Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Trinity

History of Trinitarian Doctrines

1. Introduction

This supplementary document discusses the history of trinitarian dotrines. Although early Christian theologians speculated in many ways on the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit, no one clearly and fully asserted the doctrine of the Trinity as explained at the top of the main entry until around the end of the so-called Arian Controversy. (See 3.2 below and section 3.1 of the supplementary document on unitarianism.) Nonetheless, its proponents always claim it to be in some sense founded on, or at least illustrated by, biblical texts.

Sometimes popular antitrinitarian literature paints the doctrine as strongly influenced by, or even illicitly poached from some non-Christian religious or philosophical tradition. Divine threesomes abound in the religious writings and art of ancient Europe, Egypt, and the near east, not to mention Hinduism and Mahayana Buddhism. These include various threesomes of male deities, of female deities, of Father-Mother-Son groups, or of one body with three heads, or three faces on one head (Griffiths 1996). However, similarity alone doesn't prove Christian copying or indirect influence, and many of these examples are because of their time and place less likely to have influenced the development of the Christian doctrine of the Trinity.

There is, however, arguably a direct influence on early Christian theology by Platonist Jewish philosopher and theologian Philo of Alexandria (a.k.a. Philo Judaeus) (ca. 20 BCE - ca. 50 CE). Inspired by the Timaeus of Plato, Philo read various Jewish scriptures as teaching that God created the cosmos by his Word (logos) or creative power, and that he subsequently governs the cosmos through the seemingly personal agency of the Word together with that of God's royal power (Philo Works; Morgan 1853, 63-148; Norton 1859, 332-74; Wolfson 1973, 60-97).

Another striking parallel, which has been cited by friends and foes of Trinity doctrines, is found in Plotinus' (204–70 CE) triad of the One, Intellect, and Soul, in which the latter two mysteriously emanate from the One, and “are the One and not the One; they are the one because they are from it; they are not the One, because it endowed them with what they have while remaining by itself” (Plotinus Enneads, 85).

Many thinkers influential in the development of trinitarian doctrines were steeped in the thought not only of Middle Platonism and Neoplatonism, but also the Stoics, Aristotle, and other currents in Greek philosophy (Hanson 1988, 856–869). Whether one sees this background as a providentially supplied and useful tool, or as an unavoidably distorting influence, those developing the doctrine saw themselves as trying to build a systematic Christian theology on the Bible while remaining faithful to earlier post-biblical tradition. Many also had the aim of showing Christianity to be consistent with the best of Greek philosophy. But even if the doctrine had a non-Christian origin, it would would not follow that it is false or unjustified; it could be, that through Philo (or whomever), God revealed the doctrine to the Christian church. Still, it is contested issue whether or not the doctrine can be deduced or otherwise inferred from the Christian Bible, so we must turn to it.

2. The Christian Bible

2.1 The Old Testament

No trinitarian doctrine is explicitly taught in the Old Testament. Trinitarians normally grant this, holding that the doctrine was revealed by God only later, in New Testament times (c.50–c.100) and/or in the Patristic era (c. 100–800). They usually also add, though, that with hindsight, we can see that a number of texts either portray or forshadow the co-working of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit.

For example, in Genesis 18, Yahweh appears to Abraham as three men, and the text has often been read as though the men spoke as one, with one voice. What is this, they urge, if not an appearance of, or even a triple temporary incarnation of the three persons within God's nature? (Other interpretations identify Yahweh with one of the men, the one who stays behind while the others travel to Sodom in Genesis 19.)

In numerous other passages, many Christian readers hold, the preincarnate Son of God is mentioned, or even appears in bodily form to do the bidding of his Father, and is (so they believe) sometimes called the “angel of the Lord”. Some have even identified the preincarnate Christ as Michael, protecting angel over Israel mentioned in the books of Daniel, Jude, and Revelation.

And in several passages, Yahweh refers to himself, or is referred to using plural terms. Non-trinitarians usually read this as a plural of majesty, a form of speech which occurs in many languages, or a conversation between God and angels, while trinitarians often read this as a conversation between the persons of the Trinity.

In sum, Christians read the Old Testament through the lens of the New. For example, the former speaks of God as working by his “word”, “wisdom”, or “spirit”. Some New Testament passages call Jesus Christ the word and wisdom of God, and in the Gospel of John, Jesus talks about the sending of another comforter or helper, the “Holy Spirit”. Thus, some Christians claim the door was open to positing two divine intelligent agents in addition to “the Father”, by, through, or in whom the Father acts, one of whom was incarnated in the man Jesus. In opposition, other Christian readers have taken these passages to involve anthropomorphization of divine attributes, urging that Greek speculations unfortunately encouraged the aforementioned hypostasizations.

2.2 The New Testament

The New Testament contains no explicit trinitarian doctrine. However, many Christian theologians, apologists, and philosophers hold that the doctrine can be inferred from what the New Testament does teach about God. But how may it be inferred? Is the inference deductive, or is it an inference to the best explanation? And is it based on what is implicitly taught there, or on what is merely assumed there? Many Christian theologians and apologists seem to hold it is a deductive inference.

In contrast, other Christians admit that their preferred doctrine of the Trinity not only (1) can't be inferred from the Bible alone, but also (2) that there's inadequate or no evidence for it there, and even (3) that what is taught in the Bible is incompatible with the doctrine. These Christians believe the doctrine solely on the authority of later doctrinal pronouncements of the True Christian Church (typically one of: the Catholic Church, the Eastern Orthodox tradition, or the mainstream of the Christian tradition, broadly understood). Some Catholic apologists have argued that this doctrine shows the necessity of the teaching authority of the Church, this doctrine being constitutive of Christianity but underivable from the Bible apart from the Church's guidance in interpreting it. This stance is not popular among Christians who are neither Catholic nor Eastern Orthodox. (2) would be the main sticking point, although some groups deny all three.

Many Christian apologists argue that the doctrine of the Trinity is “biblical” (i.e. either it is implicitly taught there, or it is the best explanation of what is taught there) using three sorts of arguments. They begin by claiming that the Father of Jesus Christ is the one true God taught in the Old Testament. They then argue that given what the Bible teaches about Christ and the Holy Spirit, they must be “fully divine” as well. Thus, we must, as it were, “move them within” the nature of the one God. Therefore, there are three fully divine persons “in God”. While this may be paradoxical, it is argued that this is what God has revealed to humankind through the Bible.

The types of arguments employed to show the “full divinity” of Christ and the Holy Spirit work as follows.

  1. S did action A.
  2. For any x, if x does action A, x is fully divine.
  3. Therefore, S is fully divine.

E.g., A = non-culpably pronouncing the forgiveness of sins, non-culpably receiving worship, raising the dead, truly saying “Before Abraham was, I am”, creating the cosmos.

  1. The Bible applies title or description “F” to S.
  2. For any x, if the Bible applies title “F” to x, then x is fully divine.
  3. Therefore, S is fully divine.

E.g., F = the first and the last, a god, the God, our savior

  1. S has quality Q.
  2. For any x, if x has quality Q, then x is fully divine.
  3. S is fully divine.

E.g., Q = sinlessness, omniscience, the power to perform miracles, something Christians should be baptized in the name of

While such arguments are deductively valid, they suffer from a crucial ambiguity: What is meant by “fully divine”? Until this is made clear, it isn't clear which of the trinitarian theories is being argued for. A person being “fully divine” might, according to various theorists, amount to being constituted by the matter-like divine nature, being identical to God, being a mind of God, being a way God relates to himself or the world, and so on. Further, the epistemic status of each argument's second premise may depend on what “divine” means.

Opponents of these sorts of argument typically give biblical counterexamples to the second premise (e.g., humans who are called “gods” but aren't divine in the relevant sense, humans who are authorized by God to forgive sins but aren't divine in the relevant sense). In other cases, they also challenge the first premise (e.g., Jesus denied being omniscient, there are inadequate grounds to say that the Son of God created the cosmos).

Another form of argument runs as follows.

  1. Passage E is a true prophecy predicting that the God of Israel, Yahweh, will do action A.
  2. Passage F truly asserts that the prophecy in E was fulfilled in the life of Jesus Christ.
  3. Therefore, Jesus Christ just is the God of Israel, Yahweh.

Opponents reply that this argument is invalid; it is possible for the premises to be true even though the conclusion is false. Even though the prediction “George W. Bush will conquer Iraq” may be said to be fulfilled by the actions of General Smith, it doesn't follow that Smith and Bush are one and the same. Rather, Smith acted as the agent of Bush. Similarly, Yahweh acts through his servant Jesus. Another disadvantage of this argument is that even if it is sound, the conclusion is undesirable. If Jesus and God are held to be (numerically) identical, and one adds that the Father is “fully divine” in this same sense, i.e. the Father is numerically identical to God, then it logically follows that Jesus just is (is numerically identical to) the Father. And yet, according to any trinitarian, some things are true of one that are not true of the other. This is why nearly all trinitarian theories decline to identify more than one of the three persons with God. On the other hand, some embrace this as a mystery —something which appears contradictory but is in fact true. (See main entry section 4.2.)

This traditional case for the divinity of Jesus and the Holy Spirit may be best construed not as a collection of deductive arguments, but rather as an inference to the best explanation, an attempt to infer what best explains all the biblical texts considered together. In this genre, however, alternate explanations are rarely explored in any detail, much less shown to be inferior.

Many arguments of the above types date back to ancient times, and have been repeated in similar forms whenever mainstream trinitarianism has been attacked (Beckwith 2007; Bowman 2007; Bowman and Komoszewski 2007; George 2006; Stuart 1834; Waterland 1856a-e). A number of well developed refutations of these arguments dating from the 17th to 19th centuries have been largely forgotten by present-day theologians, philosophers, and apologists (Burnap 1845; Clarke 1978; Crellius Racovian; Emlyn 1746; Haynes 1797; Lardner 1793; Lindsey 1776, 1818; Norton 1859; Nye 1691b; Priestley 1791a-c; Wilson 1846).

3. Development of Creeds

3.1 Up to 325 CE

It has been hotly disputed what sort of trinitarianism, if any, early Christian theologians held. Mainstream theologians often read them as implicit Latin or pro-Nicene trinitarians, or at least as heading in the direction of the later pro-Nicene “consensus”. In contrast, unitarians appeal to early theologians as illustrating that early Christianity was simply not trinitarian, but rather held God and the Father to be numerically identical. And various later subordinationists (see section 3 of the supplementary document on unitarianism) appeal to these authors to support the idea that the Son of God is in some sense ontologically dependent on God, the Father (whom they identify with Yahweh). Both the terminology and ideas of these early authors are non-standard, and so no proper survey of these works is possible here.

In brief, the focus was not on any trinitarian dogma per se, but rather on the nature of God, the nature of Christ, and how they are related. The man Jesus (or the divine pre-existent being united to him, or the union of the two) was variously called a “second god”, an “angel”, or the “wisdom” or “mind” of God, and was usually held to pre-exist his time in Mary's womb, to be “begotten” from the mind and/or will of the Father (either timelessly or at some time) and to be, in some sense “divine” and worthy of worship and prayer. And some writers, dubbed “monarchians” held that the Father and Son were one and the same person and being (Pelikan 1971, 176–182). The status of the Holy Spirit (power of the Father, the divine element in Jesus, a divine person?) was more ambiguous, seldom being a topic of dispute, and the Holy Spirit was not an object of prayer or worship in early Christianity.

3.2 325–381: The Arian Controversy

It was only in response to the controversy sparked by the teachings of the Alexandrian presbyter Arius (ca. 256–336) that a critical mass of bishops rallied around what eventually became standard language about the Trinity. This controversy was complex, and has been much illuminated by recent historians (Ayres 2004; Hanson 1988; Pelikan 1971; Rubenstein 1999; Williams 2001). It can be briefly summarized as follows. Arius taught, in accordance with an earlier subordinationist theological tradition, that the Son of God was a creature, made by God from nothing a finite time ago. Some time around 318–21 a controversy broke out, with Arius' teaching opposed initially by his bishop Alexander of Alexandria (d. 326). Alexander examined and excommunicated Arius. Numerous churchmen, adhering to subordinationist traditions about the Son rallied to Arius' side, while others, favoring theologies holding to the eternal existence of the Son and his (in some sense) ontological equality with the Father, joined his opponents. The dispute threatened to split the church, and a series of councils ensued, variously excommunicating and vindicating Arius and his defenders, or their opponents. Each side successively tried to win the favor of the then-current emperor, trying to manipulate imperial power to crush its opposition.

From the standpoint of later orthodoxy, a key episode in this series occurred in 325, when a council of bishops convened by the Emperor Constantine (ca. 280–337) decreed that the Father and Son were homoousios (same substance or essence). Arius and his party were excommunicated. The intended meaning of ousia here is far from clear, given the term's complex history and use, and the failure of the council to disambiguate it (Stead 1994, 160–72). They most likely settled on the term because it was disagreeable to the Arians. This ambiguous formula fanned the flames of controversy, as subordinationists and anti-subordinationists understood the phrase differently when signing on to it, and later argued for conflicting interpretations of it.

By the time of the council of Constantinople (381 CE), an anti-subordinationist reading, vigorously championed by Alexandrian bishop Athanasius (d. 373) had the upper hand; homoousios was understood as asserting the Father and Son to not merely be similar beings, but in some sense one being. While it stopped short of saying that the Holy Spirit was homoousios with the Father and Son, the council did say that the Holy Spirit “is worshiped and glorified together with the Father and the Son”, and added in a letter accompanying their creed that the three share “a single Godhead and power and substance” (Leith 1982, 33; Tanner 1990, 24, 28). Over the ensuing period the same sorts of arguments used to promote the divinity of the Son, were reapplied to the Holy Spirit, and eventually inhibitions to applying homoousios to the Holy Spirit evaporated.

Athanasius and others in the prevailing party argued that the salvation of humans requires the Son and Holy Spirit to be equally divine with the Father. This kind of argument depends on various controversial models of salvation, such as the one on which salvation involves the “deification” or “divinization” of humans, which can only be accomplished by one who is himself divine (Rusch 1980, 22–23). Despite shifting convictions about what salvation is and how God accomplishes it, this basic sort of argument remains popular—that if Christ and/or the Holy Spirit were not in some sense “fully divine”, then humanity couldn't be saved by their actions. (For an influential medieval argument, see Anselm Cur.) Perhaps the most currently popular such argument is that our forgiveness by God, an infinitely valuable being, requires an atoning sacrifice of infinite value. Hence, Christ has to be fully divine, as only a fully divine being has infinite value.

3.3 The pro-Nicene Consensus

Around the time of the Council of Constantinople, as imperial and ecclesial forces were systematically extinguishing subordinationist groups in the eastern and western empires (Wiles 1996, 27–40), the kind of trinitarianism which finally prevailed within the mainstream institutions of Christianity began to gel into a recognizable form. Following Hanson (1988) and Ayres (2004) we call this the “pro-Nicene consensus”. This consensus spanned the east-west (Greek-Latin) divide. Thus, to present this view we summarize the accounts of two influential theorists, one from each side of this cultural and linguistic divide: Gregory of Nyssa, and Augustine of Hippo. (General criticisms of this sort of trinitarianism are discussed in section 4 of the main text.)

3.3.1 Gregory of Nyssa

Gregory of Nyssa (ca. 335–ca. 395) is now known as one of the Cappadocian Fathers, the other two being his older brother Basil of Caesarea (ca. 329–79) and Gregory Nazianzus (329–89). These three active bishops are credited with establishing a consistent terminology for the Trinity, namely using hypostasis or prosopon for what God is three of, and ousia (along with phusis) for what God is one of. (On their lives, careers, and extant writings, see Ayres 2004 and Hanson 1996.) We look briefly at Nyssa's views here, as illustrating several points about the pro-Nicene consensus.

Nyssa notoriously compares the Trinity to three human beings (Nyssa Answer, 256). Largely on this basis, he (and the other Cappadocians) have been interpreted as proto-social trinitarians (see section 3 of the main text), holding the three persons to be three subjects of consciousness and action, of the same kind, homoousios in the way that any two examples of a natural kind are, such as two humans (Plantinga 1986). However, it has been objected that the three human analogy was suggested by his opponents; it is neither Nyssa's only nor his main analogy for the Trinity (Coakley 1999).

In Nyssa's letter An Answer to Ablabius: That We Should Not Think of Saying There are Three Gods he responds to an objection passed on by his correspondent, the younger bishop Ablabius: even though three men share a single humanity, we call them “three men”, so if Father, Son, and Holy Spirit share a single divinity, why shouldn't we call them “three gods”? (Nyssa Answer, 256–7) After a flippant answer, he argues that both ways of speaking are on a par, but they are both incorrect; that is, both talk of many gods and of many men involve “a customary misuse of language” (257). In both cases, he argues that the general term refers to the single, common nature. More accurately, he adds, the term “godhead” refers only to a divine operation of seeing or beholding, as “His nature cannot be named and is ineffable” (259). Moreover, the Bible ascribes this operation equally to each of the three (260). Does it not follow that there are three seers, “three gods who are beheld in the same operation” (261)? Nyssa argues that it does not.

In the case of men… since we can differentiate the action of each while they are engaged in the same task, they are rightly referred to in the plural….With regard to the divine nature, on the other hand, it is otherwise….Rather does every operation which extends from God to creation… have its origin in the Father, proceed through the Son, and reach its completion by the Holy Spirit. For the action of each in any matter is not separate and individualized. But whatever occurs… occurs through the three Persons, and is not three separate things….we cannot enumerate as three gods those who jointly, inseparably, and mutually exercise their divine power… (261–2; cf. 266)

We're unable to differentiate, Nyssa thinks, any distinct works of the persons. The word “deity” (or “Godhead”) signifies only a certain work. Therefore, we're unable to count, and shouldn't speak of three distinct deities (261-4).

A problem with Nyssa's argument is that words like “work”, “operation”, and “action” can refer to either an activity (exercise of a thing's powers) or the result thereof. Thus, a series of plannings and drawings, etc., or the resulting building can be called what a certain architect did (or his work, operation, action). And one thing or event may be the result of a great many activities by different agents, as when dozens of construction workers contribute their actions to one result, such as a building (or the coming into existence of a building). Nyssa siezes on examples of the actions of the Father, Son, and Spirit having a single result. But though their “operation” (i.e. result) is one, it doesn't follow that they or their actions are one. Moreover, Nyssa speaks of the divine persons in the plural, and holds them to differ. While the divine nature is “undifferentiated”, the three persons differ causally.

To say that something [i.e. the Father] exists without generation explains the mode of its existence. But what it is is not made evident by the expression. (267)

Thus, while it is left unclear what the persons are, it is emphasized that a distinction between them hasn't been obliterated. Being a Platonist about universals, he holds that the Three share one universal nature (i.e. deity). But he is hard pressed to show why it doesn't follow that there are three gods (264-6). In the end, his main aim is simply to uphold the mysterious tradition passed down to him (257; cf. Nyssa Great, ch. 1-3).

The bedrock of pro-Nicene trinitarianism is a metaphysics of God as unique, simple (lacking any sort of parts, composition, or differing aspects) and therefore incomprehensible (we can't grasp all truths about God, or any truths about God's essential nature) and ineffable (such that no human concept applies literally to it). Thus as Ayres notes,

Pro-Nicenes assume that one can draw no analogies between God and creation that will either deliver knowledge of God's essence or that can involve us in grasping clearly where and why an analogy fails. (Ayres 2004, 284)

Any analogy offered is therefore quickly supplemented by others. Its opponents view this as obfuscation, while its proponents consider the differing analogies to be complimentary and in some sense informative. While pro-Nicenes hold the persons to be (somehow) distinct, they show little interest in developing a metaphysical account of what it is to be a divine person. In sum, the Nicene pattern of speech and thought about the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit is held by them to be spiritually beneficial, but it doesn't admit of clarification.

3.3.2 Augustine

Recent scholarship locates Augustine firmly in the pro-Nicene tradition. His mammoth On the Trinity (Latin: De Trinitate), the final product of his thoughts on the Trinity, has been endlessly mined by later theologians, but seems to contain no developed theory of the Trinity, in the sense of a metaphysical model of the persons, their relations to each other, and their relations to one divine essence or nature.

Augustine was concerned to defend the trinitarianism of the Constantinopolitan creed against lingering “Arianism” and other heresies, confessing that this “is also my faith inasmuch as it is the Catholic faith” (Augustine Trinity, 70). He argues that the Bible implicitly teaches this sort of trinitarianism, on which the rest of the book is an extended meditation. This meditation, he concedes, fails to yield much by way of understanding. He holds that sin has corrupted our minds, so that we can't understand the doctrine, which we should still hope to understand in the next life (230–2, 435, 430). At the end he confesses “among all these things that I have said about that supreme trinity… I dare not claim that any of them is worthy of this unimaginable mystery” (434). Indeed, near the beginning he pictures the whole book as a grudging concession to certain unnamed Christians, “talkative reason-mongers who have more conceit than capacity”, who conclude that their teachers don't know what they are talking about, simply because those teachers are reluctant to speak of deep truths (67). Augustine's goal is not so much to understand the Trinity and communicate this to others, but rather to say some things that will deliver a small shred of understanding, which may entice the reader to pursue the experience of God (434–7). Because of this dim view of what humans are equipped to understand, much of the book is actually about how to talk about the Trinity, rather than about the Trinity itself. We may at least confess the correct doctrine, even if only later we come to understand what we've been saying.

Augustine suggests that the standard creedal term “person” (Greek: hypostasis or prosopon; Latin: persona) is adopted simply so that something may be said in answer to the question “What is God three of?” (224–30, 241, 398) Even though no genus or species concept we have applies to God, still, humans may be aware of God, as they are aware of love, and God is love (Book VIII). While this gives no insight into God's essential nature, it at least presents us with an object of spiritual pursuit.

Despite this pronounced negative mysterian note (see section 4.1 of the main entry), the book is famous for what later authors call “psychological analogies” of the Trinity. Augustine reasons that if we can't catch intellectual sight of the Trinity directly, at least we can see reflections, images, or indications of the Trinity in the created realm, above all in the highest part of human beings (the mind), who are made “in the image and likeness of God” (Augustine Trinity, 231; Genesis 1:26). In the human mind we may encounter several “trinities”, given here in the order that they somehow correspond to the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit:

These are taken to be “images” of the Trinity, with the final three being in some sense the most accurate. (He also discusses a few “trinities” or threefold processes which he doesn't hold to be images of the Trinity.) Although he apparently considers the contemplation of these to be helpful in the pursuit of God, in the last section (Book XV) of De Trinitate, Augustine emphasizes that even these are “immeasurably inadequate” to represent God (428). The main reason is that these three are activities which a person does or faculties a person has, whereas God “just is” his memory, understanding, and will; the doctrine of divine simplicity thus renders the mental analogies at best minimally informative. Further, temporal processes seem ill-suited to represent the nature of an essentially immutable God.

Augustine has often been read and criticized as a modalist or near-modalist, as many of his analogies, if taken as literal models of the Trinity, would render the persons (or two of them) modes of God. Another potentially modalist line of thought derives from the following problem. Augustine holds that God is simple and thus essentially immutable. Words which are predicated “accidentally” of creatures, such as good or wise, are predicated of God essentially. Applied to us, these words signify properties we happen to possess, and which we might have not possessed, but applied to God, they all indicate the same thing, God's simple essence. What about terms such as “Father” and “Son”? As God can't have accidental features, these can't be predicated accidentally. But Augustine doesn't want to say that they are essentially predicated either. He suggests that they are relationally predicated, that is, applied to God not because of his essence or accidents, but rather because of how God is related to himself. He explores but ultimately rejects the idea that all true predication of God is relational (Books V-VII). He finally holds that some terms apply equally to each of the three divine persons, whereas certain relational terms apply primarily to one of the three. In sum,

This Trinity is one God: it is simple even though it is a Trinity… because it is what it has, except insofar as one Person is spoken of in relation to another. (Augustine City, 462 [XI.10])

It is left unclear how a simple being may in some sense contain multiple inter-related Persons. All these themes have been further developed and applied in new ways by later thinkers. (See sections 4.1, on Thomas Aquinas, and 4.2, on John Duns Scotus, below, and section 2.1 of the main text, on Brian Leftow.) To the charge of modalism, though, Augustine may plead that his assertions about the Trinity don't have enough literal content to be any variety of modalism. He is rather a negative mysterian. (See main entry, section 4.)

Important medieval philosopher-theologians not discussed here who develop Augustine's trinitarianism include Boethius (ca. 480–525) and Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) (Marenbon 2003, 66–95; Mann 2004).

3.3.3 The “Athanasian” Creed

The so-called Athanasian Creed (also known by the Latin words it begins with, as the Quicumque vult) is a widely adopted and beloved formulation of the doctrine. It shows strong Augustinian influence, and is thought to be the product of an unknown early 6th century writer. Contemporary philosophical discussions often begin with this creed, at it puts pro-Nicene trinitarianism into a memorably short and palpably paradoxical form.

It reads, in part,

Whoever wants to be saved should above all cling to the catholic faith. Whoever does not guard it whole and inviolable will doubtless perish eternally. Now this is the catholic faith: We worship one God in trinity and the Trinity in unity, neither confusing the persons nor dividing the divine being. For the Father is one person, the Son is another, and the Spirit is still another. But the deity of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit is one, equal in glory, coeternal in majesty. What the Father is, the Son is, and so is the Holy Spirit. Uncreated… infinite… eternal… And yet there are not three eternal beings, but one who is eternal… Almighty is the Father… And yet there are not three almighty beings, but one who is almighty. Thus the Father is God; the Son is God; the Holy Spirit is God: And yet there are not three gods, but one God….not three lords, but one Lord. As Christian truth compels us to acknowledge each distinct person as God and Lord, so catholic religion forbids us to say that there are three gods or lords. The Father was neither made nor created nor begotten; the Son was neither made nor created, but was alone begotten of the Father; the Spirit was neither made nor created, but is proceeding from the Father and the Son. Thus there is one Father, not three fathers; one Son, not three sons; one Holy Spirit, not three spirits. And in this Trinity, no one is before or after, greater or less than the other; but all three persons are in themselves, coeternal and coequal; and so we must worship the Trinity in unity and the one God in three persons. Whoever wants to be saved should think thus about the Trinity. (Anonymous Athanasian)

By the latter part, it follows by the indiscernibility of identicals that no person of the Trinity is identical with any other. And by the earlier part, it seems to follow that there are thus at least three eternal (etc.) things. But it asserts there's only one eternal thing. Hence, the creed seems contradictory, and has been attacked as such (Biddle 1691, i; Nye 1691a, 11; Priestley 1871, 321). Showing where the above argument for inconsistency goes wrong is a major motivation of recent “Latin” theories (see section 2 of the main entry). In contrast, positive mysterians hold that it somehow goes wrong, though no one can say quite where. (See section 4.2 of the main entry.) Finally, some simply reject the creed.

4. Medieval Theories

Church council decisions are treated by Catholicism and Orthodoxy much like supreme court decisions in American jurisprudence. While early rulings may be bent and twisted to meet new needs, they are at least in theory inviolable precedents. Thus, the structure of Christian churches ensured that these boundaries weren't violated, and theorizing about the Trinity from around 400 CE until the Reformation (c. 1517) was forcibly kept within the bounds of creedal orthodoxy. Thus, most medieval trinitarian theories are essentially elaborations on the pro-Nicene consensus in a more confident and metaphysical mode. That is, they adhere strictly to the creedal statements as well as writings of their tradition's most authoritative church fathers, but are less reticent to give fuller accounts of what the persons are and how they are related to one another and to God or the divine essence.

There were short-lived exceptions to this conformity; periodically, allegedly tritheistic trinitarian theologies were proposed and quickly suppressed (Pelikan 1978, 264–7; Pohle 1919, 255–63; Tavard 1997; see also the section on Tritheism in the entry on John Philoponus).

For the complicated trinitarian theory of Peter Abelard see Brower 2005 and the section on Theology in the entry on Peter Abelard.

4.1 Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas sets out a highly developed and difficult trinitarian theory (Summa Contra Gentiles 4.1–26, Summa Theologiae I.27–43). God is “pure act”, that is, he has no potentialities of any kind. God is also utterly simple, with no distinct parts, properties, or actions. We may truly say, though, that God understands and wills. These divine processes are reflexive relations which are the persons of the Trinity. The Word eternally generated by God is a hypostasis, what Aristotle calls a first substance, which shares the essence of God, but which is nonetheless “relationally distinct” from God. The persons of the Trinity, as they share the divine essence, are related more closely than things which are merely tokens of a kind (e.g., identical twins), but he seems to hold that none are identical to either of the others (they are truly three). Aquinas develops Augustine's idea that the “persons” of the Trinity are individuated by their relations. For Aquinas, the relations Paternity, Sonship, and Spirithood are real and distinct things in some sense “in” God, which “constitute and distinguish” the three persons of the Trinity (Hughes 1989, 197). The persons are distinct per relationes (as to their relations) but not distinct per essentiam (as to their essence or being). In the words of one commenter,

[For Aquinas,] relations both constitute and distinguish the divine persons: insofar as relations are the divine essence (secundum res) [i.e. they're the same thing], they constitute those persons, and insofar as they are relations with converses, they distinguish those persons. (Hughes 1989, 217)

But how may these relations be, constitute, or somehow give rise to three divine hypostaseis when each just is the divine essence? For if each is the divine essence, won't it follow that each just is (i.e. is identical to) both of the others as well? Aquinas holds that it does not follow—that would amount to modalism, not orthodox trinitarianism. To show why it doesn't follow, he distinguishes between identitas secundum rem et rationem (sameness of thing and of concepts) and mere identitas secundum rem (sameness of thing). To the preceding objection, then, Aquinas says that the alleged consequence would follow only if the persons were the same both in thing and in concept. But they are not; they are merely the same thing.

This move is puzzling. Aquinas holds that the three are not merely similar or derived from the same source, but are in some strong sense the same, but not identical (i.e. numerically the same) which he appears to understand as sameness in both thing and concept. Even this last is surprising; one would think that for Aquinas “sameness in thing” just is identity, and that “sameness in concept” would mean that we apply the same concept to some apparent things (whether or not they are in fact one or many). Christopher Hughes holds that Aquinas is simply confused, his desire for orthodoxy having led him into this (and other) necessary falsehoods. On Hughes's reading, Aquinas does think of “sameness in thing” as identity, but he incoherently holds it to be non-transitive (i.e. if A and B are identical, and B and C are identical, it doesn't follow that A and C are identical), while in some contexts assuming (correctly) that it is transitive (Hughes 1989, 217–40).

The interpretation of Aquinas on these points is difficult. Other recent philosophers, more sympathetic to Aquinas' trinitarian theory, have not tried to salvage the entire theory, but have, with the help of various distinctions not explicitly made by Aquinas, sought to salvage his basic approach. This involves developing and trying to vindicate his apparently modalistic approach to the persons (which seem to be God's relating to himself in three ways), showing how these relations may in fact be substantial persons, or specifying a relation which the persons may each bear to the divine essence which is something short of (classical, absolute) identity but much like it. (See section 2 of the main text.)

4.2 John Duns Scotus

Richard Cross has recently argued that John Duns Scotus (1265/6–1308) has an unjustly neglected trinitarian theory, “one of the most compelling and powerfully coherent accounts of the Trinity ever constructed” (Cross 2005, 159).

Realists about universals hold that in addition to individual humans, there is a universal thing, or “common nature” called “humanity” (Each individual human, for example Peter, is an “instance of” this common nature, humanity. Similarly, the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are three “exemplifications” of the “universal” called “divinity”.) However, divinity, unlike humanity, is not “divided in” its instances or exemplifications; that is, while three instances of humanity amount to three humans, three exemplifications of divinity don't amount to three divine beings. Rather, each of the three exemplifications (Father, Son, and Holy Spirit) is the one God. Thus, the persons are related to God somewhat as concrete things are related to the universals of which they are examples (Cross 1999, 61–71). Indeed, the divine nature or essence is a universal, although it is also a substance (a.k.a. substantial individual, subsistent thing, thing with per se existence) (Cross 2005, 181). Further, though it is a substance, it is also “that power in virtue of which a divine person can produce other divine persons” (Cross 2005, 206).

How are the persons related to each other? They have the divine nature in common. They are related to each other in a way somehow similar to two physical objects which are simultaneously made of the same stuff or matter (this is merely an analogy—Scotus doesn't believe God or any divine person to be partly composed of matter). The persons, as it were, partially but don't entirely “overlap”, as each is also partly composed of a unique personal property, not had by the two others. Each person, in Scotus's terms, is “essentially identical” with the divine essence, but not “formally” or “hypostatically” identical. In the same way, Peter is essentially identical with humanity, but isn't formally identical with it, having his own haecceity (his own individual essence, or “thisness”) not had by any other human. But whereas Peter and Paul are “really distinct”, the persons of the Trinity are not, at least if being “really distinct” implies being separable (Cross 1999, 69). Further, as Cross explicates this view, the divine nature or essence is nothing more than “the overlap of” the persons, which saves it from being some fourth divine thing in God (Cross 2005, 166). Nonetheless, it is metaphysically “prior to” the persons, in the sense of being the form in virtue of which the three relations obtain. Moreover, this essence “immediately determines” the Father, and only through him is it determined to the Son and Spirit. This process is causal, but does not imply, Scotus holds, that the Son and Spirit are subordinate to the Father, or that they are imperfect or less divine than he (Cross 2005, 176–80, 245–8).

The Son and Spirit are produced willingly but necessarily, the Son being the divine Word as generated by God's memory, as had by the Father. The Holy Spirit is God's love for his own essence. Like Augustine, he holds that the persons are distinguished by their relational properties, but he does this on the basis of church tradition, not because he finds anything impossible in the supposition that the persons are distinguished by absolute (non-relational) properties. While the relational properties of paternity, sonship, and being spirated constitute the three persons, he denies that those are their only unique properties (Cross 1999, 62–7). These properties are supposed to explain why the persons, unlike the divine essence, are not communicable (Cross 2005, 163).

Is it possible for anything to be related as Scotus thinks the members of the Trinity are to the divine essence? As Cross asks, “if the divine essence is indivisible, how can it be instantiated by three different persons?” (Cross 1999, 68) Scotus claims that the divine essence is “repeatable” or “communicable” without being “divisible” (Cross 1999, 68). He gives a soul-body analogy: just as the intellective soul is equally in each organ without being “divided” or composed of parts, so the divine essence relates to the three persons. But the divine essence is the only universal, he holds, which is commmunicable in this way.

Scotus gives some perfect-being and other arguments to the effect that there must be two and only two productions within God, and only one unproduced producer (the Father, not the divine nature in him). Moreover, the divine essence, being a “quiddity” (exemplifiable or communicable thing) exists in or as some non-exemplifiable thing or suppositum, here, the person of the Father (Cross 2005, 127–52).

This theory hasn't been much discussed; few Christian thinkers past or present have claimed to understand it. Since the Reformation era, many theologians and philosophers have been impatient with this sort of confident metaphysical speculation, preferring to dismiss it as learned nonsense. However, Cross has painstakingly laid out its motivations and content.

One line of objection would be that the theory is obscure and ad hoc, as among all universals only divinity is capable of being multiply instantiated without there being multiple individual things of that kind. One might also worry whether Scotus is entitled to equate something as seemingly abstract as a universal (the divine essence) plus a particular property with a substantial, personal being.

5. Post-Medieval Developments

Starting in the great upheaval of the sixteenth century Protestant Reformation many Christians re-examined the New Testament and rejected many later developments as incompatible with apostolic doctrine, lacking adequate basis in it, and often as contrary to reason as well. Initially, many Reformation leaders de-emphasized the trinitarian doctrine, and seemed unsure whether or not to confine it to the same waste bin as the doctrines of papal authority and transubstantiation (Williams 2000, 459–60). In the end, though, those in what historians call the “Magisterial Reformation” decisively fell in line on behalf of creedal orthodoxy (roughly in line with the post-Nicene consensus), while other groups, now described as the “Radical Reformation”, either downplayed it, ignored it, or denied it as inconsistent with the Bible and reason. This led to several controversies between creedal trinitarians and what came to be called “unitarians” (earlier, “Socinians”) about biblical interpretation, christology, and the Christian doctrine of God, from the mid 16th to the mid 19th centuries. (See the supplementary document on unitarianism.)

As history played out, the practically non-trinitarian groups and some of the antitrinitarian groups evolved into trinitarian ones. Although unitarian and alternative views of the Trinity have repeatedly re-emerged in various Christian and quasi-Christian movements, the vast majority of Christians and Christian groups today at least in theory adhere to the authority of the Constantinopolitan and “Athanasian” creeds. At the same time, theologians have lamented that many Christian groups are arguably functionally non-trinitarian (though not antitrinitarian) or nearly so in their piety and preaching.

In recent theology, the Trinity has become a popular subject for speculation, and its practical relevance for worship, marriage, gender relations, religious experience, and politics, has been repeatedly asserted. (See section 3 of the main text.) It has fallen to Christian philosophers and philosophically aware theologians to sort out what precisely the doctrine amounts to, and to defend it against charges of inconsistency and unintelligibility.

The doctrine's basis or lack of basis in the New Testament, so vehemently debated from the 16th through the 19th centuries, is not presently a popular topic of debate. This is probably because some theologians hold the attempt to derive the doctrine from the Bible to be hopelessly naive, while other theologians, many Christian philosophers and apologists accept the common arguments (see section 2.2 above) as decisive. Again, the postmodernist view that there are no better or worse interpretations of texts may play a role in quenching interest among academic theologians. Finally, it may simply be that trust in the mainstream tradition, or in various particular Christian traditions, currently runs high; many confess trinitarianism simply because their church officially does, or because it and/or the mainstream tradition tells them that the Bible teaches it. Distrust of councils and post-biblical religious authorities has largely evaporated, even among Protestants from historically anti-clerical and non-creedal groups. Ecumenical movements, and anti-sectarian sentiments probably also play a role in deflecting attention from the issues, in that to many it seems perverse to attack one of the few doctrines on which all the main, dominant Christian groups are in agreement.