Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Thermodynamic Asymmetry in Time

1. For a nice discussion of this point within the debate about scientific realism, see Psillos 1994.

2. A third version, inequivalent to both of the above, is Caratheodory's law. It states that in the neighborhood of any equilibrium state of a system there are states that are inaccessible by an adiabatic process. This considerably more abstract version of the second law forbids a more general type of process than the other formulations, but it does so at the cost of making the law less intuitive, since its relationship to the familiar types of thermodynamic processes is often quite convoluted.

3. The so-called Third Law is essentially Nernst's Theorem, which states that the entropy of every system at absolute zero can always be taken equal to zero. The third law thus allows one to calculate the absolute value of the entropy; however, this is not necessary for classical thermodynamics to work successfully. In addition, there is the so-called Zero-th Law that expresses the transitivity of equilibrium: if two bodies A and B are separately in equilibrium with a third body C, then A and B are in equilibrium with one another. Interestingly, this law follows from Kelvin and Caratheodory's formulations but not from Clausius' (see Pippard 1964, 95).

4. This should be contrasted with the arrows of time discussed in semiclassical quantum gravity, for example, the idea that quantum scattering processes in systems with black holes violate the CPT theorem.

5. That is, a case can be made that both the ‘super-weak’ and ‘milli-weak’ fields postulated to account for CP-violations are quite analogous in method to the postulation of the time-ordering field. See Sachs 1986, 236, and references therein.

6. Blatt 1959, Reichbach 1956, Redhead and Ridderbos 1999, and to some extent, Horwich 1974 are a few works charmed by this idea.

7. The confusion surrounding interventionism is especially bad in quantum mechanics. Coupled with one of the primary sources of confusion, the measurement problem, and various mistaken views conflating information and entropy, one encounters many misguided ideas. The mysterious loss of information essential to the observation process, for instance, is frequently said to be the source of quantum mechanical collapses and also the direction of time. Partovi (1989; 1990) has a project along these lines that exploits much such confusion. The point of his project is to show that interactions with the environment bring about wave function reduction that in turn causes entropy increase. Since environmental noise is often interpreted as environmental decoherence in QM, the decoherence approach to quantum measurement is also said to explain time's arrow (Joos and Zeh 1985). But since decoherence respects the unitarity and reversibility of the Schroedinger evolution, it is hard to see how it could make itself immune to a Loschmidt reversal, and so, this approach would still need to posit special initial conditions.

8. This example is from Sanford 1979; but see also Reichenbach 1956, pp. 43-47.