#### Supplement to Singularities and Black Holes

## Lightcones and Causal Structure

In attempting to diagram relativistic spacetimes, one of the most
imporant features to capture is the *causal structure* of the
spactime. This structure specifies which events (that is, which points
of space and time) can be connected by trajectories that are slower
than light, which events can be connected by trajectories traveling
*at* the speed of light, and which events cannot be connected by
anything travelling at or below light speed. Events in the first group
are said to be "timelike related," because a physical clock could
travel from one event to the other. Events in the second group are
"lightlike related" because a light ray can travel from one to the
other. Events in the third group are "spacelike related." Given that it
is physically impossible (on the standard interpretation of relativity
theory) for any causal process to exceed the speed of light, these
three possible ways of being connected tell us whether one event is
able to influence another.

We can depict these three spatiotemporal relationships by drawing in
the "lightcone" of an event. Given an event *p*, the lightcone
of *p* consists of all the points that can be connected to
*p* by a straight ray of light. Imagine that event *p* is
someone flashing a bright light from a particular location. Then one
second later, there will be a sphere of points that is currently
occupied by the outgoing light pulse. Two seconds later, a larger
sphere, farther out, will be illuminated, and so on. We can depict
these spheres at progressive times in a spacetime if we ignore one
dimension of space so that we can draw in the points occupied by the
light pulse as a circle, as in the following figure:

We can likewise depict the points in the past that are connected to
point *p* by light rays. For a given time, these points will
again form a sphere, which will grow larger the farther into the past
we look. Thus the full light cone looks like this:

We can now use these lightcones to depict the causal structure of
spacetime. Anything outside of the lightcone of *p* cannot
causally interact with *p*. The "causal future" of *p*
consists of the points on and inside the future half of the light cone
(likewise, the causal past is picked out by the bottom half of the
lightcone). Note that because nothing can go faster than light, the
trajectory of any object will always remain within the lightcone of
each event along that trajectory:

We depict flat spacetime by keeping all the lightcones oriented in the same direction, as in the following figure.

The curvature of spacetime, then, will be depicted by the tilting of these lightcones. This reflects the fact that the causal structure of such spacetimes is different from that of flat spacetimes. So, for example, the spacetime around a massive body like a star will be depicted as follows.

We have a black hole when the curvature of spactime becomes so severe that, for some region, there is no path

*out*of that region that remains inside its own lightcones. That is, the causal structure of the spacetime is such that one cannot escape from that region without travelling faster than light. Such a region is by definition a black hole; the border of that region is the event horizon.