Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Samuel Ibn Tibbon

First published Mon Feb 6, 2006; substantive revision Wed Feb 10, 2010

Samuel Ibn Tibbon (c. 1165–1232) was a translator, philosopher, and philosophical commentator on the Bible. He is most famous for his translation of Maimonides’ Guide of the Perplexed from Arabic into Hebrew. But he translated other works by Maimonides, and produced the first Hebrew versions of Aristotle and Averroes. In addition to his work as translator, Ibn Tibbon was an original author in his own right. He wrote the first full Aristotelian explication of the biblical book Ecclesiastes, a philosophical-exegetical monograph entitled Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, and several smaller philosophical-exegetical treatises and epistles. His work was especially important in his native southern France (“Provence”), but he had significant influence also on Jewish philosophy in Italy, Byzantium, and Spain, through the thirteenth, fourteenth, and fifteenth centuries. He is rightfully considered the founder of Maimonideanism, a philosophical-exegetical movement in medieval Judaism.

1. Historical Background

In the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, southern France (the Midi, Occitania, what the Jews called “Provence”) was the most active center of Jewish philosophy. There, in the communities of Béziers, Carcassonne, Narbonne, Lunel, Montpellier, Arles, and Marseilles, Jewish scholars devoted themselves to the translation and dissemination of philosophical texts and ideas. During the period 1148–1306 in particular—from the Almohad persecutions in Islamic Spain to the expulsion of the Jews from France—much of the classical tradition, as translated into Arabic and developed in the Islamic world, was made available in Hebrew. This included works of philosophy and theology, logic and grammar, mathematics, astronomy, astrology, and medicine.

The main translators during this period were members of a single family. Judah Ibn Tibbon (c. 1120–1190), a native of Granada, resettled in Lunel, where he devoted himself to the translation of Judaeo-Arabic works, including texts by Saadia Gaon, Jonah Ibn Janah, Solomon Ibn Gabirol, Bahya Ibn Paquda, and Judah Halevi. His son Samuel (c. 1165–1232) translated Maimonides, and produced the first Hebrew versions of Aristotle (the Meteorology) and Averroes (“Three Treatises on Conjunction,” two by Averroes and one by Averroes' son ‘Abd Allah). Most prolific was the next generation of translators. Thus Jacob Anatoli (c. 1194–1256), the son-in-law and chief disciple of Samuel, translated Ptolemy, Averroes' abridgement of Ptolemy, al-Farghani, and Averroes' middle commentaries on Aristotle's Organon; while Samuel's son Moses (fl. 1244–1283) translated dozens of works by Euclid, Geminus, Theodosius, Themistius, Hunayn b. Ishaq, Abu Bakr al-Razi, Ibn al-Haytham, al-Hassar, Ibn al-Jazzar, al-Farabi, Avicenna, Ibn al-Sid al-Batalyawsi, Averroes, Jabir Ibn Aflah, al-Bitruji, and Maimonides. The last major figure of the family was Jacob b. Makhir (c. 1236–1306), who translated additional works from Arabic, by Euclid, Menelaus, Autolycus, Theodosius, Qusta b. Luqa, Ibn al-Haytham, Ibn al-Saffar, Azarquel, Jabir ibn Aflah, and Averroes. He also seems to have rendered a work from the Latin: a medical text by his contemporary Arnold of Villanova.

The Ibn Tibbon dynasty of translators was instrumental in creating a philosophical library in Hebrew. They also developed a technical terminology, which was used by translators, philosophers, and commentators throughout the Middle Ages. Perhaps more significant, however, were their contributions as original authors. Thus Samuel and Moses wrote philosophical commentaries on the Bible and rabbinic literature and philosophical-exegetical monographs, while Jacob Anatoli wrote a collection of philosophical sermons. These writings, inspired by the work of Maimonides and saturated with the philosophy of al-Farabi and Averroes, laid the foundations for a whole movement of Jewish philosophy and exegesis: Maimonideanism. This movement attracted enthusiasts in Provence, as well as in Italy, Byzantium, and to a lesser extent Spain. It exercised influence and caused controversy throughout the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries and even into the fifteenth, when Jewish philosophy gradually turned to Christian-Latin rather than Graeco-Arabic and Arabic sources for inspiration.

2. Life of Samuel Ibn Tibbon

Samuel Ibn Tibbon—the second generation of the Ibn Tibbon dynasty—was born in Lunel, a small but very active rabbinic center in southern France (between Narbonne and Montpellier). There his father raised him and educated him according to the ideals of Islamic Spain. Thus, in addition to classical Jewish subjects—Hebrew language, Hebrew Bible, and Rabbinic literature—Samuel studied Arabic, philosophy and medicine. Samuel was also introduced to the literary arts, including calligraphy, poetry, and epistolary. But the world of belles lettres did not find favor with the younger Ibn Tibbon; he was far more interested in philosophy than poetry.

Although Samuel was raised in Lunel, he traveled extensively for business and in pursuit of knowledge. During his youth, he visited Marseilles with his father in order to engage in commerce. He completed his translation of the Guide of the Perplexed in Arles in 1204, consulted manuscripts of the Meteorology in Toledo and Barcelona (between 1204–1210), and traveled twice to Alexandria, returning in 1210 and 1213 (while in Egypt he seems to have acquired Maimonides' “Letter to Yemen” and an autograph copy of the Mishneh Torah). By 1211, Samuel seems to have moved his primary residence to Marseilles. There Jewish sages, on their way to the holy land, visited him in order to consult his translation of the Guide. It was in Marseilles, moreover, where he taught his son-in-law and most famous disciple Jacob Anatoli.

During his early years, Samuel was influenced primarily by his father. His mature work, in contrast, was built largely upon the foundations of Maimonides. Samuel translated the Guide and other writings by Maimonides, and corresponded with the “True Sage” regarding problems of translation and interpretation. In fact, much of Ibn Tibbon's life work was devoted to the explanation and dissemination of the teachings of Maimonides. But promoting Maimonides meant engaging philosophy more generally as well. Thus he acquired extensive knowledge of al-Farabi, cited and discussed Avicenna, and was one of the first scholars to make use of Averroes and al-Bitruji. There is some evidence that Samuel had contact with early Christian scholasticism as well. This is suggested by the surprising similarity between the interests of Ibn Tibbon and those of his contemporaries, such as Michael Scot and Alfred of Sarashel.

Of all the members of the Ibn Tibbon family, Samuel was the most influential. He was already quoted and eulogized by his contemporary, David Kimhi, and had decisive impact on the work of his son Moses and son-in-law Jacob Anatoli. But his influence is felt elsewhere as well. For example, in thirteenth-century Provence, he was plagiarized by Gershom b. Solomon, cited and discussed by Levi b. Abraham, and defended by Menahem ha-Meiri. In Italy, his writings were consulted and commented upon by Moses of Salerno, Zerahyah b. Isaac b. Shealtiel Hen, Judah Romano, and especially Immanuel of Rome, who excerpted large sections from Ibn Tibbon's writings and incorporated them into his commentaries on the Bible. So important was Ibn Tibbon's work that he was singled out by the opponents of philosophy. Thus Jacob b. Sheshet wrote a full-length critique of Ibn Tibbon's Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, while Solomon b. Abraham of Montpellier — the main anti-Maimonidean activist during the Maimonidean controversy of the 1230s — accused him of revealing the secrets of the Guide to the uninitiated. In the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, Ibn Tibbon was second to none as Maimonidean authority in philosophy and philosophical exegesis.

3. Translations

The primary occupation of Samuel Ibn Tibbon was translator. This is what he was trained to be by his father. His most famous translation is the Guide of the Perplexed. But he also translated other works by Maimonides, and produced the first Hebrew versions of Aristotle and Averroes. A brief description of each of the translations will be given here.

1. Maimonides, Commentary on the Mishnah, Avot
The first major translation of Maimonides by Ibn Tibbon was the commentary on Avot, which was completed, according to the manuscript, in 1202. Ibn Tibbon translated the commentary proper together with Maimonides' introduction, entitled “Eight Chapters.” The preface in particular, consisting of an introduction to and adaptation of Aristotelian ethics, would become the standard introduction to philosophical ethics in Hebrew throughout the later Middle Ages.

2. Maimonides, “Treatise on Resurrection”
It seems that the “Treatise on Resurrection” was translated into Hebrew during the resurrection controversy (1202–1204), when Maimonides was accused of denying this religious dogma. Ibn Tibbon translated it, and, it seems, sent it to Toledo, where it was retranslated into Arabic and translated afresh by Judah al-Harizi into a more fluid and readable Hebrew style.

3. Maimonides, Guide of the Perplexed
Ibn Tibbon began to work on this translation already in the 1190s, corresponded with Maimonides regarding problems of translation and interpretation, produced a first edition in 1204, and a revised version, with glossary (Perush ha-Millot ha-Zarot), in 1213. The translation itself generally circulated with the glossary, together with Ibn Tibbon's marginal annotations, an introduction on translation, and other study aids and ad hoc discussions.

4. Maimonides, “Letter on Translation”
While working on the translation of the Guide, Ibn Tibbon corresponded with Maimonides, but only one letter by Maimonides survives. This letter is a complex text, which includes a brief introduction, discussion of problems in translation, a description of his busy life in Fustat, and recommendations for philosophical reading. The letter was originally written in Arabic, but survives only in several Hebrew translations, one of which was rendered by Ibn Tibbon himself. This translation also includes Ibn Tibbon's own (often critical) remarks on Maimonides' suggested renderings of difficult Arabic terms.

5. Aristotle, Meteorology
Ibn Tibbon's translation of the Meteorology was completed, according to a manuscript colophon, in 1210, while returning by boat from Alexandria. In the preface, he discusses the problems of translating this work: the subject was difficult, the Arabic translation obscure, and the manuscripts corrupt. Thus he consulted manuscripts in Barcelona and Toledo in order to help reconstruct the original. He also examined the commentaries on it by Alexander of Aphrodisias, Avicenna, and Averroes—for textual witnesses and to help understand the text. In some cases, he incorporated translations from the commentators into the translation itself. Ibn Tibbon's preface to the translation includes the beginnings of a lexicon, perhaps part of a larger project, which was never completed or was incorporated into his larger glossary (to be discussed below).

Why did Ibn Tibbon translate the Meteorology before any other work by Aristotle? It seems that he did this in response to a remark made by Maimonides in Guide 2:30—that Meteorology is the key to understanding the “account of the beginning” in Genesis, chapter 1.

6. Averroes and ‘Abd Allah, “Three Treatises on Conjunction”
The translation of three short treatises on conjunction with the active intellect by Averroes and Averroes’ son ‘Abd Allah was also a pioneering project. They were the first works of Averroes rendered into Hebrew, before any of the commentaries on Aristotle. Ibn Tibbon translated them and attached them to his commentary on Ecclesiastes. He did this, he maintained, because Averroes and Solomon were aiming to do precisely the same thing: to defend the doctrine of conjunction against skeptics who denied that it was possible.

These translations, therefore, like the Meteorology, had strong exegetical significance. But they were read in their own right as well. They circulated independently of the commentary on Ecclesiastes, and became standard textbooks in the discussion of immortality. Thus, for example, they were included in Gershom b. Solomon's encyclopedic work Sha‘ar ha-Shamayim, were commented on by Gersonides, and were incorporated into Hanokh b. Solomon al-Konstantini's Marot Elohim. A composite Latin version, based on the Hebrew, circulated under the title De animae beatitudine.

7. Maimonides, “Letter to Yemen”
The last known translation by Ibn Tibbon is Maimonides' “Letter to Yemen.” This text he seems to have acquired while in Egypt; and he translated it into Hebrew circa 1214. Why he translated this text is not known. But it seems that it did not circulate widely. Thus already in the 1230s Abraham ibn Hasdai found it necessary to produce a fresh translation of the work, since he could not find a copy of the rendering by his predecessor.

8. Other translations
Ibn Tibbon incorporated translations and summaries of Arabic texts into his original writings as well. This is true in the glossary attached to the Guide (Perush ha-Millot ha-Zarot), his commentary on Ecclesiastes, and Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim. Three of the most important examples are the following:

8.1 Al-Farabi, Short Summary of Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle's Categories
The first entry in Ibn Tibbon's glossary is the definition of the ten categories and five predicables. Most of the text presented there is a word-for-word translation from al-Farabi.

8.2 Al-Bitruji, Principles of Astronomy
In the glossary, commentary on Ecclesiastes, and Ma'amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, Ibn Tibbon presents a brief summary of al-Bitruji's astronomy; these were the first appearances of Bitruji's novel theories in Hebrew. In the following generation, the entire text of al-Bitruji was translated by Samuel's son Moses.

8.3 Avicenna, Kitab al-Shifa', Meteorology
In the third chapter of Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, Ibn Tibbon presents a partial translation of a section from Avicenna's Shifa' on mountain formation. The theory of Avicenna—that erosion is prevented by the mixture of mud with fatty oils—contributed to Ibn Tibbon's discussion there of eternity of the world and the possibility of spontaneous generation.

9. Spurious and doubtful translations
Many other translations are attributed to Ibn Tibbon in manuscripts, manuscript catalogues, and later sources. Most are clearly spurious; but two are worth mentioning. Isaac Abarbanel refers to a translation by Ibn Tibbon of Maimonides’ introduction to chapter ten of Mishnah Sanhedrin, but this translation does not survive. An anonymous translation of the text, published by Kupfer, is clearly not his work. The second is a translation of ‘Ali b. Ridwan's commentary on Galen's Ars parva. According to the colophon, this translation was completed by Ibn Tibbon in Béziers in 1199. If this attribution were correct, it would contribute important information to Ibn Tibbon's biography. It would also establish the very early existence of an Arabic medical text in Hebrew. The translation itself, however, uses terms such as hippus that Ibn Tibbon, according to his own testimony (see below), only coined much later, after 1213.

4. Method of Translation

Ibn Tibbon's translations are generally literal. Unlike Judah al-Harizi, his rival translator, he was not concerned with felicity of style or purity of language but accuracy in meaning. Thus he uses rabbinic as well as biblical expressions, follows the syntax of the Arabic, and coins new terms, based on the model of the Arabic. He was criticized for this method—by al-Harizi and others—but it was his method and terminology that ultimately won out and became authoritative throughout the later middle ages.

Ibn Tibbon discusses the problems and difficulties of translation in several texts: The preface to the translation of the Guide, the prologue to his “Letter on Providence,” the preface to the glossary and the glossary itself, the preface to Meteorology, and the commentary on Ecclesiastes. What I would like to do here is present a brief synthetic characterization of Ibn Tibbon's method of translation based on these sources. This subject is important for understanding the work of Ibn Tibbon and the process of creating a philosophical culture in Hebrew. Translating philosophy, moreover, is a philosophical subject in its own right.

1. Editing the text, comparing manuscripts

The first order of business in translating a text is the preparation of a reliable edition. Thus Ibn Tibbon, as critical scholar, made every effort to collect and compare manuscripts of the texts on which he worked. For example, in a brief introduction to his “Letter on Providence,” he describes his efforts to eliminate corruptions in his manuscript of the Guide by acquiring additional copies and comparing them to his Vorlage. In the preface to the Meteorology, similarly, he indicates that he had consulted manuscripts of Aristotle's work in Toledo and Barcelona, and had studied the commentaries by Alexander, Avicenna, and Averroes, in order to help construct a more reliable text closer to the original.

2. Consulting Arabic dictionaries

In the preface to the translation of the Guide, Ibn Tibbon explains that, when confronted with difficult terms, he would consult Arabic dictionaries. He does not say which dictionaries he consulted, but a report by Todros Todrosi, in the preface to his fourteenth-century translation of Averroes’ Middle Commentary on Aristotle's Rhetoric (ed. J. Goldenthal, Leipzig, 1842, p. 3), provides an exact reference: al-Khalil b. Ahmad's Kitab al-‘ayn. Todrosi's report reads as follows:

There was not sufficient power in our knowledge of the Arabic language to produce this translation until God graced me with a noble book which includes explanations of each Arabic word and its grammar. It is called Sefer ha-‘Ayin. It is a book that the noble sage, the greatest of translators, Rabbi Samuel Ibn Tibbon, may his memory be for a blessing, made great effort to bring from Islamic lands.

3. Consulting previous translations

In the preface to the translation of the Guide, Ibn Tibbon explains that, in his translation of Maimonides, he had consulted previous translations, rendered by his father and by others. Moreover, he explains that, when a term already exists, he will follow established convention, even when he disagrees. One example of this ambivalent deference to tradition is his definition of “logic” in the glossary. The text (from Perush ha-Millot ha-Zarot, ed. Even-Shemuel, pp. 43-4; corrected by Hebrew MS London 904, 164b) reads as follows:

Logic [higgayon]: Some commentators have explained [the rabbinic phrase] ‘keep your children from higgayon’ [Ber. 28b] as referring to the science called mantiq in Arabic. The Christians call it ‘dialectic,’ [referring to the discipline as a whole] with the name of one of its parts. I have followed the commentators [with respect to this terminology] and call [logic] the ‘art of higgayon.’ But in my view it would have been better had they called it the ‘art of speech,’ following their opinion according to which they define man as ‘living and speaking.’ Indeed, in my opinion, [logic] ought to be called the ‘art of reason’.

4. The use of Saadia's Tafsir

Another important source of Ibn Tibbon's translations is the Arabic translation of the Bible by Saadia Gaon. This presented a ready lexicon of sorts for the translator: he could identify the Arabic term in Saadia's Tafsir and replace it with the biblical term it translated. One example of Ibn Tibbon doing exactly this is found in his glossary, in his discussion of the terms “definition” and “description.” His discussion, as found in the manuscript versions (see Perush ha-Millot ha-Zarot, ed. Even-Shemuel, pp. 24-5, corrected by Hebrew MS London 904, 161b), is as follows:

Having explained the meaning of these five words [namely, the five predicables], I will attach to them the explanation of two additional terms, namely, geder, ‘definition,’ and hoq, ‘description’ … As for the term hoq, I do not remember having seen this term used in this way by any [previous translator], but I have seen that Rabbenu Saadia translated the biblical term hoq, as in the phrase hoq u-mishpat, ‘a statute and an ordinance’ [see e.g. Exod 15:25], as rasm; and similarly he translated huqqay as rusûmî [see e.g. Ps 50:16]. Because of this, I have translated the Arabic term rasm into Hebrew as hoq.

5. Consultations with the author

When all else failed—after consulting dictionaries and previous translations—Ibn Tibbon addressed his queries to the author himself. In fact, there is evidence that Ibn Tibbon wrote at least three letters to Maimonides regarding translation and interpretation, and that he received at least two letters in response. But only Ibn Tibbon's “Letter on Providence” (which was mentioned briefly above), and Maimonides' “Letter on Translation” survive. Notable about the latter is that, despite Ibn Tibbon's efforts to consult with Maimonides, he generally ignored the latter's advice, and continued to follow the translation terminology and traditions of his father.

6. Coining new terms

One of Ibn Tibbon's most interesting discussions of translation is found in his preface to the glossary. There he lists and discusses six types of “strange” or “foreign” terms used in his translation of the Guide: neologisms, rare words or phrases, derived terms, homonyms, terms created through calque, and new compound expressions. In the preface to the commentary on Ecclesiastes, he then provides a rare description of how he actually coined a new term through calque. This description reads as follows:

Having mentioned the inductive syllogism, I shall explain what I mean by ‘induction,’ when I use it here and elsewhere. I say: it seems to me that the philosophers borrowed the Arabic word, which I replace with the Hebrew hippus, from the language of the multitude, who use it to express a notion that resembles what the philosophers intend when they use it. The notion for which the multitude use this word, namely, istiqrâ’, is as follows. They say: ‘I have examined [istiqraytu] a certain land,’ that is, I have traveled through all of it, seeing the character [‘inyan] of each of its villages and cities. The philosophers then borrowed [this same term] to represent the examination [haqirah] of a single universal by knowing the intention [‘inyan] of each of its parts and species. They called such an action istiqrâ’, derived a verb from it, and constructed whatever [grammatical forms] they desired. They said: ‘I have examined [istiqraytu] all of the particulars that are subsumed under a certain universal,’ that is, I have used the speculative method to pass through all of them, knowing in this way the intention [‘inyan] of each of them. I did not find a single word in our language closer to this meaning than hippus, even though the Arabic word, unlike the Hebrew hippus, implies not only the examination of a notion but knowledge of the notion examined.

7. Defense of translation

After completing the first version of the Guide, Judah al-Harizi produced a rival translation, apparently at the request of some sages from southern France. al-Harizi's translation was written elegantly and in Biblical Hebrew; its goal was to be readable and accessible. Ibn Tibbon issued his revised translation, with glossary, in response to this challenge. Thus in the preface to the glossary he focuses on defending his own work and undermining the work of his rival. He exposes al-Harizi's ignorance of philosophy and highlights his own mastery of the subject matter of the Guide and sensitivity to the difficulties of translation.

In the preface to the commentary on Ecclesiastes, Ibn Tibbon also seems to provide explanation why the literal translation of philosophical texts is superior. There he emphasizes the importance of word order in the construction of meaning. Drawing from the rhetorical tradition of “delivery,” he likens a written text to a speech: it uses certain literary devices to imitate gesture, voice, and facial expression. The text, describing the method of transmitting wisdom through “chapter headings,” reads as follows:

[This method of teaching through ‘chapter headings’] can be done orally and in person; it may even be easy for sages and men of understanding to do this; for the wise instructor has available many stratagems, digressions, and circumlocutions with which he can make the understanding student understand his purpose, even when his purpose is not made clear or explained. But he cannot do this when writing in a book. A man, for example, might say to his associate: ‘you did really well when you did that thing,’ while the person addressed will understand that in the former's opinion what he did was really bad. This he understands not from the words themselves, which are contrary to the speaker's purpose, but from certain affectations and accidents of speech, such as the appearance of the speaker's face, which may become red or green like that of an angry man, or his tone of voice; that is, rather than saying something in a gentle tone, in accordance with the manners of speech used by someone speaking straightforward, such a person would speak [using the tone] of someone who is speaking about something that he considers bad. [The listener can also understand his interlocutor's purpose] from other things that [the speaker] might attach to the words or attach the words thereto. Many examples of this type have been enumerated by the logicians.

Ibn Tibbon proceeds to discuss the ways to do this in a written text, using rhetorical and poetic devices. The implication for translation is as follows: any change in the form of a text will have serious impact on its meaning.

5. Reference Tools and Study Aids

Al-Harizi was right about one thing: that Ibn Tibbon's literal translations are difficult to read. But even if they were elegant and accessible, reading the Guide, and other translated texts, would require background in philosophy. This Ibn Tibbon recognized. Thus he did far more than simply producing literal translations; he also initiated the creation of a cognate literature in Hebrew: philosophical reference works and study aids. He produced the first major lexicon of philosophical Hebrew; and he included explanatory glosses in the margins of his translation of the Guide, which established the foundation for a proper commentary tradition. A brief discussion of the glossary will be given here.

The philosophical glossary or lexicon is, in fact, a very old genre. The tradition of defining key terms was developed already in late antiquity, and continued into the Middle Ages. For example, al-Kindi, Avicenna, and Isaac Israeli all wrote books of definitions.

Ibn Tibbon's Perush ha-Millot ha-Zarot was the first major philosophical lexicon written in Hebrew. It was written not as a general introduction to philosophy, like the work of his predecessors, but as a glossary to one translated text: Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed. In fact, however, it is much more. It includes extended discussions of key terms, and works as both glossary and lexicon, introduction and primer. Many philosophical ideas appear in Hebrew for the first time in the glossary; and there is evidence that the text itself was studied independently, as a general reference work or study aid.

In order to illustrate its character, I'll present here four entries from the glossary: rhetorical statement, natural science (or physics), divine science (or metaphysics), and mathematics. With these four entries, Ibn Tibbon introduced his Hebrew reader to the entire Aristotelian curriculum as it had developed in the Arabic world (including pseudo-Aristotelian works).

1. Rhetorical Statement [Ma'amar Haggadi]:

Know that there are five types of syllogism; Aristotle wrote a book about each. The first is the demonstrative syllogism, in which something is deduced from true premises. He called [his book on this type of syllogism] the “Book on Demonstration” [=Posterior Analytics]. The second is the dialectical syllogism, in which something is deduced from generally accepted premises. He called [his book on this type of syllogism] the “Book on Dispute and Victory” [=Topics]. The third type is the rhetorical syllogism, in which the premises are convincing, that is, they convince the masses of their truth such that they believe in them. These are inferior to the generally accepted premises; and they are certainly inferior to the demonstrative. He called [his book on this type of syllogism] “Rhetoric.” With this type of statement or syllogism, moreover, one preaches to the people in order to incite them to do something or refrain from doing something or to fix in their hearts the love of something such that they approach it or the hatred of something such that they remove themselves from it. A statement of this type is called “rhetorical statement,” just as a statement of the first type is called “demonstrative statement” and one of the second is called “dialectical statement.” The fourth is the poetic syllogism, in which the premises are such that they create an image in the heart of whoever hears them. This image leads such a person to love or hate something, even when he knows that there is no truth in those statements. He called [his book on this type of syllogism] “Poetics.” The fifth [type of syllogism] is the sophistical syllogism, of which there are two types: a) the premises themselves are sophistical, that is, although they appear to be true, when they are examined carefully by a scholar he finds that one or both are false; b) although the premises are true, their combination does not generate a [true] conclusion, even though it seems to do so. This second type will deceive anyone who fails to examine [the conclusion] carefully or who is not an expert with regard to all of the conditions of syllogisms. The name of the book concerning this, the fifth, type of syllogism is the “Book of Sophistry;” it is the book called in Arabic al-Safsata and in Romance Sofistica. These [five] works were prefaced by Aristotle with his “Book on Syllogism” [=Prior Analytics], in which he discusses all of them and makes known [in general] the conditions and properties of the syllogism.

2. Natural Science (Physics):

The Master [Maimonides] has indicated that this is what the Sages called the “account of the beginning.” He meant by this that the secrets of the “account of the beginning” represent chapter headings in natural science, which is the science that investigates all aspects of things that are governed by nature, i.e., all celestial and sublunary bodies and their accidents. The final source of all books in this science are those written by Aristotle. These include the following: 1) “The Discourses on Nature” [=Physics], in which natural things are discussed in general. 2) “On the Heavens and the World,” in which the spheres, planets, and stars, along with the four elements and their mixtures, are discussed in general. 3) “On Generation and Corruption,” in which the causes of generation and corruption, their attributes and quiddity, are discussed in particular. 4) “The Signs of Heaven” [=Meteorology], in which accidents and things that come into existence in the upper part of the atmosphere are discussed; some of these things, when they come into existence, are also found on land or in the sea. 5) “On Minerals and Stones,” in which their quiddity and quality are discussed. 6) “On Plants,” in which the nature of every thing that experiences growth is discussed. 7) “On Animals,” in which all accidents which affect both rational and irrational animals are discussed, as well as the utility of their limbs. 8) “On the Soul,” in which the faculties of the human soul are discussed in general. 9) “On Sense and Sensibilia” [=Parva naturalia], in which the nature of the senses in particular, as well as sleep and being awake, are discussed. As for the chapter headings set forth in the biblical section on Genesis, they cover only a small portion of what is contained in these books: not one in a hundred or even one in two hundred…

3. Divine Science (Metaphysics):

A science which discusses that which has no nature, i.e., things that are intellectual and separate from matter, like the Lord, His angels, and other things that derive from the actions of the intellect and from the knowledge of the intellect—they have no action in the sense world. The root of all books in this science is Aristotle's book called “Metaphysics.”

4. Mathematics:

Know that the demonstrative sciences have three divisions: natural science, mathematics, and divine science. We have already explained the first and the last. As for the second, namely mathematics, it includes geometry, arithmetic, astronomy—which includes the study of the spheres and planets and the judgments of the planets [=astrology]—and the science of melody, which is called “music.” The three terms “mathematics,” “propadeutic” and “training” are synonyms used for this division of science; for it is like a science that trains, teaches, or serves the other two divisions.

6. Philosophy and Exegesis

Ibn Tibbon wrote two main original works: A commentary on Ecclesiastes and a philosophical-exegetical monograph entitled Ma'amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim. He also wrote introductions to his translations, letters to Maimonides, and a short treatise on the “Reason for the Table and Shewbread.” In addition to these works, which are extant, he planned two other commentaries as well, which were never completed: A commentary on the internal meanings of Proverbs and an esoteric commentary on Genesis, entitled Ner ha-Hofes (see Prov 20:27).

What is the character of these writings? Although they are diverse in form and content, they all share two main characteristics: they discuss philosophical ideas in the form of biblical exegesis; and they build upon discussions of verses and rabbinic dicta found in the Guide and borrow and apply methods developed by the Guide. Any discussion of Ibn Tibbon, therefore, needs to work through a complex philosophical-exegetical process: from the Bible, to rabbinic literature, to Maimonides; and from Maimonides, through rabbinic literature, to the Bible.

Why did Ibn Tibbon write his philosophy in this way? Why didn't he write straightforward philosophical or theological summas or commentaries on philosophical works by Aristotle or Averroes? In the thirteenth century, much of the philosophical activity in the Jewish communities was focused not on general synthesis but on translation, transmission, defense, and propagation; and teaching philosophy within the framework of traditional literature was a very effective way of spreading the ideas of philosophy. In particular, teaching philosophy through Bible (or rabbinic literature) helped make foreign ideas more familiar and helped justify the study of philosophy by connecting it with authoritative exemplars. Most important, it created a safe place for the doing of philosophy itself; for through a peculiar process of canonization, beginning with Maimonides and continuing with his disciples, specific biblical verses or stories became the standard loci for the discussion of philosophical ideas or problems. The biblical texts would stay the same, but the philosophical ideas would change, in light of the novel ideas of a particular exegete or school of thought.

In order to give a sense of Ibn Tibbon's philosophical exegesis, I'll briefly describe his original writings, then single out a few specific examples relating to a single problem: the final aim of human existence.

1. The Preface to the translation of Maimonides, Commentary on Avot
In the preface to this translation, Ibn Tibbon presents a full and detailed explication of Jeremiah 9:22–23. He explains and criticizes Maimonides' explanation of these verses in Guide 3:54 and offers his own novel interpretation, according to which the final aim of man is knowledge and understanding of God, and nothing more (see further discussion below).

2. The Commentary on Ecclesiastes
It seems that this was Ibn Tibbon's first major exegetical work; it was likely completed sometime between 1213 and 1221. The commentary is a large and digressive work, including a long preface, a verse-by-verse commentary, and several digressions, in which Ibn Tibbon introduces a philosophical subject or explains a related verse in Genesis, Jeremiah, Psalms, Proverbs, or the Song of Songs. The philosophical digressions are mainly related to logic, astronomy, meteorology, generation and corruption, celestial influence on the sublunar world, and the soul and its faculties.

Ibn Tibbon's understanding of Ecclesiastes as a whole is as follows: Solomon wrote the book in his youth in order to refute ancient skeptics who denied the possibility of immortality (“conjunction with the active intellect”). This he did by carefully examining the arguments against immortality in order to show that they are not “complete” or “cogent” or “decisive.” The three arguments he refutes are the following: that human intellect is intellect in matter, and therefore cannot become separate from matter or contemplate separate substances; that the intellect, even though it derives from an incorporeal giver of forms, still requires a corporeal substrate; that ethics is a first rather than final perfection, and cannot save the human being from death and destruction.

3. Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim
The title of this work might be translated as: “Treatise on [the Verse]: Let the waters be gathered (Gen 1:9)” or: “The [Divine] Saying: Let the waters be gathered (Gen 1:9)”. It was completed after the commentary on Ecclesiastes, possibly in 1221 or 1231. Like the commentary on Ecclesiastes, it is digressive and exegetical, although in general it follows the order of Guide of the Perplexed, part III. Ibn Tibbon begins this work with a cosmological question—why is the earth not covered entirely by water—and then proceeds to answer this and related questions in relation to verses from Genesis, Isaiah, Ezekiel, Job, and especially the Book of Psalms.

4. “The Reason for the Table and Shewbread”
This short treatise was occasioned by a statement in Guide of the Perplexed 3:45. There Maimonides says that, although he can explain most aspects of the sacrificial cult, he cannot explain the reason for the table and shewbread. Ibn Tibbon thus takes up this challenge from the Master. He explains that the table and shewbread, and the very sensuous sacrificial cult in general, serves as a lesson in theology. In particular, the gross anthropomorphic representations, in Ibn Tibbon's opinion, expose the absurdity of conceiving God as a body, with all the body's concomitant needs and relations. In other words, the temple and tabernacle, working as a reductio ad absurdum of sorts, helped to spread the true belief in monotheism.

5. Commentary on the Internal Meanings of Proverbs
In the commentary on Ecclesiastes, Ibn Tibbon says that he planned a commentary on the internal meanings of Proverbs. Although this commentary was never written, it is possible that preliminary discussions were incorporated into his other writings. Thus in the commentary on Ecclesiastes, Ibn Tibbon presents a full and detailed verse-by-verse explication of Prov 1:1-7 and 8:22-36. The former he explains as a prooemium, following the philosophical tradition of writing prefaces: Solomon introduces the title of the work, the name of the author, the method of presentation, etc. The latter verses he explains in relation to the possibility of repentance: of sinning, repenting, and returning to the Garden of Eden.

6. Ner ha-Hofes: An Esoteric Commentary on Genesis
In Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, Ibn Tibbon refers several times to this book, which he says is a work in progress. It was never completed, but as with the commentary on Proverbs, it is possible that preliminary notes and explanations can be found in his other writings. Thus, for example, the commentary on Ecclesiastes includes several detailed explications of verses from Genesis, including 1:11, 1:14, 1:20, 1:26, 3:22–24, 8:21–22. Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, moreover, includes one chapter devoted to Gen 28 (Jacob's ladder), one to Gen 11 (the tower of Babel), and discussion throughout regarding Gen 1 and the “account of the beginning.”

7. Examples of Philosophical Exegesis

Throughout Ibn Tibbon's writings, he returns time and again to a few key problems: divine providence, the possibility of immortality, and the final aim of human existence. These subjects were particularly vexing: Maimonides had discussed them, but did not provide a consistent doctrine; al-Farabi had famously denied that conjunction is possible; while Averroes took up the question of immortality in several works with differing results. Ibn Tibbon, for his part, worked with the biblical texts singled out by Maimonides, but developed ideas drawn from al-Farabi and Averroes. His discussion of three biblical texts, all relating to the final aim of human existence, are especially important. His interpretations will be presented here in relation to those of Maimonides.

1. Genesis 28:12–13

And he dreamed, and behold a ladder set up on the earth, and the top of it reached to heaven; and behold the angels of God ascending and descending on it; and behold, the Lord stood above it, and said: I am the God of Abraham thy father, and the God of Isaac.

In the preface to the Guide of the Perplexed, Maimonides singles out Jacob's vision of the ladder in Gen 28 as a paradigmatic example of the biblical allegory; he isolates seven key terms in the story, which he decodes, in two different ways, in later chapters of the Guide. Thus the angels ascending and descending the ladder are explained in Guide 1:15 as prophets; they ascend through study and descend, with divine wisdom in hand, to govern the people. In Guide 2:10, in contrast, the vision is explained in relation to cosmology rather than politics and prophecy. The ladder is set up on the earth and extends into the celestial realm, the rungs on the ladder are the four elements or seven celestial bodies, and the angels ascending and descending are the celestial intelligences. The Lord, standing firmly at the top of the ladder, is God as first cause or prime mover.

Ibn Tibbon was the first philosopher-exegete to build upon Maimonides' approach and to move it in new directions, which were more consistent with his own particular interests. Thus in Ma’amar Yiqqawu ha-Mayim, chapter 11, he emphasized the epistemological and cosmological and eliminated the political. According to his interpretation, the angels ascending are the philosophers, who ascend the ladder of wisdom toward metaphysics, the final subject of the curriculum. Who then are the angels that descend? They are not the prophets, descending with wisdom to rule the people, but separate intelligences, which descend to help the human intellect reach its final perfection: knowledge of and conjunction with God.

2. Jeremiah 9:22–23

Thus saith the Lord, Let not the wise man glory in his wisdom, neither let the mighty man glory in his might, let not the rich man glory in his riches; But let him that glorieth glory in this, that he understandeth and knoweth me, that I am the Lord which exercise lovingkindness, judgment, and righteousness, in the earth: for in these things I delight, saith the Lord.

In Guide 3:54, Maimonides presents a brief discussion of the purpose of human existence. Building upon Aristotelian treatments of this problem, he presents four possible human ends: perfection in wealth, health, ethics, and intellect. He then introduces a biblical text, Jeremiah 9:22–23, which he says presents the same ideas of the philosophers, but with one important addition. Namely, like the philosophers, Jeremiah also singles out four possible perfections—“might,” “riches,” ethical “wisdom,” and “understanding and knowledge”—but he adds something more as well: “exercising lovingkindness, judgment, and righteousness, in the earth.” Thus knowledge of God, Maimonides seems to suggest, should lead to action; the contemplative should serve a practical end.

In the preface to the translation of Maimonides on Avot, as well as in the commentary on Ecclesiastes, Ibn Tibbon discusses these same verses from Jeremiah in detail, explains and criticizes Maimonides' interpretation of them, then presents his own novel explication. According to Ibn Tibbon, the final human perfection is knowledge and understanding of God, without qualification. Thus the verse should be understood differently, with the final clause relating to God rather than man; man should understand and know God, full stop.

3. Song of Songs 5:2

I sleep, but my heart waketh: it is the voice of my beloved that knocketh.

In Guide 3:51, Maimonides cites Song of Songs 5:2 in the course of his discussion of the patriarchs and Moses. These figures, he says, reached the highest level of human perfection, for they were in constant communion with God and also fully involved in the creation and governance of a religious community. They were like the protagonist of Song of Songs, with heart awake even while asleep.

What was Ibn Tibbon's understanding of the same subject? How did he build on and respond to Maimonides' use of the verse? As in the previous two examples, Ibn Tibbon cites and discusses Guide 3:51, but suggests a different approach. As he explains in the commentary on Ecclesiastes, the patriarchs and Moses did achieve this state of philosophy and politics, precisely as Maimonides had described it; they were asleep (in the world of matter) with heart awake (toward the world of God). But in Ibn Tibbon's opinion, although this state is worthy of praise, they could have reached a higher state still: they could have been completely awake, engaged in a life of pure contemplation, free from the hindrances of the physical and political world.

In all three of these examples, Ibn Tibbon emphasizes the contemplative over the practical. He works with the same biblical texts singled out by Maimonides, but arrives at a different philosophical position. It is precisely this interesting philosophical-exegetical give and take, the free discussion of ideas within a fixed biblical framework, that characterized the Maimonidean tradition of philosophy and exegesis, which was founded by Ibn Tibbon and continued by his descendents, disciples, and admirers.


Translations by Samuel Ibn Tibbon

Writings by Samuel Ibn Tibbon

Secondary works

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

afterlife | Al-Farabi | Al-Kindi | Alexander of Aphrodisias | Aristotle | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Crescas, Hasdai | Falaquera, Shem Tov Ibn | Gersonides | Halevi, Judah | Ibn Gabirol, Solomon [Avicebron] | Ibn Paquda, Bahya | Ibn Rushd | Israeli, Isaac | Maimonides | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | Saadya [Saadiah] | soul, ancient theories of | Themistius