory of relativity removes
from the special theory of relativity and Newton's theory an inherent
epistemological defect. The latter is brought to light by Mach's
paradox, namely, Einstein's example of two fluid bodies, *A* and
*B*, which are in constant *relative *rotation about a
common axis. With regard to the extent to which each of the spheres
bulges at its equator, infinitely many different states are possible
although the relative rotation of the two bodies is the same in every
case. Einstein considered the case in which *A* is a sphere and
*B* is an oblate spheroid. The paradox consists in the fact that
there is no readily discernible reason that accounts for the fact
that one of the bodies bulges and the other does not. According to
Einstein, an epistemological satisfactory solution to this paradox
must be based on ‘an observable fact of experience’.
Einstein wanted to implement a Leibnizian-Machian *relational
*conception of motion according to which all motion is to be
interpreted as the motion of some bodies in relation to other bodies.
Einstein wished to extend the body-relative concept of uniform
inertial motion to the concept of a body-relative accelerated motion.

#### 4.4.2 Weyl's Critique of Einstein's Machian Ideas

Weyl was very critical of Einstein's attempt to incorporate version
(2) of Mach's Principle into the theory of general relativity and
relativistic cosmology because he considered the Leibnizian-Machian
*relational* conception of motion—according to which all
motion is to be interpreted as the motion of some bodies in relation
to other bodies—to be an incoherent notion within the context
of the general theory of relativity.

In a paper entitled *Massentr**ä**gheit und
Kosmos. Ein Dialog* [*Inertial Mass and Cosmos. A
Dialogue*] Weyl (1924b) articulates his overall position on the
concept of motion and the role of Mach's Principle in general
relativity and
cosmology.^{[67]}
Weyl defines Mach's Principle as follows:

M (Mach's Principle):

The inertia of a body is determined through the interaction of all the masses in the universe.

Weyl (1924b) then makes the observation that the *kinematic
principle of relative motion *is by itself without any content,
unless one also makes the additional physical causal assumption that

C (Physical Causality):

All events or processes are uniquely causally determined through matter, that is, through charge, mass and the state of motion of the elementary particles of matter.^{[68]}

The underlying motivation for assumption **C** of
physical causality is essentially Mach's empiricist programme,
namely, Mach's insistence on the *primacy of observable facts of
experience*. Addressing Einstein's formulation of Mach's paradox,
Weyl (1924b) says: Only if we conjoin the *kinematic principle of
relative motion *with the physical assumption **C**
does it appear groundless or impossible on the basis of the kinematic
principle that in the absence of any external forces a stationary
body of fluid has the form of a sphere “at rest”, while
on the other hand it has the form of a “rotating”
flattened ellipsoid. Weyl rejects principle **C** of
physical causality because he denies the feasibility of
**M** (Mach's Principle), as defined above, on
*a*
*priori*^{[69]}
grounds. According to Weyl (1924b)

A:

The concept of relative motion of several isolated bodies with respect to each other is as untenable according to the theory of general relativity as is the concept of absolute motion of a single body.

Weyl notes that what we seem to observe as the rotation of the stars, is in reality not the rotation of the stars themselves but the rotation of the “star compass” [Sternenkompass] which consists of light signals from the stars that meet our eyes at our present location from a certain direction. It is crucial, Weyl reminds us, to be cognisant of the existence of the metric field between the stars and our eyes. This metric field determines the propagation of light, and, like the electromagnetic field, it is capable of change and variation. Weyl (1924b) says that “the metric field is no less important for the direction in which I see the star then is the location of the star itself.” How is it possible, Weyl asks, to compare within the context of the general theory of relativity, the state of motions of two separate bodies? Of course, Weyl notes, prior to the general theory of relativity, during Mach's time, one could rely on a rigid frame of reference such as the earth and indefinitely extend such a frame throughout space. One could then postulate the relative motion of the stars with respect to this frame. However, under the hands of Einstein the coordinate system has lost its rigidity to such a degree, that it can always “cling to the motion of all bodies simultaneously”; that is, whatever the motions of the bodies are, there exists a coordinate system such that all bodies are at rest with respect to that coordinate system. Weyl then clarifies and illustrates the above with the plasticine example, which Weyl (1949a, 105) elsewhere describes as follows:

Incidentally, without a world structure the concept of relative motion of several bodies has, as the postulate of general relativity shows, no more foundation than the concept of absolute motion of a single body. Let us imagine the four-dimensional world as a mass of plasticine traversed by individual fibers, the world lines of the material particles. Except for the condition that no two world lines intersect, their pattern may be arbitrarily given. The plasticine can then be continuously deformed so that not only one but all fibers become vertical straight lines. Thus no solution of the problem is possible as long as in adherence to the tendencies of Huyghens and Mach one disregards the structure of the world. But once the inertial structure of the world is accepted as the cause for the dynamical inequivalence of motions, we recognize clearly why the situation appeared so unsatisfactory. … Hence the solution is attained as soon as we dare to

acknowledge the inertial structure as a real thing that not only exerts effects upon matter but inturn suffers such effects.

Figure 8: Weyl's plasticine example

Applying these considerations to the fixed stars and assuming that it is possible that the (conformal) metrical field which determines the cones of light propagation (light cones) at each point of the plasticine, is carried along by the continuous transformation of the plasticine, then both the earth and the fixed stars will be at rest with respect to the plasticine's coordinate system. Yet despite this the “star compass” is rotating with respect to the earth, exactly as we observe!

Employing the concept of the microsymmetry group (definition 4.1),
Coleman and Korté (1982) have analyzed Weyl's plasticine
example in the following way: Consider a space-time manifold equipped
only with a differentiable structure, the plasticine of Weyl's
example. Then our spacetime does not have an affine, conformal,
projective or metric structure defined on it. In such a world it is
possible do define curves and paths; however, there are no preferred
curves or paths. Since there is only the differentiable structure,
one may apply any diffeomorphism; that is, *all
*diffeomorphisms preserve this structure; consequently, in the
absence of a post-differential-topological structure, the
microsymmetry group at any event *p* is an infinite-parameter
group isomorphic to the group of all invertible formal power series
in four variables. If there is no post-differentiable topological
geometric field in the neighbourhood of a point, then all of these
infinite parameters may be chosen freely within rather broad limits.
Clearly then, given an infinite number of parameters, one can, as
Weyl says, straighten out an arbitrary pattern of world lines
(fibers) in the neighbourhood of any event. Now suppose that there
exists a post-differentiable topological geometric field, namely, the
projective structure at any event of spacetime. Then the
microsymmetry group that preserves that structure is a 20-parameter
Lie group (see Coleman and Korté (1981)). Thus instead of an
infinity of degrees of freedom, only twenty degrees of freedom may be
used to actively deform the neighbouring region of spacetime. The
fact that only a finite number of parameter are available prevents an
arbitrary realignment of the worldlines of material bodies in the
neighbourhood of any given event.

Other post-differential topological geometrical field structures are similarly restrictive. For example, the microsymmetry group of the conformal structure, which determines the causal structure of spacetime, permits 7 degrees of freedom (6 Lorentz transformations and a dilatation) and permits four more degrees of freedom in second order. Consequently, the existence of the conformal metrical field which determines at each point the cones of light propagation would prevent an arbitrary realignment of light-like fibers, that is, it would be impossible to realign the earth and the fixed stars such that both are at rest with the coordinate system of the plasticine.

Weyl's plasticine example shows that the Leibnizian-Machian view of
relative motion, namely the view according to which all motion must
be defined as motion relative to bodies, is self-defeating in the
general theory of relativity. The fact that a stationary, homogeneous
elastic sphere will, when set in rotation, bulge at the equator and
flatten at the poles is, according to Weyl (1924b), to be accounted
for in the following way. The complete physical system consisting of
both the body and the local inertial- gravitational field is not the
same in the two situations. The cause of the effect is the state of
motion of the body *with respect to* the local
inertial-gravitational field, the guiding field, and is not, indeed
as Weyl's plasticine example shows, cannot be the state of motion of
the body relative to other bodies. To attribute the effect as
Einstein and Mach did to the rotation of the body with respect to the
other *bodies *in the universe is, according to Weyl, to
endorse a remnant of the unjustified monopoly of the older body
ontology, namely, the sovereign right of material bodies to play the
role of physically real and acceptable causal
agents.^{[70]}

#### 4.4.3 Coordinate Transformation Laws of Acceleration

Weyl's view that there must be an *inertial structure field
*on spacetime, which governs material bodies in *free*
*motion*, follows from the mathematical nature of the
coordinate-transformation laws for acceleration. In a world equipped
with only a differential structure, it is possible to do calculus;
one can define curves and paths and differentiate, etc. However, as
was already pointed out, in such a world, the world of Weyl's
plasticine example, there would be no preferred curves or paths.
Consequently, *the motion of material bodies* *would not be
predictable*. However, experience overwhelmingly indicates that
the acceleration of a massive body cannot be freely chosen. In
particular, consider a simple type of particle, a monopole
(unstructured) particle. Experience overwhelmingly tells us that such
a particle is characterized by the fact that at any event on its
world line, its velocity at that event is sufficient to determine its
acceleration at that event. Predictability of motion, therefore,
entails that corresponding to every type of massive monopole, there
exists a geometric structure field, or what Weyl calls a
*Strukturfeld* that governs the motion of that type of
particle. The basic reason which explains this brute fact of
experience is a simple mathematical fact about how the acceleration
of bodies transforms under a coordinate transformation. Moreover,
this simple mathematical fact, involving no more than the basic
techniques of partial differentiation, holds in all relativistic,
non-relativistic, curved or flat, dynamic or non-dynamic spacetime
theories that are based on a local differential topological
structure, the minimal structure required for the possibility of
assigning arbitrary local coordinates on a differential manifold.

Transformation law for acceleration:The transformation law for acceleration is linear, but isnothomogeneous in the acceleration variable.

As an example consider the transformation laws for the 4-velocity and
the 4-acceleration. Recall that a *curve *in the
four-dimensional spacetime manifold *M* is a map γ :
ℝ → *M*. For convenience we restrict our attention
to those curves which satisfy γ(0) = *p*. If we set
γ^{i} = *x*^{i} ∘
γ(0), then the components of the 4-velocity and 4-acceleration
at *p* ∈ *M* are respectively given by

γ i1=_{def}γ

ddt^{i}(0),(30)

γ i2=_{def}γ

d^{2}dt^{2}^{i}(0).(31)

The transformation laws of the 4-velocity components γ*i*1 and of the
4-acceleration components γ*i*2 under a change of coordinate chart from
(*U*, *x*)_{p} to (*U*, *x*)_{p}, follow from their
pointwise definition. From

γ^{i}(t) =X^{i}(γ^{i}(t)),

where *X*^{i} = *x*^{i} ∘
*x*^{−1}, one obtains the transformation law for
the 4-velocity and the 4-acceleration respectively:

γ i1 =Xijγj1(32)

γ i2 =Xijγj2 +Xijkγj1γk1.(33)

The *X**i**j* and
*X**i**jk*
denote the first and second partial derivatives of *X*^{i}(*x*^{i})
at *x*^{i} (*p*), namely,

∂ x^{i}∂ x^{j}and

∂ x^{i}∂ x^{j}∂x^{k}.

The expression *X**i**jk*γ*j*1γ*k*1 in
equation (33) represents the inhomogeneous term of the transformation
of the 4-acceleration. The inhomogeneity of the transformation law
entails that a 4-acceleration that is zero with respect to one
coordinate system is not zero with respect to another coordinate
system. This means that there does not exist a unique standard of
zero 4-acceleration that is intrinsic to the differential topological
structure of spacetime. Moreover, even the difference of the
4-accelerations of two bodies at the same spacetime point has no
absolute meaning, unless their 4-velocities happen to be the same.
This shows that while the differential topological structure of
spacetime gives us sufficient structure to do calculus and to derive
the transformation laws for 4-velocities and 4-accelerations by way
of simple differentiation, it does not provide sufficient structure
with which to determine a standard of zero 4-acceleration. Therefore,
as Weyl repeatedly emphasized, no solution to the problem of motion
is possible, unless “we dare to *acknowledge the
inertial* *structure as a real thing that not only exerts
effects upon matter but in turn suffers such effects*”. In
other words there must exist a structure in addition to the
differential topological structure in the form of a geometric
structure field, or in Weyl's words, *geometrisches
Strukturfeld*, which constitutes the inertial structure of
spacetime, and which provides the standard of zero 4-acceleration.
Since this field provides the standard of zero 4-acceleration we can
call it a geodesic 4-acceleration field, or simply, geodesic
acceleration field. A particle in *free motion *is one that is
exclusively governed by this geodesic acceleration field.

An acceleration field, geodesic or non-geodesic, can be constructed
in the following way. Since the terms that are independent of the
4-acceleration depend on both the spacetime location and on the
corresponding 4-velocity of the particle, it is necessary to specify
a *geometric field standard *for zero 4-acceleration that also
depends on those independent variables.

The transformation law for an 4-acceleration field can be obtained
from (33) by replacing γ*i*2 by *A**i*2(*x*^{i} , γ*i*1) and
γ*j*2 by *A**j*2(*x*^{i} ,
γ*i*1) to yield

Ai2(x^{i}, γi1) =XijAj2(x^{i},γi1) +Xijkγj1γk1.

The important special case for which the function *A**i*2(*x*^{i},
γ*i*1) is a geodesic 4-acceleration field
corresponds to the affine structure of spacetime. For this special
case the function *A**i*2(*x*^{i} ,
γ*i*1) is denoted by Γ*i*2(*x*^{i} ,
γ*i*1) and is given by

Γi2(x^{i},γi1) = −Γijk(x^{i},γi1)γj1γk1.

The familiar transformation law for the affine structure (geodesic 4-acceleration field) is then given by

Γ |
(34) |

Note that the inhomogeneous term *X**i**jk*γ*j*1γ*k*1 of the
geodesic 4-acceleration field is identical to the inhomogeneous term
of the transformation law (33) for the 4-acceleration of body motion.
The differences

γ |
(35) |

then transform linearly and homogeneously; consequently, the vanishing or non-vanishing of body accelerations relative to the standard of zero acceleration provided by the geodesic 4-acceleration field (the affine structure), is coordinate independent. That is, the 4-accelerations of bodies and the corresponding 4-forces, are tensorial quantities in concordance with experience.

The above argument for the necessity of geometric fields also holds
for 3-velocity and 3-acceleration, denoted respectively by ξα1 and
ξα2.
The transformation law for the 3-acceleration is much more
complicated than that of the 4-acceleration. However, analogous to
the case of 4-acceleration, the transformation law of 3-acceleration
is linear and is inhomogeneous in the 3-acceleration variable
ξα2.
Consequently, there does not exist a unique standard of zero
3-acceleration that is intrinsic to the differential topological
structure of spacetime. The standard of zero 3-acceleration must be
provided by a geodesic 3-acceleration field or geodesic directing
field, or what Weyl calls the guiding field. The guiding field is
also referred to as the projective structure of spacetime and is
denoted by Πα2(*x*^{i}, ξα1). It is a
function of spacetime location and the 3-velocity, both variables of
which are independent of the 3-acceleration, as is required. Since
the transformation law of the projective structure Πα2(*x*^{i}, ξα1) has the
same inhomogeneous form as the 3-acceleration ξα2, the
difference

ξα2 − Πα2( |
(36) |

also transforms linearly and homogeneously.

The components γ*i*2 and ξα2 of the
4-acceleration and 3-acceleration can be thought of as the dynamic
descriptors of a material body. On the other hand, the components
Γ*i*2(*x*^{i},γ*i*1) and
Πα2(*x*^{i}, ξα1) of the
geodesic acceleration field, and the geodesic directing field,
respectively, are *field *quantities. The differences

γ |
(37) |

and

ξα2 − Πα2( |
(38) |

denote the components of a coordinate independent *field-body*
*relation*.^{[71]}

Weyl (1924b) remarks:

We have known since Galileo and Newton, that the motion of a body involves an inherent struggle between inertia and force. According to the old view, the inertial tendency of persistence, the “guidance”, which gives a body its natural inertial motion, is based on a formal geometric structure of the spacetime (uniform motion in a straight line) which resides once and for all in spacetime independently of any natural processes. This assumption Einstein rejects; because whatever exerts as powerful effects as inertia—for example, in opposition to the molecular forces of two colliding trains it rips apart their freight cars—must be something real which itself suffers effect from matter. Moreover, Einstein recognized that the guiding field's variability and dependence on matter is revealed in gravitational effects. Therefore, the dualism between guidance and force is maintained; but

(G)Guidance is a physical field, like the electromagnetic field, which stands in mutual interactionwith matter. Gravitation belongs to the guiding field and not to force.Only thus is it possible to explain the equivalence between inertial and gravitational mass.

To move from the old conception to the new conception (G) means, according to Weyl (1924b)

to replace the geometric difference between uniform and accelerated motion with the dynamicdifference between guidance and force.Opponents of Einstein asked the question: Since the church tower receives a jolt in its motion relative to the train just as the train receives a jolt in its motion relative to the church tower, why does the train become a wreckage and not the church tower which it passes? Common sense would answer: because the train is ripped out of the pathway of the guiding field, but the church tower is not. … As long as one ignores the guiding field one can neither speak of absolute nor of relative motion; only if one gives due consideration to the guiding field does the concept of motion acquire content. The theory of relativity, correctly understood, does not eliminate absolute motion in favour of relative motion, rather it eliminates the kinematic concept of motion and replaces it with a dynamic one. The worldview for which Galileo fought is not undermined by it [relativity]; to the contrary, it is more concretely interpreted.

#### 4.4.4 Weyl's Field-Body Relationist Ontology and Newton's Laws of Motion

It is now possible to provide a reformulation of Newton's laws of
motion which explicitly takes account of Weyl's
field-body-relationalist spacetime ontology, and his analysis of the
concept of motion. The law of inertia is an empirically verifiable
statement^{[72]}
which says

The Law of Inertia:There exists on spacetime a unique projective structure Π_{2}or equivalently, a unique geodesic directing field Π_{2}.

*Free motion *is defined with reference to the projective
structure Π_{2} as follows:

Definition of Free Motion:A possible or actual material body is in a state of free motion during any part of its history just in case its motion is exclusively governed by the geodesic directing field (projective structure), that is, just in case the corresponding segment of its world path is a solution path of the differential equation determined by the unique projective structure of spacetime.

Newton's second law of motion may be reformulated as follows:

The Law of Motion:With respect to any coordinate system, the world line path of a possible or actual material body satisfies an equation of the formm(ξα2 − Πα2 (x^{i}, ξα1)) =F^{α}(x^{i}, ξα1),where

mis a scalar constant characteristic of the material body called its inertial mass andF^{α}(x^{i}, ξα1) is the 3-force acting on the body.

To emphasize, the Law of Inertia and the Law of Motion, as formulated
above, apply to *all*, relativistic or non-relativistic,
curved or flat, dynamic or non-dynamic, spacetime theories. The
reason for the general character of these laws consists in the fact
that they require for their formulation only the local differential
topological structure of spacetime, a structure which is common to
all spacetime theories. In addition, as was noted earlier in
§4.2, the affine and projective spacetime structures are
G-structures. Consequently, they may be flat or non-flat; *but
they can never vanish*. In theories prior to the advent of
general relativity, the affine and projective structures were flat.
However, it was common practice to use coordinates systems which were
*adapted *to these flat G-structures. And since in such
adapted coordinate systems the components of the affine and
projective structures vanish, it was difficult to recognize and to
appreciate the existence of these structures and their important role
in providing a coherent account of motion.

#### 4.4.5 Mie's Pure Field Theory, Weyl's ‘Agens Theory’ and Wormhole Theory of Matter

We saw that Weyl forcefully advoacated a *field-body ontological
dualism*, according to which matter and the guiding field are
independent physical realities that causally interact with each
other: matter uniquely generates the various states of the guiding
field and the guiding field in turn acts on matter.

Weyl did not always subscribe to this ontological dualist position.
For a short period, from 1918 to 1920, he advocated a *pure field
theory of matter *developed in 1912 by Gustav Mie, in the context
of Einstein's special theory of relativity:

Pure Field Theory of Matter:

The physical field has an independent reality that is not reducible to matter; rather, the physical field is constitutive of all matter in the sense that the mass (quantity of matter) of a material particle, such as an electron, consists of a large field energy that is concentrated in a very small region of spacetime.

Mie's theory of matter is akin to the traditional *geometric view
*of matter: matter is *passive *and *pure*
*extension*. Weyl (1921b) remarks that he adopted the
standpoint of the classical pure field theory of matter in the first
three editions of Weyl (1923b) because of its beauty and unity, but
then gave it up. Weyl (1931a) points out in the Rouse Ball Lecture
that since the theory of general relativity geometrized a physical
entity, the gravitational field, it was natural to try to
*geometrize the whole of physics*. Prior to the advent of
quantum physics one was justified in regarding gravitation and
electromagnetism as the only basic entities of nature and to seek
their unification by geometrizing both. One could hope, following the
example of Gustav Mie, to construct elementary material particles as
*knots of energy *in the gravitational-electromagnetic field,
that is, tiny demarcated regions in which the field magnitudes attain
very high values.

Already in a letter to Felix
Klein,^{[73]}
toward the end of 1920, Weyl indicated that he had finally freed
himself completely from Mie's theory of matter. It now appeared to
him that the classical field theory of matter is not the key to
reality. In the Rouse Ball Lecture Weyl adduces two reasons for this.

First, due to quantum mechanics, there are, in addition to
electromagnetic waves, *matter waves *(*Materiewellen*)
represented by Schrödinger's wave function ψ. And Pauli and
Dirac recognized that ψ is not a scalar but a magnitude with
several components. Thus, from the point of view of the classical
field theory of matter not two but three entities would have to be
unified. Moreover, given the transformation properties of the wave
function, Weyl says it is certain that the magnitude ψ cannot be
reduced to gravitation or electromagnetism. Weyl saw clearly, that
this *geometric view *of matter or physics—which to a
certain extent had also motivated his earlier construction and manner
of presentation of a *pure infinitesimal geometry *— was
untenable in light of the new developments in atomic physics.

The second reason, Weyl says, consists in the radical new
interpretation of the wave function, which replaces the concept of
intensity with that of probability. It is only through such a
statistical interpretation that the corpuscular and atomistic aspect
of nature is properly recognized. Instead of a *geometric
*treatment of the classical field theory of matter, the new
quantum theory called for a *statistical *treatment of
matter.^{[74]}
Already in 1920, Weyl (1920) addressed the relationship between
*causal *and *statistical *approaches to
physics.^{[75]}

The theory of general relativity, as well as early developments in
atomic physics, clearly tell us, Weyl (1921b) suggests, that matter
uniquely determines the field, and that there exist deeper underlying
physical laws with which modern physics, such as quantum theory, is
concerned, which specify “how the field is affected by
matter”. That is, experience tells us that matter plays the
role of a *causal agent *which uniquely determines the field,
and which therefore has an independent physical reality that cannot
be reduced to the field on which it acts. Weyl (1921b, 1924e) refers
to his theory of matter as the *Agenstheorie der Materie
*(literally, *agent-theory of* *matter*):

Matter-Field Dualism (Weyl's Agens Theory of Matter):

Matter and field are independent physical realities that causally interact with each other: matter uniquely generates the various states of the field and the field in turn acts on matter. To excite the field is the essential primary function of matter. The field's function is to respond to the action of matter and is thus secondary. The secondary role of the field is to transmit effects (from body to body) caused by matter, thereby in return affecting matter.

Weyl notes that the view, that matter uniquely determines the field,
has also been adopted as a necessary postulate for an opposing
ontological standpoint: *Matter is the only thing which is
genuinely real*. According to this view, held to a certain degree
by the younger Einstein and others who advocated a form of Machian
empiricism, the field is relegated to play the role of a feeble
extensive medium which transmits effects from body to
body.^{[76]}
That is, the field laws, namely certain implicit differential
connections between the various possible states of the field, on the
basis of which the field alone is capable of transmitting effects
caused by matter, can essentially have no more significance for
reality than the laws of geometry could, according to earlier views.
As we saw, Weyl held that no satisfactory solution can be given to
the problem of motion as long as we adhere to the Einstein-Machian
empiricist position which relegates the field to the role of a feeble
extensive medium, and which does not acknowledge that the guiding
field is physically real. However, from the standpoints of a *pure
field theory of matter* and Weyl's *agens theory of
matter*, a satisfactory answer to Mach's paradox can be given:
the reason why a stationary, homogeneous elastic sphere will, when
set in rotation, bulge at the equator and flatten at the poles, is
due to the fact that the complete physical system consisting of both
the body *and *the guiding field, differs in the rotating case
from the stationary one. The local guiding field is the real cause of
the inertial forces.

Weyl lists two reasons in support for his agens theory of matter.
First, the agens theory of matter is the only theory which coheres
with the basic experiences of life and physics: matter generates the
field and all our actions ultimately involve matter. For example,
only through matter can we change the field. Secondly, in order to
understand the fact of the existence of charged material particles,
we have two possibilities: either we follow Mie and adopt a pure
field theory of matter, or we elevate the ontological status of
matter and regard it as a *real *singularity of the field and
not merely as a high concentration of field energy in a tiny region
of spacetime. Since Mie's approach is necessarily limited to the
framework of the theory of special relativity, and since there is no
room in the general theory of relativity for a generalization and
modification of the classical field laws, as envisaged by Mie in the
context of the special theory of relativity, Weyl adopted the second
possibility. He was motivated to do so by his recognition that the
field equation of an electron at rest contains a finite mass term
*m* that appears to have nothing to do with the energy of the
associated field. Weyl's subsequent analysis of mass in terms of
electromagnetic field energy provided a definition of mass and a
derivation of the basic equations of mechanics, and led Weyl to the
invention of the topological idea of *wormholes *in spacetime.
Weyl did not use the term ‘wormholes’; it was John
Wheeler who later coined the term ‘wormhole’ in 1957.
Weyl spoke of *one-dimensional tubes *instead.
“Inside” these tubes no space exists, and their
boundaries are, analogous to infinite distance, inaccessible; they do
not belong to the field. In a chapter entitled “Hermann Weyl
and the Unity of Knowledge” Wheeler (1994) says,

Another insight Weyl gave us on the nature of electricity is topological in character and dates from 1924. We still do not know how to assess it properly or how to fit it into the scheme of physics, although with each passing decade it receives more attention. The idea is simple. Wormholes thread through space as air channels through Swiss cheese. Electricity is not electricity. Electricity is electric lines of force trapped in the topology of space.

#### 4.4.6 Relativistic Cosmology and Weyl's Postulate

A year after Einstein (1916) had established the field equations of his new general theory of relativity, Einstein (1917) applied his theory for the first time to cosmology. In doing so, Einstein made several assumptions:

Cosmological Principle:

Like Newton, Einstein assumed that the universe ishomogeneousandisotropicin its distribution of matter.

Static Universe:

Einstein assumed, as did Newton and most cosmologists at that time, that the universe is static on the large scale.

Mach's Principle:

Einstein believed that the metric field is completely determined through the masses of bodies. The metric field is determined through the energy-momentum tensor of the field equations.

The *cosmological principle *continuous to play an important
role in cosmological modelling to this day. However, Einstein's
second assumption that the universe is static was in conflict with
his field equations, which permitted models of the universe that were
homogeneous and isotropic, but *not static*. In this regard,
Einstein's difficulties were essentially the same that Newton had
faced: A static Newtonian model involving an infinite container with
an infinite number of stars was unstable; that is, local regions
would collapse under gravity. Because Einstein was committed to
Mach's Principle he faced a problem concerning the *boundary
conditions *for *infinite *space containing *finite
*amount of
matter.^{[77]}
Einstein recognized that it was impossible to choose boundary
conditions such that the ten potentials of the metric
*g*_{ij} are completely determined by the
energy-momentum tensor *T*_{ij}, as required by
Mach's Principle. That is, the boundary conditions “flat at
infinity” entail a *global* *inertial frame *that
is tied to *empty flat space at infinity*, and hence is
unrelated to the mass-energy content of space, contrary to Mach's
Principle, according to which *only *mass-energy can influence
inertia.

Einstein thought that he could solve the difficulties of an unstable
non-static universe with boundary conditions at infinity that do not
satisfy Mach's Principle, by introducing the cosmological term
Λ into his field equations. He showed that for positive values
of the cosmological constant his modified field equation admitted a
solution for a
static^{[78]}
universe in which space is curved, unbounded and finite; that is,
space is a hyper surface of a *sphere in four*
*dimensions*. Einstein's spatially closed universe is often
referred to as Einstein's “cylinder” world: with two of
the spatial dimensions suppressed, the model universe can be pictured
as a cylinder where the radius *A* represents the space and the
axis the time coordinate.

Figure 9: Einstein Universe

According to Einstein's Machian convictions, since inertia is
determined only by matter, there can be no inertial structure or
field in the absence of matter. Consequently, it is impossible,
Einstein conjectured, to find a solution to the field
equations—that is, to determine the metric
*g*_{ij}—if the energy-momentum tensor
*T*_{ij} representing the mass-energy content of
the universe is zero. The non-existence of ‘vacuum
solutions’ for a static universe demonstrated, Einstein
thought, that Mach's Principle had been successfully incorporated
into his theory of general relativity. Einstein also believed that
his solution was unique because of the assumptions of isotropy and
homogeneity.^{[79]}

However, Einstein was mistaken. In 1917, the Dutch astronomer Willem
de Sitter published another solution to Einstein's field equations
containing the cosmological constant. De Sitter's solution showed
that Einstein's solution is not a unique solution of his field
equations. In addition, since de Sitter's universe is empty it
provided a direct counter-example to Einstein's hope that Mach's
Principle had been successfully incorporated into his
theory.^{[80]}

There are cosmologists who, like Einstein, are favourably disposed
towards some version of Mach's Principle, and who believe that the
local laws, which are satisfied by various physical fields, are
determined by the large scale structure of the universe. On the other
hand, there are those cosmologists who, like Weyl, take a
conservative approach; they take empirically confirmed *local
*laws and investigate what these laws might imply about the
universe as a whole. Our understanding of the large scale structure
of the universe, Weyl emphasized, must be based on theories and
principles which are verified locally. Einstein's general theory is a
*local *field theory; like electromagnetism, it is a *close
action*
*theory*.^{[81]}
Weyl (1924b) says:

It appears to me that one can grasp the concrete physical content of the theory of relativity without taking a position regarding the causal relationship between the masses of the universe and inertia.

And, referring to (G), (see citation at the end of §4.4.3),
which says that “*Guidance is a physical field, like
the* *electromagnetic field, which stands in mutual
interaction with matter. Gravitation belongs to the guiding field
and* *not to force*”, Weyl (1924b) says:

What I have so far presented and briefly formulated in the two sentences of G, that alone impacts on physics and underlies the actual individual investigations of problems of the theory of relativity. Mach's Principle, according to which the fixed stars intervene with mysterious power in earthly events, goes far beyond this [G] and is until now pure speculation; it merely has cosmological significance and does not become important for natural science until astronomical observations reach the totality of the cosmos [Weltganze], and not merely one island of stars [Sterneninsel]. We could leave the question unanswered if I did not have to admit that it is tempting to construct, on the basis of the theory of relativity, a picture of the totality of the cosmos.

Weyl's claim is that because general relativity is an inherently
*local *field theory, its validity and soundness is
essentially independent of global cosmological considerations.
However, if we wish to introduce such global considerations into our
local physics, then we can do so only on the basis of additional
assumptions, such as, for example, the Cosmological Principle,
already mentioned. In 1923 Weyl (1923b, §39) introduced another
cosmological assumption, namely, the so-called *Weyl
Postulate*. De Sitter's solution and the new astronomical
discoveries in the early 1920's, which suggested that the universe is
not static but expanding, led to a drastic change in thinking about
the nature of the universe and an increased scepticism towards
Einstein's model of a static universe. In 1923, Weyl (1923b,
§39) notes in the fifth edition of *Raum Zeit Materie*,
that despite its attractiveness, Einstein's cosmology suffers from
serious defects. Weyl begins by pointing out that spectroscopic
results indicate that the stars have an age. Weyl continued,

all our experiences about the distribution of stars show that the present state of the starry sky has nothing to do with a “

statistical final state.” The small velocities of the stars is due to a common origin rather than some equilibrium; incidentally, it appears, based on observation, that the more distant configurations are from each other, the greater the velocities on average. Instead of uniform distribution of matter, astronomical facts lead rather to the view that individual clouds of stars glide by in vast empty space.

Weyl further points out that de Sitter showed that Einstein's cosmological equations of gravity have “a very simple regular solution” and that an empty spacetime, namely, “a metrically homogeneous spacetime of non-vanishing curvature,” is compatible with these equations after all. Weyl says that de Sitter's solution, which on the whole is not static, forces us to abandon our predilection for a static universe.

The Einstein and the de Sitter universe are both spacetimes with two separate fringes, the infinitely remote past and the infinitely remote future. Dropping two of its spatial dimensions we imagine Einstein's universe as the surface of a straight cylinder of a certain radius and de Sitter's universe as a one sheeted hyperboloid. Both surfaces are surfaces of infinite extent in both directions. Both the Einstein universe and the de Sitter universe spread from the eternal past to the eternal future. However, unlike de Sitter's universe, in Einstein's universe “the metrical relations are such that the light cone issuing from a world point is folded back upon itself an infinite number of times. An observer should therefore see infinitely many images of a star, showing him the star in states between which an eon has elapsed, the time needed by the light to travel around the sphere of the world.” Weyl (1930) says:

… I start from de Sitter's solution: the world, according to its metric constitution, has the character of a four-dimensional “sphere” (hyperboloid)

x21 +x22 +x23 +x24 −x25 =a^{2}(39) in a five-dimensional quasi-euclidean space, with the line element

ds^{2}=dx21 +dx22 +dx23 +dx24 −dx25.(40) The sphere has the same degree of metric homogeneity as the world of the special theory of relativity, which can be conceived as a four-dimensional “plane” in the same space. The plane, however, has only one connected infinitely distant “seam,” while it is the most prominent topological property of the sphere to be endowed with two—the infinitely distant past and the infinitely distant future. In this sense one may say that space is closed in de Sitter's solution. On the other hand, however, it is distinguished from the well-known Einstein solution, which is based on a homogeneous distribution of mass, by the fact that the null cone of future belonging to a world-point does not overlap with itself; in this causal sense, the de Sitter space is open.

On this hyperboloid, a single star (nebula or galaxy, in later
contexts) *A*, also called “observer” by Weyl,
traces a geodesic world line, and from each point of the star's world
line a light cone opens into the future and fills a region *D*,
which Weyl calls the *domain of influence of the star. *In de
Sitter's cosmology this domain of influence covers only half of the
hyperboloid and Weyl suggests that it is reasonable to assume that
this half of the hyperboloid corresponds to the real world.

Figure 10: De Sitter's hyperboloid with domain of influence *D*
covering half of the hyperboloid and world lines of stars.

There are innumerable stars or geodesics, according to Weyl, that
have the same domain of influence as the arbitrarily chosen star
*A*; they form, he says, a *system that has been causally
interconnected since eternity. *Such a system of causally
interconnected stars Weyl describes as stars of a common origin that
lies in an infinitely remote past. The sheaf of world-lines of such a
system of stars converges, in the direction of the infinitely remote
past, on an infinitely small part of the total extent of the
hyperboloid, and diverges in the direction of the future on an ever
increasing extent of the hyperboloid. Weyl's choice of singling out a
particular sheaf of non-intersecting timelike geodesics as
constituting the cosmological substratum is the content of Weyl's
Postulate. Weyl (1923b, 295) says:

The hypothesis is suggestive, that all the celestial bodies which we know belong to such a single system; this would explain the small velocities of the stars as a consequence of their common origin.

The transition from a static to a dynamic universe opens up the
possibility of a disorderly universe where galaxies could collide,
that is, their world lines might intersect. Roughly speaking, Weyl's
Postulate states that the actual universe is an orderly universe. It
says that the world lines of the galaxies form a 3-sheaf of
non-intersecting^{[82]}
geodesics orthogonal to layers of spacelike hypersurfaces.

Figure 11: Weyl's Postulate

Since the relative velocities of matter is small in each collection
of galaxies extending over an astronomical neighbourhood, one can
approximate a “smeared-out” motion of the galaxies and
introduce a *substratum *or *fluid *which fills space
and in which the galaxies move like “fundamental
particles”.^{[83]}
Weyl's postulate says that observers associated with this smeared-out
motion constitute a privileged class of observers of the universe.
Since geodesics do not intersect, according to Weyl's Postulate,
there exist one and only one geodesic which passes through each
spacetime point. Consequently, matter possesses a unique velocity at
any spacetime point. Therefore, the fluid may be regarded as a
*perfect fluid*; and this is the essential content of Weyl's
Postulate.

Since the geodesics of the galaxies are orthogonal to a layer of
spacelike hypersrfaces according to Weyl's Postulate, one can
introduce coordinates (*x*^{0} , *x*^{1} ,
*x*^{2} , *x*^{3}) such that the spacelike
hypersurfaces are given by *x*^{0} = constant, and the
spacelike coordinates *x*^{α} (α = 1, 2, 3)
are constant along the geodesics of each galaxy. Therefore, the
spacelike coordinates *x*^{α} are *co-moving
*coordinates along the geodesics of each galaxy. The
orthogonality condition permits a choice of the time coordinate
*x*^{0} such that the metric or line element has the
form

ds^{2}= ( dx^{0})^{2}−g_{αβ}dx^{α}dx^{β}= c^{2}dt^{2}−g_{αβ}dx^{α}dx^{β},(41)

where ct = *x*^{0}, *x*^{0} is called the
*cosmic time*, and *t* is the *proper time *of any
galaxy. The spacelike hypsersurfaces are therefore the surfaces of
simultaneity with respect to the cosmic time *x*^{0}.
The Cosmological Principle in turn tells us that these hypersurfaces
of simultaneity are homogeneous and isotropic.

Independently, Robertson and Walker, were subsequently able to give a precise mathematical derivation of the most general metric by assuming Weyl's Postulate and the Cosmological Principle.

#### 4.4.7 Discovering Hubble's Law

Weyl's introduction of his Postulate made it possible for him to
provide the first satisfactory treatment of the cosmological
redshift. Consider a light source, say a star *A*, which emits
monochromatic light that travels along null geodesics *L*,
*L*′, … to an observer *O*. Let *s* be
the proper time of the light source, and let σ be the proper
time of the observer *O*. Then to every point *s* on the
world line of the light source *A* there corresponds a point on
the world line of the observer *O*, namely, σ =
σ(s).

Figure 12: A body or star *A* emits monochromatic light which
travels along null geodesics *L*, *L*′, … to
an observer *O*.

Consequently, if one of the generators of the light cone issuing from
*A*'s world line at *A*'s proper time
*s*_{0}—the null geodesic *L*—reaches
observer *O* at the observer's proper time
σ(*s*_{0}), then

dσ =

dσ(s)ds_{s∘}ds.(42)

Therefore, the frequency ν_{A} of the light that
would be measured by some hypothetical observer on *A* is
related to the frequency ν_{O} measured on *O*
by

=

ν _{O}ν _{A}.

dσ(s)ds(43)

According to Weyl (1923c) this relationship holds in arbitrary
spacetimes and for arbitrary motions of source and observer. Weyl
(1923b, Anhang III) then applied this relationship to de Sitter's
world and showed, to lowest order, that the redshift is *linear
*in distance; that is, Weyl theoretically derived, what was later
called *Hubble's* *redshift law*. Using Slipher's
redshift data Weyl estimated a *Hubble constant *six years
prior to Hubble. Weyl (1923b, Anhang III) remarks:

It is noteworthy that neither the elementary nor Einstein's cosmology lead to such a redshift. Of course, one cannot claim today, that our explanation hits the right mark, especially since the views about the nature and distance of the spiral nebulae are still very much in need of further clarification.

In 1933 Weyl gave a lecture in Göttingen in which Weyl (1934b) recalls

According to the Doppler effect the receding motion of the stars is revealed in a redshift of their spectral lines which is proportional to distance. In this form, where De Sitter's solution of the gravitational equation is augmented by an assumption concerning the undisturbed motion of the stars, I had predicted the redshift in the year 1923.

### 4.5 Quantum Mechanics and Quantum Field Theory

#### 4.5.1 Group Theory

During the period 1925–1926 Weyl published a sequence of
groundbreaking papers (Weyl (1925, 1926a,b,c)) in which he presented
a general theory of the representations and invariants of the
classical Lie groups. In these celebrated papers Weyl drew together
I. Schur's work on invariants and representations of the
*n*-dimensional rotation group, and É. Cartan's work on
semisimple Lie algebras. In doing so, Weyl utilized different fields
of mathematics such as, tensor algebra, invariant theory, Riemann
surfaces and Hilbert's theory of integral equations. Weyl himself
considered these papers his greatest work in mathematics.

The central role that group theoretic techniques played in Weyl's analysis of spacetime was one of several factors which led Weyl to his general theory of the representations and invariants of the classical Lie groups. It was in the context of Weyl's investigation of the space-problem (see §4.2) that Weyl came to appreciate the value of group theory for investigating the mathematical and philosophical foundations of physical theories in general, and for dealing with fundamental questions motivated by the general theory of relativity, in particular.

A motivation of quite another sort, which led Weyl to his general
representation theory, was provided by Study when he attacked Weyl
specifically, as well as other unnamed individuals, by accusing them
“of having neglected a rich cultural domain (namely, the theory
of invariants), indeed of having completely ignored
it”.^{[84]}
Weyl (1924c) replied immediately providing a new foundation for the
theory of invariants of the special linear groups *SL*(*n*,
ℂ) and its most important subgroups, the special orthogonal
group *SO*(*n*, ℂ) and the special symplectic group
*SS**p*(^{n}/_{2}, ℂ) (for
*n* even) based on algebraic identities due to Capelli. In a
footnote, Weyl (1924c) sarcastically informed Study that “even
if he [Weyl] had been as well versed as Study in the theory of
invariants, he would not have used the symbolic method in his book
*Raum, Zeit, Materie *and even with the last breath of his
life would not have mentioned the algebraic completeness theorem for
invariant theory”. Weyl's point was that in the context of his
book *Raum-Zeit-Materie*, the kernel-index method of tensor
analysis is more appropriate than the methods of the theory of
algebraic
invariants.^{[85]}

While this account of events leading up to Weyl's groundbreaking
papers on group theory seems reasonable enough, Hawkins (2000) has
suggested a fuller account, which brings into focus Weyl's deep
philosophical interest in the mathematical foundations of the theory
of general relativity by drawing attention to Weyl (1924d) on tensor
symmetries, which, according to Hawkins, played an important role in
redirecting Weyl's research interests toward pure
mathematics.^{[86]}
Weyl (1949b, 400) himself noted that his interest in the
philosophical foundations of the general theory of relativity
motivated his analysis of the representations and invariants of the
continuous groups: “I can say that the wish to understand what
really is the mathematical substance behind the formal apparatus of
relativity theory led me to the study of representations and
invariants of groups; and my experience in this regard is probably
not unique”. Weyl's paper (Weyl (1924a)), and the first chapter
Weyl (1925) of his celebrated papers on representation theory, have
the same title: “The group theoretic foundation of the tensor
calculus”. Hawkins (1998) says, Weyl

had obtained through the theory of groups, and in particular through the theory of group representations—as augmented by his own contributions—what he felt was a proper mathematical understanding of tensors, tensor symmetries, and the reason they represent the source of all linear quantities that might arise in mathematics or physics. Once again, he had come to appreciate the importance of the theory of groups—and now especially the theory of group representation—for gaining insight into mathematical questions suggested by relativity theory. Unlike his work on the space problem …Weyl now found himself drawing upon far more than the rudiments of group theory. … And of course Cartan

^{[87]}had showed that the space problem could also be resolved with the aid of results about representations. In short, the representation theory of groups had proved itself to be a powerful tool for answering the sort of mathematical questions that grew out of Weyl's involvement with relativity theory.

Somewhat later, Weyl (1939) wrote a book, entitled *The Classical
Groups, Their Invariants and* *Representations*, in which
he returned to the theory of invariants and representations of the
semisimple Lie groups. In this work, he satisfied his ambition
“to derive the decisive results for the most important of these
groups by direct algebraic construction, in particular for the full
group of all non-singular linear transformations and for the
orthogonal group”. He intentionally restricted the discussion
of the general theory and devoted most of the book to the derivation
of specific results for the general linear, the special linear, the
orthogonal and the symplectic groups.

#### 4.5.2 Weyl's philosophical critique of Cartan's approach to geometry

As far back as the 1920s, the great French mathematician and geometer
Élie Cartan had recognized that the notions of *parallelism
*and *affine connection *admit of an important
generalization in the sense that (1) the spaces for which the notion
of infinitesimal parallel transport is defined need not be the
tangent spaces that intrinsically arise from the differential
structure of a Riemannian manifold *M* at each of its points;
rather, the spaces are general spaces that are not intrinsically tied
to the differential manifold structure of *M*, and (2) relevant
groups operate on these general spaces directly and not on the
manifold *M*, and therefore groups play a dominant and
independent role.

Weyl (1938a) published a critical review of Cartan's (1937) book in
which Cartan further developed his notion of *moving frames
*(“repères mobiles”) and *generalized
spaces *(“espaces généralisés”).
However, Weyl (1988) expressed some of his reservations to Cartan's
approach as early as 1925; and four years later Weyl (1929e)
presented a more detailed critique.

Cartan's approach to differential geometry is in response to the fact
that Euclidean geometry was generalized in two ways resulting in
essentially two incompatible approaches to
geometry.^{[88]}
The first generalization occurred with the discovery of non-Euclidean
geometries and with Klein's (1921) subsequent Erlanger program in
1872, which provided a coherent group theoretical framework for the
various non-Euclidean geometries. The second generalization of
Euclidean geometry occurred when Riemann (1854) discovered Riemannian
geometry.

The two generalizations of Euclidean geometry essentially constitute incompatible approaches to applied geometry. In particular, while Klein's Erlanger program provides an appropriate group theoretical framework for Einstein's theory of special relativity, it is Riemannian geometry, and not Klein's group theoretic approach, which provides the appropriate underlying geometric framework for Einstein's theory of general relativity. As Cartan observes:

General relativity threw into physics and philosophy the antagonism that existed between the two principle directors of geometry, Riemann and Klein. The space-times of classical mechanics and of special relativity are of the type of Klein, those of general relativity are of the type of Riemann.

^{[89]}

Cartan eliminated the incompatibility between the two approaches by
synthesizing Riemannian geometry and Klein's Erlanger program through
a further generalization of both, resulting in what Cartan called,
*generalized spaces *(or *generalized geometries*).

In his Erlanger program, Klein provided a unified approach to the
various “global” geometries by showing that each of the
geometries is characterized by a particular group of transformations:
Euclidean geometry is characterized by the group of translations and
rotations in the plane; the geometry of the sphere
*S*^{2} is characterized by the orthogonal group
*O*(3); and the geometry of the hyperbolic plane is
characterized by the pseudo-orthogonal group *O*(1, 2). In
Klein's approach each geometry is a (connected) manifold endowed with
a group of automorphisms, that is, a Lie group *G* of
“motions” that acts *transitively *on the
manifold, such that two figures are regarded as congruent if and only
if there exists an element of the appropriate Lie group *G* that
transforms one of the figures into the other. A generalized geometry
in Klein's sense shifts the emphasis from the underlying manifold or
space to the group. Thus a Klein geometry (space) consists of, (1) a
smooth manifold, (2) a Lie group *G* (the principal group of the
geometry), and (3) a transitive action of *G* on the manifold.
Besides being “global”, a Klein geometry (space) is
completely homogeneous in the sense that its points cannot be
distinguished on the basis of geometric relations because the
transitive group action preserves such relations.

As Weyl (1949b) describes it, Klein's approach to the various “global” geometries is very suited to Einstein's theory of special relativity:

According to Einstein's special relativity theory the four-dimensional world of the spacetime points is a Klein space characterized by a definite group Γ; and that group is the … group of Euclidean similarities—with one very important difference however. The orthogonal transformations, i.e., the homogeneous linear transformations which leave

x21 +x22 +x23 +x24unchanged have to be replaced by the Lorentz transformations leaving

x21 +x22 +x23 −x24invariant.

However, with the advent of Einstein's general theory of relativity
the emphasis shifted from *global *homogeneous geometric
structures to *local *inhomogeneous structures. Whereas Klein
spaces are global and fully homogeneous, the Riemannian metric
structure underlying Einstein's general theory is local and
inhomogeneous. A general Riemannian space admits of no isometry other
than the identity.

Referring to Cartan (1923a), Weyl (1929e) says that Cartan's
generalization of Klein geometries consists in adapting Klein's
Erlanger program to infinitesimal geometry by applying Klein's
Erlanger program to the tangent plane rather than to the manifold
itself.^{[90]}

Cartan developed a general scheme of infinitesimal geometry in which Klein's notions were applied to the tangent plane and not to the

n-dimensional manifoldMitself.

Figure 13: Cartan's generalization

Figure 13 above, adapted from Sharpe (1997), may help in clarifying the discussion. The generalization of Euclidean geometry to a Riemannian space (the left vertical blue arrow) says:

- A general Riemannian space approximates Euclidean space only locally; that is, at each point
*p*∈*M*there exists a**tangent space**T(*M*_{p})*that arises intrinsically from the underlying differential structure of**M*. - In addition, a Riemannian space is inhomogeneous through the introduction of curvature.

Analogously, Cartan's generalization of a Klein space to a Cartan space (the right vertical blue arrow) says:

- Cartan's generalized space Σ(M) approximates a Klein space only locally; that is, at each point
*p*∈*M*there exists a**“Tangent Space”**, that is, a Klein space Σ(*M*_{p}). Note that a Klein space Σ(*M*_{p}) is itself a generalized space (in the sense of Cartan) with zero curvature; it possesses perfect homogeneity. - In addition, Cartan's generalized space Σ(M) is inhomogeneous by the introduction of curvature.

Figure 14: Cartan's generalized space

Cartan's generalized space Σ(M) is the space of all
**“Tangent Spaces” **(i.e., all Klein spaces
Σ(*M*_{p})) and contains a mixture of
homogeneous and inhomogeneous spaces (see figure 14).

Finally, Cartan's generalization of Riemannian space (lower
horizontal red arrow) (figure 13) turns on the recognition that the
**“Tangent Space” **in Cartan's sense is not
the same, or need not be the same, as the ordinary **tangent
space** that arises naturally from the underlying differential
structure of a Riemannian manifold. Cartan's
**“Tangent** **Space”
**Σ(*M*_{p}) at *p* ∈
*M* denotes what is known as a *fiber *in modern fiber
bundle language, where the manifold *M* is called the *base
space *of the fiber bundle.

In Weyl (1929e, 1988) and to a lesser extent in Weyl (1938a), Weyl
objected to Cartan's approach by noting that Cartan's
**“Tangent Space”**, namely the Klein space
Σ(*M*_{p}) associated with each point of
the manifold *M*, does not arise intrinsically from the
differential structure of the manifold the way the ordinary tangent
vector space does. Weyl therefore noted that it is necessary to
impose certain non-intrinsic embedding conditions on
Σ(*M*_{p}) that specify how the
**“Tangent** **Space”
**Σ(*M*_{p}) is associated with each
point of the manifold *M*. Paraphrasing Weyl, the situation is
as follows: We assume that we can associate a copy
Σ(*M*_{p}) of a given Klein space with each
point *p* of the manifold *M* and that the displacement of
the Klein space Σ(*M*_{p}) at *p*
∈ *M* to the Klein space
Σ(*M*_{p′}) associated with an
infinitely nearby point *p*′∈ M, constitutes an
isomorphic representation of Σ(*M*_{p}) on
Σ(*M*_{p′}) by means of an
infinitesimal action of the group *G*. In choosing an admissible
frame of reference *f* for each Klein space
Σ(*M*_{p}), their points are represented by
*normal *coordinates ξ. Any two frames
*f*, *f* ′ are related by a group
element *s* ∈ *G*, and a succession of transformations
*f* → *f* ′ and *f* ′
→ *f* ″ by *s* ∈ *G* and
*t* ∈ *G* respectively, relates *f* and
*f* ″ by the group composition *t* ∘
*s* ∈ *G*.

Nothing so far has been said about how specifically the
**“Tangent Space”**
Σ(*M*_{p}) is connected to the manifold.
Since Σ(*M*_{p}) is supposed to be a
generalization of the ordinary tangent space which arises
intrinsically from the local differential structure of *M*, Weyl
suggests that certain embedding conditions have to be imposed on the
*normal *coordinates ξ of the Klein space
Σ(*M*_{p}).

Embedding Condition 1:

We must first designate a point as the center of Σ(M_{p}) and then require that coincide or cover the pointp∈M. This leads, Weyl says, to a restriction in the choice of anormal coordinate systemξ on Σ(M_{p}). And becauseGacts transitively, a normal coordinate system ξ on Σ(M_{p}) can be chosen such that the normal coordinates ξ vanish at the center, that is, ξ^{1}= ξ^{2}= ⋯ = 0. The groupGis therefore restricted to the subgroupG_{0}of all representations ofGwhich leave the center invariant.

Embedding Condition 2:

The notion of a tangent plane also requires that there is a one-to-one linear mapping between the line elements of Σ(M_{p}) starting from 0, with the line elements ofMstarting fromp. This means that the number of dimension of the Klein space Σ(M_{p}) has the same number of dimension as the manifoldM.

Embedding Condition 3:

The infinitesimal displacement Σ(M_{p}) → Σ(M_{p′}) will carry an infinitesimal vector at the center of Σ(M_{p}), which is in one-to-one correspondence with a vector atp∈M, to the center of Σ(M_{p′}).

No further conditions need be imposed according to Weyl. If we
displace Σ(*M*_{p}) by successive steps
around a curve γ back to the point *p* ∈ *M*
then the final position of Σ(*M*_{p}) is
obtained from its original poition or orientation by a certain
automorphism Σ(*M*_{p}) →
Σ(*M*_{p}). This automorphism is Cartan's
generalization of Riemann's concept of curvature along the curve
γ on *M*.

According to Weyl, the **“Tangent Space”
**Σ(*M*_{p}) is not uniquely
determined by the differential structure of *M*. If *G*
were the affine group, Weyl says, then the conditions above would
fully specify the *normal *coordinate system
ξ^{α} on Σ(*M*_{p}) as a
function of the chosen local coordinates *x*^{i}
on *M*. Since this is not the case if *G* is a more
extensive group than the affine group, Weyl concludes that the
**“Tangent Space”**
Σ(*M*_{p}) “is not as yet uniquely
determined by the nature of *M*, and so long as this is not
accomplished we can not say that Cartan's theory deals only with the
manifold *M*.” Weyl adds:

Conversely, the tangent plane in

pin the ordinary sense, that is, the linear manifold of line elements inp, is a centered affine space; its groupGis not a matter of convention. This has always appeared to me to be a deficiency of the theory ….

The reader may wish to consult Ryckman (2005, 171–173), who argues “that a philosophical contention, indeed, phenomenological one, underlies the stated mathematical reasons that kept him [Weyl] for a number of years from concurring with Cartan's ”moving frame“ approach to differential geometry”.

In 1949 Weyl explicitly acknowledged and praised Cartan's approach.
Unlike his earlier critical remarks, he now considered it to be a
virtue that the frame of reference in
Σ(*M*_{p}) is independent of the choice of
coordinates on *M*. Weyl (1949b) says of the traditional
approach and Cartan's new approach to geometry:

Hence we have here before us the natural general basis on which that notion rests. The infinitesimal trend in geometry initiated by Gauss' theory of curved surfaces now merges with that other line of thought that culminated in Klein's Erlanger program.

It is not advisable to bind the frame of reference in Σ

_{p}to the coordinatesx^{i}covering the neighborhood ofpinM. In this respect the old treatment of affinely connected manifolds is misleading. … [I]n the modern development of infinitesimal geometry in the large, where it combines with topology and the associated Klein spaces appear under the name of fibres, it has been found best to keep therépères, the frames of the fibre spaces, independent of the coordinates of the underlying manifold.

Moreover, in 1949, Weyl also emphasizes that it is necessary to employ Cartan's method if one wishes to fit Dirac's theory of the electron into general relativity. Weyl (1949b) says:

When one tries to fit Dirac's theory of the electron into general relativity, it becomes imperative to adopt the Cartan method. For Dirac's four ψ-components are relative to a Cartesian (or rather a Lorentz) frame. One knows how they transform under transition from one Lorentz frame to another (spin representation of the Lorentz group); but this law of transformation is of such a nature that it cannot be extended to arbitrary linear transformations mediating between affine frames.

Weyl is here referring to his three important papers, which appeared
in 1929—the same year in which he had published his detailed
critique of Cartan's method—in which he investigates the
adaptation of Dirac's theory of the special relativistic electron to
the theory of general relativity, and where he develops the
*tetrad* or *Vierbein *formalism for the representation
of *local *two-component spinor structures on Lorentz
manifolds.

#### 4.5.3 Weyl's New Gauge Principle and Dirac's Special Relativistic Electron

Only a year after Pauli's review article in 1921, in which Pauli had
argued that Weyl's defence of his unified field theory deprives it of
its inherent convincing power from a physical point of view,
Schrödinger (1922) suggested the possibility that Weyl's 1918
gauge theory could suitably be employed in the quantum mechanical
description of the
electron.^{[91]}
Similar proposals were subsequently made by Fock (1926) and London
(1927).

With the advent of the quantum theory of the electron around 1927/28
Weyl abandoned his gauge theory of 1918. He did so because in the new
quantum theory a different kind of gauge invariance associated with
Dirac's theory of the electron was discovered which, as had been
suggested by Fock (1926) and London (1927), more adequately accounted
for the conservation of electric
charge.^{[92]}
Why did Weyl hold on to his gauge theory for almost a decade despite
a preponderance of compelling empirical arguments that were mounted
against it by Einstein, Pauli and
others?^{[93]}
In one of Weyl's (1918/1998) last letters to Einstein concerning his
unified field theory, Weyl made it clear that *it was mathematics
and not physics *that was the driving force behind his unified
field
theory.^{[94]}

Incidentally, you must not believe that it was because of physics that I introduced the linear differential form dϕ in addition to the quadratic form. I wanted rather to eliminate this “inconsistency” which always has been a bone of contention to me.

^{[95]}And then, to my surprise, I realized that it looked as if it might explain electricity. You clap your hands above your head and shout: But physics is not made this way!

As London (1927, 376–377) remarks, one must admire Weyl's immense courage in developing his gauge invariant interpretation of electromagnetism and holding on to it on the mere basis of purely formal considerations. London observes that the principle of equivalence of inertial and gravitational mass, which prompted Einstein to provide a geometrical interpretation of gravity, was at least a physical fact underlying gravitational theory. In contrast, an analogous fact was not known in the theory of electricity; consequently, it would seem that there was no compelling physical reason to think that rigid rods and ideal clocks would be under the universal influence of the electromagnetic field. To the contrary, London says, experience strongly suggests that atomic clocks exhibit sharp spectral lines that are unaffected by their history in the presence of a magnetic field, contrary to Weyl's non-integrability assumption. London concludes, that in the face of such elementary empirical facts it must have been an unusually clear metaphysical conviction which prevented Weyl from abandoning his idea that nature ought to make use of the beautiful geometrical possibilities that a pure infinitesimal geometry offers.

In 1955, shortly before his death, Weyl wrote an
addendum^{[96]}
to his 1918 paper *Gravitation und
Elektrizit**ä**t*, in which he looks back at
his early attempt to find a unified field theory and explains why he
reinterpreted his gauge theory of 1918, a decade later.

This work stands at the beginning of attempts to construct a “unified field theory” which subsequently were continued by many, it seems to me, without decisive results. As is known, the problem relentlessly occupied Einstein in particular, until his end. … The strongest argument for my theory appeared to be that gauge invariance corresponds to the principle of the conservation of electric charge just as coordinate invariance corresponds to the conservation theorem of energy-impulse. Later, quantum theory introduced the Schrödinger-Dirac potential ψ of the electron-positron field; the latter revealed an experimentally based principle of gauge invariance which guaranteed the conservation of charge and which connected the ψ with the electromagnetic potentials ϕ

_{i}in the same way that my speculative theory had connected the gravitational potentialsg_{ik}with ϕ_{i}, where, in addition, the ϕ_{i}are measured in known atomic rather than unknown cosmological units. I have no doubts that the principle of gauge invariance finds its correct place here and not, as I believed in 1918, in the interaction of electromagnetism and gravity.

By the late 1920s Weyl's methodological approach to gauge theory
underwent an “empirical turn”. In contrast to *a*
*priori *geometrical reasoning, which guided his early
unification attempts—Weyl calls it a “speculative
theory” in the above citation—by 1928/1929 Weyl
emphasized *experimentally-based principles *which underlie
gauge
invariance.^{[97]}

In early 1928 P. A. M. Dirac provided the first physically compelling
theoretical account of the dynamics of an electron in the presence of
an electric field. The components ψ^{i} (*x*)
of Dirac's four-component wave function or *spinor field *in
Minkowski space, ψ(*x*) = (ψ^{1} (*x*),
ψ^{2}(*x*), ψ^{3}(*x*),
ψ^{4}(*x*)), are complex-valued functions that
satisfy Dirac's first-order partial differential equation and provide
probabilistic information about the electron's dynamical behaviour,
such as angular momentum and location. Prior to the appearance of
*spinor fields* ψ in Dirac's equation, it was generally
thought that scalars, vectors and tensors provided an adequate system
of mathematical objects that would allow one to provide a
mathematical description of reality independently of the choice of
coordinates or reference
frames.^{[98]}
For example, spin zero particles (π mesons, α particles)
could be described by means of scalars; spin 1 particles (deuterons)
by vectors, and spin 2 particles (hypothetical gravitons) by tensors.
However, the most frequently occurring particles in Nature are
electrons, protons, and neutrons. They are spin
^{1}/_{2} particles, called *fermions *that
are properly described by mathematical objects called
*spinors*, which are neither scalars, vectors or
tensors.^{[99]}
Weyl referred to the ψ(*x*) in Dirac's equation as the
“Dirac quantity” and von Neumann called it the
“ψ(*x*)-vector”. Both von Neumann and Weyl, and
others, immediately recognized that Dirac had introduced something
that was new in theoretical physics. v. Neumann (1928, 876) remarks:

… ψ does by no means have the relativistic transformation properties of a common four-vector. … The case of a quantity with four components that is not a four-vector is a case which has never occurred in relativity theory; the Dirac ψ-vector is the first example of this type.

(Weyl (1929c)) notes that the spinor representation of the orthogonal
group *O*(1, 3) cannot be extended to a representation of the
general linear group *GL*(*n*), *n* = 4, with the
consequence that it is necessary to employ the *Vierbein*,
*tetrad *or Lorentz-structure formulation of the theory of
general relativity in order to incorporate Dirac's spinor fields
ψ(*x*):

The tensor calculus is not the proper mathematical instrument to use in translating the quantum-theoretic equations of the electron over into the

general theory of relativity.Vectors and terms [tensors] are so constituted that the law which defines the transformation of their components from one Cartesian set of axes to another can be extended to the most general linear transformation, to an affine set of axes. That is not the case for quantity ψ, however; this kind of quantity belongs to a representation of the rotation group which cannot be extended to the affine group. Consequently we cannot introduce components of ψ relative to an arbitrary coordinate system in general relativity as we can for the electromagnetic potential and field strengths. We must rather describe the metric at a pointpby local Cartesian axese(a) instead of by theg_{pq}. The wave field has definite components ψ+1,ψ+2,ψ−1,ψ−2 relative to such axes, and we know how they transform on transition to any other Cartesian axes inp.

Impressed by the initial success of Dirac's equation of the spinning electron within the special relativistic context, Weyl adapted Dirac's special relativistic theory of the electron to the general theory of relativity in three groundbreaking papers (Weyl (1929b,c,d)). A complete exposition of this formalism is presented in (Weyl (1929b)). O'Raifeartaigh (1997) says of this paper:

Although not fully appreciated at the time, Weyl's 1929 paper has turned out to be one of the seminal papers of the century, both from the philosophical and from the technical point of view.

In this ground braking paper, as well as in (Weyl (1929c,d)), Weyl
explicitly abandons his earlier attempt to unify electromagnetism
with the theory of general relativity. In his early attempt he
associated the electromagnetic vector potential
*A*_{j}(*x*) with the additional connection
coefficients that arise when a conformal structure is reduced to a
Weyl structure (see §4.1). The important concept of gauge
invariance, however, is preserved in his 1929 paper. Rather than
associating gauge transformations with the scale or gauge of the
spacetime metric tensor, Weyl now associates gauge transformations
with the phase of the Dirac spinor field ψ that represents
matter. In the introduction of (Weyl (1929b)), which presents in
detail the new formalism, Weyl describes his reinterpretation of the
gauge principle as follows:

The Dirac field-equations for ψ together with the Maxwell equations for the four potentials

f_{p}of the electromagnetic field have an invariance property which, from a formal point of view, is similar to the one that I called gauge invariance in my theory of gravitation and electromagnetism of 1918; the equations remain invariant when one makes the simultaneous replacementsψ bye^{iλ}ψ andf_{p}byf_{p}−,

∂λ ∂ x^{p}where λ is understood to be an arbitrary function of position in the four-dimensional world. Here the factor

e/ch, where −eis the charge of the electron,cis the speed of light, andh/π is the quantum of action, has been absorbed inf_{p}. The connection of this “gauge invariance” to the conservation of electric charge remains untouched. But an essential difference, which is significant for the correspondence to experience, is that the exponent of the factor multiplying ψ is not real but purely imaginary. ψ now assumes the role thatdsplayed in Einstein's old theory. It seems to me that this new principle of gauge invariance, which follows not from speculation but from experiment, compellingly indicates thatthe electromagneticfield is a necessary accompanying phenomenon, not of gravitation, but of the material wave fieldrepresented byψ. Since gauge invariance includes an arbitrary function λ it has the character of “general” relativity and can naturally only be understood in that context.

Weyl then introduces his two-component spinor theory in Minkowski
space. Since one of his aims is to adapt Dirac's theory to the curved
spacetime of general relativity, Weyl develops a theory of *local
*spinor structures for curved
spacetime.^{[100]}
He achieves this by providing a systematic formulation of *local
*tetrads or Vierbeins (orthonormal basis vectors). Orthonormal
frames had already been introduced as early as 1900 by Levi-Civita
and Ricci. Somewhat later, Cartan had shown the usefulness of
employing local orthonormal-basis vector fields, the so-called
“moving frames” in his investigation of Riemannian
geometry in the 1920s. In addition, Einstein (1928) had used tetrads
or Vierbeins in his attempt to unify gravitation and electricity by
resorting to *distant parallelism* with *torsion*. In
Einstein's theory, the effects of gravity and electromagnetism are
associated with a specialized torsion of spacetime rather than with
the curvature of spacetime. Since the curvature vanishes everywhere,
distant parallelism is a feature of Einstein's theory. However,
distant parallelism appeared to Weyl to be quite unnatural from the
viewpoint of Riemannian geometry. Weyl expressed his criticism in all
three papers (Weyl (1929b,c,d)) and he contrasted the way in which
Vierbeins are employed in his own work with the way they were used by
Einstein. In the introduction Weyl (1929b) says:

I prefer not to believe in distant parallelism for a number of reasons. First, my mathematical attitude resists accepting such an artificial geometry; it is difficult for me to understand the force that would keep the local tetrads at different points and in rotated positions in a rigid relationship. There are, I believe, two important physical reasons as well. In particular, by loosening the rigid relationship between the tetrads at different points, the gauge factor

e^{iλ}, which remains arbitrary with respect to the quantity ψ, changes from a constant to an arbitrary function of spacetime location; that is, only through the loosening of the rigidity does the actual gauge invariance become understandable. Secondly, the possibility to rotate the tetrads at different points independently from each other, is as we shall see, equivalent to the symmetry of the energy-momentum tensor or with the validity of its conservation law.

Every tetrad uniquely determines the pseudo-Riemannian spacetime
metric *g*_{ij}. However, the converse does not
hold since the tetrad has 16 independent components whereas the
spacetime metric, *g*_{ij} =
*g*_{ji}, has only 10 independent components. The
extra 6 degrees of freedom of the tetrads that are not determined by
the metric may be represented by the elements of a 6-parameter
internal Lorentz group. That is, the local tetrads are determined by
the spacetime metric up to local Lorentz transformations. The tetrad
formalism made it possible, therefore, for Weyl to derive, as a
special case of Noether's second
theorem^{[101]},
the energy-momentum conservation laws for general coordinate
transformations and the internal Lorentz transformations of the
tetrads. Moreover, Weyl had always emphasized the strong analogy
between gravitation and electricity. The tetrad formalism and the
conservation laws both made explicit and supported this analogy.

Weyl introduced the final section of his seminal 1929 paper saying “We now come to the critical part of the theory”, and presented a derivation of electromagnetism from the new gauge principle. The initial step in Weyl's derivation exploits the intrinsic gauge freedom of his two-component theory of spinors for Minkowski space, namely

ψ(x) →e^{iλ}ψ(x),

where the gauge factor is a constant. Since Weyl wished to adapt his
theory to the curved spacetime of general relativity, the above phase
transformation must be generalized to accommodate *local
*tetrads. That is, each spacetime point has its own tetrad and
therefore its own point-dependent gauge factor. The phase
transformation is thus given by

ψ(x) →e^{iλ(x)}ψ(x),

where the λ(*x*) is a function of spacetime. Weyl says:

We come now to the critical part of the theory. In my view the origin and the necessity for the electromagnetic field lie in the following justification. The components ψ

_{1},ψ_{2}are, in fact, not uniquely determined by the tetrad but only to the extent that they can still be multiplied by an arbitrary “gauge-factor”e^{iλ}of absolute value 1. The transformation of the ψ induced by a rotation of the tetrad is determined only up to such a factor. In the special theory of relativity one must regard this gauge factor as a constant, since we have here only a single point-independent tetrad. This is different in the general theory of relativity. Every point has its own tetrad, and hence its own arbitrary gauge factor, because the gauge factor necessarily becomes an arbitrary function of position through the removal of the rigid connection between tetrads at different points.

Today, the concept of gauge invariance plays a central role in
theoretical physics. Not until 1954 did Yang and Mills (1954)
generalize Weyl's electromagnetic gauge concept to the case of the
non-Abelian group
*O*(3).^{[102]}
Although Weyl's reinterpretation of gauge invariance had been
preceded by suggestions from London and Fock, it was Weyl, according
to O'Raifeartaigh and Straumann (2000),

who emphasized the role of gauge invariance as a

symmetry principlefrom which electromagnetism can be derived. It took several decades until the importance of this symmetry principle—in its generalized form to non-Abelian gauge groups developed by Yang, Mills, and others—also became fruitful for a description of the weak and strong interactions. The mathematics of the non-Abelian generalization of Weyl's 1929 paper would have been an easy task for a mathematician of his rank, but at the time there was no motivation for this from the physics side.

It is interesting in this context to consider the following remarks by Yang. Referring to Einstein's objection to Weyl's 1918 gauge theory, Yang (1986, 18) asked, “what has happened to Einstein's original objection after quantum mechanics inserted an − i into the scale factor and made it into a phase factor?” Yang continuous:

Apparently no one had, after 1929, relooked at Einstein's objection until I did in 1983. The result is interesting and deserves perhaps to be a footnote in the history of science: Let us take Einstein's Gedankenexperiment …. When the two clocks come back, because of the insertion of the factor − i, they would not have different scales but different phases. That would not influence their rates of time-keeping. Therefore, Einstein's original objection disappears. But you can ask a further question: Can one measure their phase difference? Well, to measure a phase difference one must do an interference experiment. Nobody knows how to do an interference experiment with big objects like clocks. However, one can do interference experiments with electrons. So let us change Einstein's Gedankenexperiment to one of bringing electrons back along two different paths and ask: Can one measure the phase difference? The answer is yes. That was in fact a most important development in 1959 and 1960 when Aharonov and Bohm realized—completely independently of Weyl—that electromagnetism has some meaning which was not understood before.

^{[103]}

We end the discussion on Weyl's gauge theory by quoting the following remarks by Dyson (1983).

A more recent example of a great discovery in mathematical physics was the idea of a gauge field, invented by Hermann Weyl in 1918. This idea has taken only 50 years to find its place as one of the basic concepts of modern particle physics. Quantum chromodynamics, the most fashionable theory of the particle physicists in 1981, is conceptually little more than a synthesis of Lie's group-algebras with Weyl's gauge fields.

The history of Weyl's discovery is quite unlike the history of Lie groups and Grassmann algebras. Weyl was neither obscure nor unrecognized, and he was working in 1918 in the most fashionable area of physics, the newborn theory of general relativity. He invented gauge fields as a solution of the fashionable problem of unifying gravitation with electromagnetism. For a few months gauge fields were at the height of fashion. Then it was discovered by Weyl and others that they did not do what was expected of them. Gauge fields were in fact no good for the purpose for which Weyl invented them. They quickly became unfashionable and were almost forgotten. But then, very gradually over the next fifty years, it became clear that gauge fields were important in a quite different context, in the theory of quantum electrodynamics and its extensions leading up to the recent development of quantum chromodynamics. The decisive step in the rehabilitation of gauge fields was taken by our Princeton colleague Frank Yang and his student Bob Mills in 1954, one year before Hermann Weyl's death [Yang and Mills, 1954]. There is no evidence that Weyl ever knew or cared what Yang and Mills had done with his brain-child.

So the story of gauge fields is full of ironies. A fashionable idea, invented for a purpose which turns out to be ephemeral, survives a long period of obscurity and emerges finally as a corner-stone of physics.

#### 4.5.4 Weyl's two-component Neutrino theory

It is remarkable that Weyl's (1929b) two-component spinor formalism
led him to anticipate the existence of particles that violate
conservation of parity, that is, left-right symmetry. In 1929
left-right symmetry was taken for granted and considered a basic fact
of all the laws of Nature. Weyl formulated the four-component Dirac
spinor ψ in terms of a two-component left-handed Weyl spinor
ψ_{L} and a two-component right-handed Weyl spinor
ψ_{R}:

ψ = (ψ ^{1}, ψ^{2}, ψ^{3}, ψ^{4})^{T}= (ψ1 L, ψ2L, ψ1R, ψ2R)^{T}= (ψ _{L}, ψ_{R})^{T}

The four-component Dirac spinor, formulated in terms of the two Weyl spinors

ψ = ψ _{L}

ψ_{R}

preserves parity; it applies to all massive spin 1/2 particles
(fermions) and all massive fermions are known to obey parity
conservation. However, a single Weyl spinor, either
ψ_{L} or ψ_{R}, does not
preserve parity. Weyl noted that instead of the four-component Dirac
spinor “two components suffice if the requirement of left-right
symmetry (parity) is dropped”. A little later he added,
“the restriction 2 removes the equivalence of left and right.
It is only the fact that left-right symmetry actually appears in
Nature that forces us to introduce a second pair of
ψ-components”. Weyl's two-spinor version of the Dirac
equation is a *coupled *system of equations requiring both
Weyl spinors ψ_{L} and ψ_{R} in
order to preserve parity. Weyl considerd massless particles by
setting *m* = in his two-spinor version of the Dirac equation.
In this case, the equations of the two-spinor version of Dirac's
equation *decouple*, yielding an equation for
ψ_{L} and for ψ_{R}. These
equations are independent of each other, and the equation for the
2-component left-handed Weyl spinor ψ_{L} is
called *Weyl's equation*; it is applicable to the massless
particle called the
*neutrino*^{[104]},
a spin 1/2 particle, that was discovered in 1956. Yang (1986, 12)
remarks

Now I come to another piece of work of Weyl's which dates back to 1929, and is called Weyl's two-component neutrino theory. He invented this theory in 1929 in one of his very important articles … as a mathematical possibility satisfying most of the requirements of physics. But it was rejected by him and by subsequent physicists because it did not satisfy left-right symmetry. With the realisation that left-right symmetry was not exactly right in 1957 it became clear that this theory of Weyl's should immediately be re-looked at. So it was and later it was verified theoretically and experimentally that this theory gave, in fact, the correct description of the neutrino.

#### 4.5.5 The Theory of Groups and Quantum Mechanics

During the interval from 1924–26, in which Weyl was intensely occupied with the pure mathematics of Lie groups, the essentials of the formal apparatus of the new revolutionary theory of quantum mechanics had been completed by Heisenberg, Schrödinger and others. As if to make up for lost time, Weyl immediately returned from pure mathematics to theoretical physics, and applied his new group theoretical results to quantum mechanics. As Yang (1986, 9, 10) describes it,

In the midst of Weyl's profound research on Lie groups there occurred a great revolution in physics, namely the development of quantum mechanics. We shall perhaps never know Weyl's initial reaction to this development, but he soon got into the act and studied the mathematical structure of the new mechanics. There resulted a paper of 1927 and later a book, this book together with Wigner's articles and

Gruppen Theorie und Ihre Anwendung auf die QuantenMechanik der Atomewere instrumental in introducing group theory into the very language of quantum mechanics.

Mehra and Rechenberg (2000, 482) note in this context: “Actually, we have mentioned in previous volumes Weyl's early reactions to both matrix mechanics (in 1925) and wave mechanics (in early 1926), and they were very enthusiastic. Therefore, we have to assume quite firmly that it was only his deep involvement with the last stages of his work on the theory of semisimple continuous groups that prevented Weyl ‘to get in the act’ immediately.”

Weyl was particularly well positioned to handle some of the mathematical and foundational problems of the new theory of quantum mechanics. Almost every aspect of his mathematical expertise, in particular, his recent work on group theory and his very early work on the theory of singular differential-integral equations (1908–1911), provided him with the precise tools for solving many of the concrete problems posed by the new theory: the theory of Hilbert space, singular differential equations, eigenfunction expansions, the symmetric group, and unitary representations of Lie groups.

Weyl's (1927) paper, referred to by Yang above, is entitled
*Quantenmechanik und Gruppentheorie* (*Quantum Mechanics
and Group Theory*). In it, Weyl provides an analysis of the
foundations of quantum mechanics and he emphasizes the fundamental
role Lie groups play in that
theory.^{[105]}
Weyl begins the paper by raising two questions: (1) how do I arrive
at the self-adjoint operators, which represent a given quantity of a
physical system whose constitution is known, and (2), what is the
physical interpretation of these operators and which physical
consequences can be derived from them? Weyl suggests that while the
second question has been answered by von Neumann, the first question
has not yet received a satisfactory answer, and Weyl proposes to
provide one with the help of group theory.

In a way, Weyl's 1927 paper was programmatic in character; nearly all
the topics of that paper were taken up again a year later in his
famous book (Weyl (1928)) entitled *Gruppentheorie und
Quantenmechanik* (*The Theory of Groups and Quantum
Mechanics*). The book emerged from the lecture notes taken by a
student named F. Bohnenblust of Weyl's lectures given in Zürich
during the winter semester 1927–28. A revised edition of that
book appeared in 1931. In the preface to the first edition Weyl says:

Another time I venture on stage with a book that belongs only half to my professional field of mathematics, the other half to physics. The external reason is not very different from that which led some time ago to the origin of the book

Raum Zeit Materie. In the winter term 1927/28 Zürich was suddenly deprived of all theoretical physics by the simultaneous departures of Debye and Schrödinger. I tried to fill the gap by changing an already announced lecture course on group theory into one on group theory and quantum mechanics.

…

Since I have for some years been deeply occupied with the theory of the representation of continuous groups, it appeared to me at this point to be a fitting and useful project, to provide an organically coherent account of the knowledge in this field won by mathematicians, on such a scale and in such a form, that is suitable for the requirements of quantum physics.

Weyl's book is one of the first textbooks on the new theory of quantum mechanics. As Weyl indicates in the preface it was necessary for him to include a short account of the foundation of quantum theory in order to be able to show how the theory of groups finds its application in that theory. If the book fulfils its purpose, Weyl suggests, then the reader should be able to learn from it the essentials of both the theory of groups and quantum theory. Weyl's aim was to explain the mathematics to the physicists and the physics to the mathematicians. However, as Yang (1986, 10) points out, referring to Weyl's book:

Weyl was a mathematician and a philosopher. He liked to deal with concepts and the connection between them. His book was very famous, and was recognized as profound. Almost every theoretical physicist born before 1935 has a copy of it on his bookshelves. But very few read it: Most are not accustomed to Weyl's concentration on the structural aspects of physics and feel uncomfortable with his emphasis on concepts. The book was just too abstract for most physicists.

Weyl's book (Weyl (1931b, 2 edn)) is remarkably complete for such an
early work and covers many topics. Chapters I and III are mainly
concerned with preliminary mathematical concepts. The first chapter
provides an account of the theory of finite dimensional Hilbert
spaces and the third chapter is an exposition of the unitary
representation theory of finite groups and compact Lie groups.
Chapter II is entitled *Quantum Theory*; it is the earliest
systematic and comprehensive account of the new quantum theory.
Chapter IV, entitled *Application of the* *Theory of Groups
to Quantum Mechanics*, is divided into four parts. In part A,
entitled *The Rotation Group*, Weyl provides a systematic
explanatory account of the theory of atomic spectra in terms of the
unitary representation theory of the rotation group, followed by a
discussion of the selection and intensity rules. Part B is entitled
*The Lorentz Group*. After discussing the spin of the electron
and its role in accounting for the anomalous Zeeman effect, Weyl
presents Dirac's theory of the relativistic quantum mechanics of the
electron and develops in detail the theory of an electron in a
spherically symmetric field, including an analysis of the fine
structure of the spectrum. In part C, entitled *The Permutation
Group*, Weyl applies the Pauli exclusion principle to explicate
the periodic table of the elements. Next, Weyl develops the second
quantization of the Maxwell and Dirac fields required for the
analysis of many body relativistic systems. Weyl noted in the preface
to the second edition that his treatment is in accordance with the
recent work of Heisenberg and Pauli. It is now customary to include
such a topic under the heading of relativistic quantum field theory.
The final part of Chapter IV, part D, is entitled *Quantum*
*Kinematics*; it provides an exposition of part II of Weyl's
(1927) paper, mentioned earlier. Chapter V, entitled *The
Symmetric Permutation Group and the Algebra of Symmetric
Transformations*, is for the most part pure mathematics. It is
widely regraded to be the most difficult part of the Weyl's book.

Overall, Weyl's treatment is quite modern except for the confusion
regarding the positive electron (anti-electron) that at that time was
identified with the proton rather than with the positron, which was
discovered a few years later. Weyl was quite concerned about the
identification of the proton with the positive electron because his
analysis of the discrete symmetries **C**, **P**, **T** and
**CPT** led him to conclude that the mass of the positive electron
should equal the mass of the
electron.^{[106]}

#### 4.5.6 Weyl's Early Discussion of the Discrete Symmetries **C**, **P**, **T** and **CPT**

Weyl (1931b, 2 edn) analyzed Dirac's relativistic theory of the electron (Dirac (1928a,b)). Although this theory correctly accounted for the spin of the electron, there was however a problem because in addition to the positive-energy levels, Dirac's theory predicted the existence of an equal number of negative-energy levels. Dirac (1930) reinterpreted the theory by assuming that all of the negative-energy levels were normally occupied. The Pauli Exclusion Principle, which asserts that it is impossible for two electrons to occupy the same quantum state, would prevent an electron with positive energy from falling into a negative- energy state. Dirac's theory also predicted that one of the negative-energy electrons could be raised to a state of positive energy, thereby creating a ‘hole’ or unoccupied negative-energy state. Such a hole would behave like a particle with a positive energy and a positive charge, that is, like a positive electron.

Because the only fundamental particles that were known to exist at
that time were the electron and the proton, one was justifiably
reluctant to postulate the existence of new particles that had not
yet been observed experimentally; consequently, it was suggested that
the positive electron should be identified with the proton. However,
Weyl was quite concerned about the identification of the proton with
the anti-electron. In the preface to the second German edition of his
book *Gruppentheorie und Quantenmechanik*, Weyl (1928, 2 edn,
1931, VII) wrote

The problem of the proton and the electron is discussed in connection with the symmetry properties of the quantum laws with respect to the interchange of right and left, past and future, and positive and negative electricity. At present no acceptable solution is in sight; I fear, that in the context of this problem, the clouds are rolling together to form a new, serious crisis in quantum physics.

Weyl had good reasons for his concern. He analyzed the invariance of
the Maxwell-Dirac equations under the discrete symmetries that
correspond to the transformations now called **C**, **P**,
**T** and **CPT** both for the case of relativistic quantum
mechanics and for the case of relativistic quantum field theory, and
concluded in both cases that the mass of the anti-electron should be
the same as the mass of the electron. That the mass of the proton was
so different from the mass of the electron, therefore, appeared to
Weyl to constitute a new serious crisis in physics.

In a lecture presented at the Centenary for Hermann Weyl held at the
ETH in Zürich, Yang (1986, 10) says of the above quote from
Weyl's preface to the second edition of *Gruppentheorie und
Quantenmechanik*:

This was a most remarkable passage in retrospect. The symmetry that he mentioned here, of physical laws with respect to the interchange of right and left, had been introduced by Weyl and Wigner independently into quantum physics. It was called parity conservation, denoted by the symbol

P. The symmetry between the past and future was something that was not well understood in 1930. It was understood later by Wigner, was called time reversal invariance, and was denoted by the symbolT. The symmetry with respect to positive and negative electricity was later called charge conjugation invarianceC. It is a symmetry of physical laws when you change positive and negative signs of electricity. Nobody, to my knowledge, absolutely nobody in the year 1930, was in any way suspecting that these symmetries were related in any manner. I will come back to this matter later. What had prompted Weyl in 1930 to write the above passage is a great mystery to me.

It would seem that Yang's comment is misleading since it suggests
that Weyl did not have a good reason for his remark. In fact,
however, Weyl's statement was firmly based on a detailed analysis of
the discrete symmetries **C**, **P**, **T** and **CPT**.
Coleman and Korté (2001) have shown in detail that Weyl's
treatment of these symmetries is the *same *as that used today
except for the fact that the symmetry **T** is treated by Weyl as
linear and unitary, rather than as antilinear and antiunitary. Weyl
had presented in 1931 a complete analysis, in the context of the
quantized Maxwell-Dirac field equations, of the discrete symmetries
that are now called **C**, **P**, **T** and **CPT**. His
transformations **C** and **P** are the same as those used
today. His transformations **T** and **CPT** are also very
close to those used today except that Weyl's transformations were
linear and unitary rather than antilinear and and antiunitary.
Moreover, Weyl drew two very important conclusions from his analysis
of these discrete symmetries. First, Weyl announced that the
important question of the arrow of time had been solved because the
field equations were not invariant under his time-reversal
transformation **T**. Second, Weyl pointed out that the invariance
of the field equations under his charge-conjugation transformation
**C** implied that the mass of the ‘anti-electron’ is
necessarily the same as that of the electron; moreover, Weyl's result
is the primary reason that Dirac (1931, 61) abandoned the assignment
of the proton to the role of the anti-electron. Many years later
Dirac (1977, 145) recalled:

Well, what was I to do with these holes? The best I could think of was that maybe the mass was not the same as the mass of the electron. After all, my primitive theory did ignore the Coulomb forces between the electrons. I did not know how to bring those into the picture, and it could be that in some obscure way these Coulomb forces would give rise to a difference in the masses.

Of course, it is very hard to understand how this difference could be so big. We wanted the mass of the proton to be nearly 2000 times the mass of the electron, an enormous difference, and it was very hard to understand how it could be connected with just a sort of perturbation effect coming from Coulomb forces between the electrons.

However, I did not want to abandon my theory altogether, and so I put it forward as a theory of electrons and protons. Of course I was very soon attacked on this question of the holes having different masses from the original electrons. I think the most definite attack came from Weyl, who pointed out that mathematically the holes would have to have the same mass as the electrons, and that came to be the accepted view.

At another place Dirac (1971, 52–55) remarks:

But still, I thought there might be something in the basic idea and so I published it as a theory of electrons and protons, and left it quite unexplained how the protons could have such a different mass from the electrons.

This idea was seized upon by Herman [sic] Weyl. He said boldly that the holes had to have the same mass as the electrons. Now Weyl was a mathematician. He was not a physicist at all. He was just concerned with the mathematical consequences of an idea, working out what can be deduced from the various symmetries. And this mathematical approach led directly to the conclusion that the holes would have to have the same mass as the electrons. Weyl just published a blunt statement that the holes must have the same mass as the electrons and did not make any comments on the physical implications of this assertion. Perhaps he did not really care what the physical implications were. He was just concerned with achieving consistent mathematics.

Dirac's characterization of Weyl's unconcern for physics seems unfair in light of Weyl's own statement in the preface of the second edition of his book, cited earlier, where he expresses the fear “that in the context of this problem, the clouds are rolling together to form a new, serious crisis in quantum physics”; Weyl did care about the physics.

Weyl's analysis did have a significant impact on the development of
the Maxwell-Dirac theory; however, as Coleman and Korté (2001)
have argued, Weyl's early analysis of the transformations **C**,
**P**, **T** and **CPT** was, for the most part, lost to
subsequent researchers and had to be essentially re-invented.
However, it should be noted in this context that Schwinger (1988,
107–129) was greatly influenced by Weyl's book. Schwinger makes
particular reference to Weyl's work on the discrete symmetries and
says that this work “… was the starting point of my own
considerations concerning the connection between spin and statistics,
which culminated in what is now referred to as the TCP— or some
permutation thereof—theorem”.

#### 4.5.7 Weyl's Philosophical Views about Quantum Mechanics

Weyl analyzed the foundations of both the general theory of relativity and the theory of quantum mechanics. For both theories, he provided a coherent exposition of the mathematical structure of the theory, elegant characterizations of the entities and laws postulated by the theory and a lucid account of how these postulates explain the most significant, more directly observable, lower-level phenomena. In both cases, he was also concerned with the constructive aspects of the theory, that is, with the extent to which the higher-level postulates of the theory are necessary.

There is no doubt that with regard to the general theory of
relativity, Weyl held strong philosophical views. Some of these views
are couched in a phenomenological language and reveal Husserl's
influence on Weyl. Ryckman's (2005) study *The Reign of Relativity
*provides an extensive account of Weyl's orientation to Husserl's
phenomenology. On the other hand, many of Weyl's philosophical views
are couched in an unequivocal empiricist-realist language. For
example, Weyl rejected Poincaré's geometrical conventionalism
and forcefully argued that the spacetime metric field is physically
real, that it is a physically real structural field (Strukturfeld),
which is determined by the physically real causal (conformal)
structure and the physically real inertial (projective) structure or
guiding field (Führungsfeld) of spacetime. He was not deterred
in putting forward such ontological claims about the metric structure
of spacetime despite the fact that a complete epistemologically
satisfactory solution to the measurement problem for the spacetime
metric field was not then available. In the same manner, Weyl
forcefully advanced a field-body-relationalist ontology of spacetime
structure. He argued that a Leibnizian or Einstein-Machian form of
relationalism that is based on a pure body ontology, is not tenable,
indeed is incoherent within the context of general relativity, and he
presented a *reductio *argument, the plasticine example, to
underscore the necessity of the existence of a physically real
guiding field in addition to the existence of bodies.

However, in contrast to Weyl's many philosophical views with regard to spacetime theories, Weyl's philosophical positions regarding the status of quantum mechanics, while not absent, are not as transparent. There are passages, such as the following ((Weyl, 1931b, 2 edn, 44), which argue for the reality of photons.

The intensity of the monochromatic radiation that is used to generate the photoelectric effect has no influence on the speed with which the electrons are ejected from the metal but affects only the frequency of this process. Even with intensities so weak that on the classical theory hours would be required before the electromagnetic energy passing through a given atom would attain to an amount equal to that of a photon, the effect begins immediately, the points at which it occurs being distributed irregularly over the entire metal plate. This fact is a proof of the existence of light quanta that is no less meaningful than the flashes of light on the scintillation screen are for the corpuscular-discontinuous nature of α-rays.

On the other hand, Weyl's (1931b) discussion of the problem of ‘directional quantization’ in the old quantum theory and of the way that this problem is ‘resolved’ in the new quantum theory appears to have a distinctly instrumentalist flavour. In a number of places, he describes the essence of the dilemma posed by quantum mechanics with a dispassionate precision. Consider, for example, the following (Weyl, 1931b, 2 edn, 67):

Natural science has a constructive character. The phenomena with which it deals are not independent manifestations or qualities which can be read off from nature, but can only be determined by means of an indirect method, through interaction with other bodies. Their implicit definition is bound up with definite natural laws which underlie the interactions. Consider, for example, the introduction of the Galilean concept of mass which essentially comes down to the following indirect definition: “Each body possesses a momentum, that is, a vector

mv which has the same direction as its velocityv—the scalar factormis called its mass. The law of momentum holds, according to which the sum of the momenta before a reaction between several bodies is the same as the sum of their momenta after the reaction.” By applying this law to the observed collision phenomena, one obtains data for the determination of the relative masses. The scientific consensus was, however, that suchconstructive phenomena cannevertheless be attributed to the things themselveseven if the manipulations, which alone can lead to their recognition, are not being carried out.In Quantum Theory we encounter a fundamentallimitation to this epistemological position of the constructive natural science.

It is difficult for many people to accept quantum mechanics as an
ultimate theory without at the same time giving up some form of
realism and adopting something like an instrumentalist view of the
theory. It is clear that Weyl was fully aware of this state of
affairs, and yet in all of his published work, he refrained from
making any bold statements of his views on the fundamental questions
about quantum reality. He did not vigorously participate in the
debate between Einstein and Schrödinger and the Copenhagen
School nor did he offer decisive views concerning, for example, the
*Einstein, Podolsky, Rosen* thought experiment or
*Schr**ö**dinger's Cat*. Since Weyl held
strong philosophical views within the context of the general theory
of relativity, it is therefore only natural that one might have
expected him to take a stand with respect to Schrödinger's cat
and whether or not one should be fully satisfied with a theory
according to which the cat is neither alive or dead but is in a
superposition of these two states.

The reason for Weyl's seeming reticence concerning the
ontological/epistemological questions about quantum reality was
already hinted at in note 5 of §2, where it was suggested that
Weyl was not especially bothered by the counterintuitive nature of
quantum mechanics because he held the view that “objective
reality cannot be grasped directly, but only through the use of
symbols”. Although Weyl (1948, 1949a, 1953) did express his
philosophical views about quantum theory, he did so cautiously. Weyl
(1949a, 263) summarizes some of the features of quantum mechanics
that he considered of “paramount philosophical
significance”: the measurement problem, the incompatibility of
quantum physics with classical logic, quantum causality, the
non-local nature of quantum mechanics, the *Leibniz-Pauli
Exclusion*
*Principle*^{[107]},
and the irreducible probabilistic nature of quantum mechanics. At the
end of the summary Weyl remarks:

It must be admitted that the meaning of quantum physics, in spite of all its achievements, is not yet clarified as thoroughly as, for instance, the ideas underlying relativity theory. The relation of reality and observation is the central problem. We seem to need a deeper epistemological analysis of what constitutes an experiment, a measurement, and what sort of language is used to communicate its result.

#### 4.5.8 Science as Symbolic Construction

According to Weyl (1948, 295), both the theory of general relativity and quantum mechanics force upon us the realization that “instead of a real spatio-temporal material being what remains for us is only a construction in pure symbols”. If it is necessary, Weyl (1948, 302) says, that our scientific grasp of an objective world must not depend on sense qualities, because of their inherent subjective nature, then it is for the same reason necessary to eliminate space and time. And Descartes gave us the means to do this with his discovery of analytic geometry.

As Weyl (1953, 529) observes, when Newton explained the experienced world through the movements of solid particles in space, he rejected sense qualities for the construction of the objective world, but he held on to, and used an intuitively given objective space for the construction of a real world that lies behind the appearances. It was Leibniz who recognized the phenomenal character (Phenomenalität) of space and time as consisting in the mere ordering of phenomena; however, space and time themselves do not have an independent reality.

It is the freely created pure numbers, that is, pure symbols,
according to Weyl, which serve as coordinates, and which provide the
material with which to symbolically construct the objective world. In
symbolically constructing the objective world we are forced to
replace space and time through a pure arithmetical construct. Instead
of spacetime points, *n*-tuples of pure numbers corresponding to
a given coordinate system are used. Weyl (1948, 303) says:

… the laws of physics are viewed as arithmetic laws between numerical values of variable magnitudes, in which spatial points and moments of time are represented through their numerical coordinates. Magnitudes such as the temperature of a body or the field strength of an electric field, which have at each spacetime point a definite value, appear as functions of four variables, the spacetime coordinates

x,y,z,t.

In systematic theorizing we construct a *formal scaffold* that
consists of mere symbols, according to Weyl (1948, 311), without
explaining initially what the symbols for mass, charge, field
strength, etc., mean; and only toward the end do we describe how the
symbolic structure connects directly with experience.

It is certain, that on the symbolic side, not space and time but four independent variables

x,y,z,tappear; one speaks of space, as one does of sounds and colours, only on the side conscious experience. A monochromatic light signal … has now become a mathematical formula in which a certain symbolF, called electromagnetic field strength, is expressed as a pure arithmetically constructed function of four other symbolsx,y,z,t, called spacetime coordinates.

At another place Weyl (1949a, 113) says:

Intuitive space and intuitive time are thus hardly the adequate medium in which physics is to construct the external world. No less than the sense qualities must the intuitions of space and time be relinquished as its building material; they must be replaced by a four-dimensional continuum in the abstract arithmetical sense.

Weyl's point is that while space and time exist within the realm of
conscious experience, or, according to Kant, as *a* *priori
*forms underlying all of our conscious experiences, they are
unsuited as elements with which to construct the objective world and
must be replaced by means of a purely arithmetical symbolic
representation. All that we are left with, according to Weyl, is
symbolic construction. If this still needed any confirmation, Weyl
(1948, 313) says, it was provided by the theory of relativity and
quantum
theory.^{[108]}
For ease of reference we repeat a citation of Weyl (1988, 4–5)
in §4.3.1:

Coordinates are introduced on the Mf [manifold] in the most direct way through the mapping onto the number space, in such a way, that all coordinates, which arise through one-to-one continuous transformations, are equally possible.

With this the coordinate concept breaks loose from all specialconstructions to which it was bound earlier in geometry. In the language of relativity this means:The coordinates are notmeasured, their values are not read off from real measuring rods whichreact in a definite way to physical fields and the metrical structure, rather they are a prioriplaced in the world arbitrarily, in order to characterize those physical fields including the metricstructure numerically.The metric structure becomes through this, so to speak, freed from space; it becomes an existing field within the remaining structure-less space. Through this, space as form of appearance contrasts more clearly with its real content: The content is measured after the form is arbitrarily related to coordinates.^{[109]}

The last two sentences in the above quote suggest that, (a) Weyl
embraces something close to Kant's position, according to which space
and time are “*a priori *forms of appearances”, or
that (b) Weyl adheres to a position called *spacetime
substantivalism*, according to which, in addition to body and
fields and their relations, there also exists a
‘container’, the spacetime manifold, and this manifold,
its points and the manifold differential-topological relations are
physically real. However, this interpretation would contradict Weyl's
basic thesis that in the symbolic construction of the objective word
we are left with nothing but symbolic arithmetic functional
relations. Weyl's phrases, do not denote either a physically real
container or something like Kant's *a priori *form of
intuition. They merely denote a *conceptual *or *formal
scaffolding*, a *logical space*, as it were, whose points
are represented by purely *formal *coordinates (*n*-tuple
of pure numbers). It is such a formal space which is employed by the
theorist in the initial stages of constructing an objective world. To
emphasize, in modelling the objective world the theorist begins by
constructing a *formal scaffold *which consists of mere
symbols and formal coordinates, without explaining initially what the
symbols for mass, charge, field strength, etc., mean; only toward the
end does the theorist describe how the symbolic structure connects
directly with experience ((Weyl, 1948, 311)).

The four-dimensional space-time continuum must be replaced by a
four-dimensional coordinate space ℝ^{4}. However, the
sheer arbitrariness with which we assign coordinates does not affect
the objective relations and features of the world itself. To the
contrary, it is only *relative *to a symbolic construction or
modelling by means of an assignment of coordinates that the state of
the world, its relations and properties, can be *objectively*
determined by means of distinct, reproducible symbols. While our
immediate experiences are *subjective *and *absolute*,
our symbolic construction of the *objective *world is of
necessity *relative*. Weyl (1949a, 116) says:

Whoever desires the absolute must take the subjectivity and egocentricity into the bargain; whoever feels drawn toward the objective faces the problem of relativity.

Weyl (1949a, 75) notes, “The objectification, by elimination of
the ego and its immediate life of intuition, does not fully succeed,
and the coordinate system remains as the necessary residue of the
ego-extinction.” However, this residue of ego involvement is
subsequently rendered harmless through the principle of
*invariance*. The transition from one admissible coordinate
system to another can be mathematically described, and the natural
laws and *measurable* *quantities *must be
*invariant *under such transformations. This, Weyl (1948, 336)
says, constitutes the *general* *principle of
relativity*. Weyl (1949a, 104) says:

… Only such relations will have objective meaning as are independent of the mapping chosen and therefore remain invariant under deformations of the map. Such a relation is, for instance, the intersection of two world lines. If we wish to characterize a special mapping or a special class of mappings, we must do so in terms of the real physical events and of the structure revealed in them. That is the content of the

postulate of general relativity. According to thespecial theory ofrelativity, it is possible in particular to construct a map of the world such that (1) the world line of each mass point which is subject to no external forces appears as a straight line, and (2) the light cone issuing from an arbitrary world point is represented by a circular cone with vertical axis and a vertex angle of 90^{∘}. In this theory the inertial and causal structure and hence also the metrical structure of the world have the character of rigidity, they are absolutely fixed once and for all. It is impossible objectively, without resorting to individual exhibition, to make a narrower selection from among the ‘normal mappings’ satisfying the above conditions (1) and (2).

Weyl (1949a, 115) provides an illustration, which shows how a
measurement by observer *B* of the angular distance δ
between two stars Σ and Σ^{∗} can be
constructed in the four-dimensional number space, and can be
expressed as an
*invariant*.^{[110]}

Figure 15: Measurement of the angular distance δ by an observer
*B* between two stars

In figure 15 the stars and observer are represented by their world
lines, and the past light cone *K* issuing from the observation
event *O* intersects the world lines of the stars Σ and
Σ^{∗} in *E* and
*E*^{∗} respectively. The light rays emitted at
*E* and *E*^{∗}, which arrive at the
observation event *O*, are null geodesics laying on the past
light cone and are respectively denoted by Λ and
Λ^{∗}. This construction of the numerical
quantity of the angle δ observed by *B* at *O*, which
is describable in the form of purely arithmetical relations, is
invariant under arbitrary coordinate transformations and constitutes
an objective fact of the
world.^{[111]}

On the other hand, the angles between two stars determine the
*objectively *indescribable *subjective* experience of
the observer. Moreover, Weyl says, “there is no difference in
our experiences to which there does not correspond a difference in
the underlying objective situation.” And that difference is
itself invariant under arbitrary coordinate transformations. In other
words, an observer's subjective experiences *supervene *on the
invariant relationships and structures of a symbolically constructed
objective world.

Perhaps no statement captures the contrast between the objective-symbolic and the subjective-intuitive more vividly then Weyl's famous statement

The objective world simply

is, it does nothappen. Only to the gaze of my consciousness, crawling upward along the life line of my body, does a section of this world come to life as a fleeting image in space which continuously changes in time.^{[112]}

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We would like to thank Thomas Ryckman for his invaluable comments and suggestions for this entry.