Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Value Theory

Three complications about attributive good

One complication with the reasoning in the main text is that it is not, in general, true, that if Sue is a thing of kind K, then “Sue is good” means that Sue is a good K. For example, if Sue is a human being, but if we are watching her impressive performance at her dance recital, then “Sue is good” is naturally understood as meaning that Sue is a good dancer, rather than that she is a good human being. Moreover, it may be true even if she is not a good human being.

Another important complication that it is important to bear in mind is that the way in which “good” is attributive is different and distinct from the way in which ordinary gradable adjectives like “large” are attributive. Simon may be a large ant but not a large animal, because the comparison class of ants is generally of quite a different size than the comparison class of animals. “Good” shares this feature with all gradable adjectives. But “good” is also attributive in a further dimension in which “large” apparently is not. For example, a particularly well-manufactured plastic spoon may be a good spoon for a piece of plastic, without being a particularly good spoon, nor being a good knife for a piece of plastic. In this claim, “piece of plastic” contributes a comparison class, while “spoon” contributes the attributive argument of “good”, and the truth of the claim can vary in both dimensions.

Another way to see this same point is to observe that when we switch from gradable adjectives to their comparative forms, comparison classes drop out. Simon's being larger than Sal is not relative to any further argument or comparison class, given by “ant” or “animal”. Being a larger animal and being a larger ant are the same thing. But whether Sue is better than Huw depends on whether we are comparing them as dancers or as musicians. Even if both are dancers and both are musicians, Sue may be the better dancer, while Huw is the better musician. So attributive uses of “good” are relative to both an attributive argument and to a comparison class.

Finally, it is important to note that just as something can be a good K and an L without being a good L, it may be that something can be a good K without even being a K. An ice cream lid, for example, might be a good Frisbee, without being a Frisbee. If this is right, it should be no surprise; something can be a fake Rembrandt without being a Rembrandt. But it is a further possible complication worth bearing in mind.

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