Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Nov 21, 2005

The term ‘sociobiology’ was introduced in E. O. Wilson's Sociobiology: The New Synthesis (1975) as the application of evolutionary theory to social behavior. Sociobiologists claim that many social behaviors have been shaped by natural selection for reproductive success, and they attempt to reconstruct the evolutionary histories of particular behaviors or behavioral strategies.

For example, evolutionary biologists have been long puzzled by cases of apparent altruism in certain animal societies: sterile workers in insect colonies, warning calls, resource sharing, and many others (see Darwin, 1859, pp. 235-242; 1871; 1872). Such behaviors appear to incur a cost to the cooperating or altruistic organisms, which would seem to make them impossible to evolve by natural selection. To explain the existence of altruism, sociobiologists first articulated the conditions under which altruistic behavior might be advantageous. In a series of theoretical papers in the 1960s and 70s, evolutionary biologists cleverly showed that natural selection would in fact favor behaviors that decrease the reproductive fitness of their actors, provided that close relatives sufficiently benefit (Hamilton, 1964; see also Trivers, 1974). Those models were later expanded to show how altruistic behaviors could evolve among unrelated organisms within social groups (Trivers, 1971; Hamilton, 1972; Maynard Smith, 1974). Further developments in the 1980s allowed evolutionary biologists to model more complex social dynamics (e.g., Axelrod and Hamilton, 1981; Maynard Smith, 1982; for a fuller treatment, see the entry on biological altruism). Sociobiologists then tested the explanatory adequacy of particular models for a given case by independently testing some of their parameter values and underlying assumptions.

As the above example demonstrates, sociobiologists are engaged in the construction and evaluation of theoretical models of evolutionary change and in the empirical testing of aspects of those models for particular cases. The result is an expansion of standard Darwinian evolutionary theory (which traditionally explains morphological adaptation) to a new domain: namely, animal sociality.

Sociobiology has been less successful in its application to human behavior than in its application to non-human systems. According to many critics of human sociobiology, standard sociobiological models are inadequate to account for human behavior, because they ignore the contributions of the mind and culture. A second criticism concerns genetic determinism, the view that many social behaviors are genetically fixed. Critics of sociobiology often complain that its reliance on genetic determinism, especially of human behavior, provides tacit approval of the status quo. If male aggression is genetically fixed and reproductively advantageous, critics argue, then male aggression seems to be a biological reality (and, perhaps, a biological ‘good’) about which we have little control. This seems to be both politically dangerous and scientifically implausible.

The question, then, is this: Is Darwinian theory an appropriate framework for understanding human sociality? Or ought we to adopt some kind of ‘disconnectionism,’ the view that human behavior is best studied apart from evolution? Advocates of sociobiology tend to see humans as just another species of animal and as part of nature, whereas its critics tend to envision humans as radically different from animals and as separate from nature. These competing conceptions of nature and of reason, morality, and culture obviously extend far beyond the ‘Sociobiology Wars’ (see, e.g., the entry on evolutionary epistemology), but the disagreements are especially acute here (see Holcomb, 1993).

This survey attempts to clarify and evaluate the aim of sociobiology to construct evolutionary explanations of human sociality. Given that a neutral account is impossible, this entry does the next best thing. It takes sociobiology as well as its critics seriously. On the one hand, by demonstrating that current studies of evolution and human behavior are based on Darwin's arguments for evolution (properly updated), we gain a strong rationale for thinking that something closer to sociobiology than to disconnectionism is needed to properly understand human sociality. Nevertheless, this survey reconstructs sociobiology in its best light, according to its aims. Consequently, criticism of sociobiology as it is actually practiced is not ignored or dismissed. This approach reveals what is best about sociobiology, while remaining sensitive to many of the problems it has generated.

1. Key Assumptions of Sociobiology

Sociobiology can be seen as the application of evolutionary theory to human behavior. Darwin's theory of evolution by natural selection explains adaptation, the functional ‘fit’ of organic form to its conditions of life, by linking differential adaptation to differential reproductive success. Traits less adapted to particular conditions of life will not persist in a population, because organisms with those traits will tend to have lower rates of survival and reproduction. Sociobiologists model the evolution of human behaviors in much the same way, using various ‘behavioral strategies’ as the relevant traits. However, in addition to the assumptions of standard evolutionary theory, sociobiology contributes several theoretical components of its own. For example, sociobiologists assume that humans, like other organisms, have behavioral control systems with particular functions whose evolutionary history can be individually traced. That assumption entails certain views about the modularity of cognitive, psychological, and neurophysiological systems. Other, more general commitments include the following:

In their crudest form, sociobiological explanations seem overly simplistic: Human behavior X exists because it maximizes biological fitness. Even within evolutionary biology, the relevant explanatory factors include far more than average fitness advantages. Such simplified explanations border on being unfalsifiable, as well, because one can imagine a fitness benefit for almost any behavior. Nevertheless, a more illuminating account of human behavior is possible when we distinguish between proximate and distal explanations for particular behaviors. Complicated processes involving the mind and culture are certainly involved in the ‘proximate’ causes of human behaviors, which likely have little to do with reproductive success (at least directly). Sociobiologists are instead interested in giving ‘ultimate’ explanations of why the relation between the behavior and the proximate factors exist.

To illustrate the difference between proximate and ultimate explanations, using a non-social behavior, consider the fact that there is a strong disposition among many people to prefer sweet foods. We say that sugar tastes sweet, because we have taste receptors for sweetness and this reinforces the behavior (a proximate explanation). However, we say that we seek foods that trigger our taste receptors, because our ancestors maximized their fitness by eating sweet fruits (an ultimate explanation). As a result, we are easy targets for fast food chains, which offer us foods with lots of sugar, salt, and fat—all of which were in short supply in ancestral environments, and so we inherited our ancestor's predispositions to eat them when available. Sociobiology aims to explain the function of behavior, not its proximate causes. The assumption is that many behaviors function to enhance reproductive success in the set of environments in which they evolved. To avoid being overly simplistic or unfalsifiable, sociobiological explanations must describe the explanandum precisely and connect its functional role to plausible evolutionary histories.

Consider another example, one sociobiologists have studied in more detail than the sweetness case. Why do humans have the sex-role stereotypes they do? Traditional social science assumed humans are born with no innate predispositions or mental contents. Sex differences in children's behavior were explained by the differential treatment of parents who held sex-role stereotypes. However, research has shown no clear causal link between these stereotypes, parental behavior, and ensuing child behavior.

Sociobiologists argued that innate behavioral differences in babies triggered the reaction by parents to treat boys one way and girls another way. They applied to humans the ‘Trivers-Willard hypothesis’ concerning animals: that females with low status and less access to resources tend to have more female offspring, and females with high status and more access to resources tend to have more male offspring (Trivers and Willard, 1973).

Valerie Grant (1990) combined the Trivers-Willard hypothesis with a different sex-role hypothesis that posits another proximate variable (maternal testosterone levels). In her model, a woman's physiology adjusts to her social status in a way that affects both the sex of her child and her parenting style. In terms of proximate mechanisms, Grant suggests (a) that socially dominant women produce more testosterone than others, (b) that their physiochemistry makes them more active, assertive, and independent that other women, and (c) that these behavioral differences in women affect the style they use in childbearing. In terms of ultimate mechanism for maximizing biological fitness, Grant suggests that boys gain higher fitness from the parenting style a dominant woman tends to use and girls gain higher fitness from the parenting style a subdominant woman tends to use (also see Mealey, 2000). Regardless of whether Grant's model survives empirical tests, the example demonstrates that sociobiologists attempt to integrate physiological, psychological, and evolutionary dimensions of behavioral phenomena by focusing on the ‘ultimate’ function of context-sensitive behavioral strategies.

Evaluations of the success of sociobiology do not depend merely on the content of the explanations. They also depend on the theoretical framework in which the explandum is conceived. Behavioral phenomena are explained only relative to a description, and the description of specific behaviors (especially human behaviors) is frequently contested. Nevertheless, the domain of behavioral phenomena that remains after traditional social science explains what it can is quite large. In particular, behaviors described in functional terms are left unexplained by traditional approaches. Functional descriptions of most human behavior, then, are legitimate subjects of sociobiological explanations. Moreover, if the Grant model is at all correct, sometimes sociobiological explanations can shed light on the cultural, physiological, and psychological ‘proximate’ causes of behavior, as well.

The preceding considerations are meant to legitimize sociobiology only in a limited way. They are meant to show that sociobiological explanations are at least potentially fruitful for understanding ourselves. Of course, showing that there can in principle be true sociobiological explanations does not at all show that any actual explanation is true. For that, we must consider the evidence. In the following section, we take up one example of sociobiological research to evaluate its empirical adequacy.

2. Sociobiological Research on Selfishness and Altruism

Given the preceding considerations, let us assume that there are some facts about human social behavior that can be explained by sociobiology. How are we to explain them?

In order to understand ‘genetic selfishness,’ we begin with a brief summary of the neo-Darwinian core of sociobiology's research program. Because that core has been popularized using the infamous ‘selfish gene’ metaphor, we identify the philosophical issues that metaphor raises. Then, we evaluate sociobiological models of sociopathy in which frequency-dependent natural selection maintains ‘Selfish Cheater’ behavioral strategies at low frequencies and ‘Unselfish Cooperator’ strategies at high frequencies. Reproductively altruistic behavior and reproductively selfish behavior each evolve by natural selection in different conditions, depending on the exact cost-benefit ratios and other factors. Because we are adapted to group-living, cooperation between two or more individuals for mutual benefit is normal behavior in most but not all social interactions, given the many opportunities for cheating to occur.

Cheating occurs when one person accepts help from another but does not reciprocate at all (gross cheating) or when one person accepts help from another but reciprocates less than the other (subtle cheating). Robert Trivers (1971) argued that because reciprocity may span many years and many interactions, computing cost-benefit ratios that keep reciprocity going requires a subtle and complex memory. To make the system of reciprocal altruism work, feelings and emotions—including guilt, fairness, moralistic aggression, gratitude, and sympathy—are part of the normal repertoire of human responses and are evoked in predictable situations (Crawford, 2004). For example, sociobiologists claim that we feel guilt when we are expected to reciprocate but cheat instead. Our sense of fairness is associated with extreme sensitivity to whether the social exchange balances benefits and costs to oneself and others in the right amounts. A group may bring sanctions and punishment against cheaters. We feel morally justified in aggression toward those who impose fitness costs on ourselves. We may feel gratitude when we are given a benefit by another party without having first donated a benefit to that party. Sympathy is expressed toward people who have been fooled by cheaters.

According to sociobiology, ‘normal’ people are reciprocal altruists in the appropriate circumstances, but they do feel temptations to cheat. However, some people adopt cheating as their primary strategy when they can get away with it. These two empirical generalizations are taken as brute facts in traditional social science, but they can be explained by a sociobiology of prosocial and antisocial behavior. The empirical work to be discussed here purports to explain in detail why a few people adopt antisocial behavioral strategies.

2.1. The Selfish Gene Metaphor

Sociopaths are by definition selfish people. The phenomena of selfish and altruistic behaviors are of special interest in clarifying the sociobiological research program, because one's first impression of how natural selection works is that it “helps those who help themselves.” Richard Dawkins (1976) introduced sociobiology with his infamous metaphor of ‘the selfish gene,’ which appeared to be a genetic gloss on ‘the selfish individual’ (see also Williams, 1966, for an early development of ‘genic selectionism’). This concept has continued to be a cornerstone of the field. Many took Dawkins to be explaining psychological selfishness by ‘genic’ selfishness. That is, many took Dawkins to argue that, if human behavior were connected to natural selection, we would all be selfish. Accordingly, both normal cooperators and selfish cheaters (e.g., sociopaths) would be ultimately ‘selfish’; they simply describe different strategies of acting selfishly to maximize one's own reproductive success in different sociocultural mileux. Moreover, critics such as Mary Midgley (1978) took Dawkins's view to involve viciously circular reasoning. In particular, they claim that he starts by taking a human behavior (altruism/selfishness), generalizing it to describe the genetic basis of the evolutionary process in all organisms, and then using that process to explain the original human behavior (genuine altruism/selfishness) as a special case.

Darwin's arguments for natural selection, however, do not characterize the evolutionary process itself as selfish or altruistic. Instead, he postulates traits that are functional for an individual, in the sense that adaptive traits are traits that help organisms solve problems imposed by limited resources. He provides a mechanism that explains the evolution of adaptive traits, namely, natural selection. It is false that “selection helps those individuals that help themselves.” Instead, selection increases the frequency of adaptive traits, traits that give their bearers an advantage in competition for reproductive success relative to other individuals. This advantage can occur through either altruistic traits (which help others but hinder oneself in performing tasks, especially self-destructive behaviors) or selfish traits (which help oneself but hinder others in performing tasks, especially behaviors destructive of others).

Even though the process of evolution by selection is not literally selfish or altruistic, the ‘selfish gene’ casts the process as selfish in a metaphorical sense, namely that in a reproductive competition the winning individuals or winning genes are those that out-compete others in solving adaptive problems. However, in a competition (such as the struggle for existence), performing the pertinent tasks better than one's competitors, and therefore winning, is not ‘selfish’ in a pejorative or immoral sense. It is only when a player cares only about winning at any cost to others that we call that person ‘selfish’ or ‘immoral.’ But that characterization applies to how someone plays a game, not to the nature of games, and it applies at the level of individual organisms, not the process of evolution by natural selection as a process of population change over time. Darwinian theory itself says nothing about which traits will evolve, i.e., nothing about whether animals or people are ‘selfish’ or ‘altruistic’ in various conditions in a psychological and morally-relevant sense of those terms. Hence, a goal of sociobiology is to show how genuine (psychological and morally-relevant) altruism and morality can and has evolved by natural selection.

A common misinterpretation is that sociobiology substitutes biological altruism for genuine altruism. To overcome this problem, one must distinguish the evolutionary concepts of ‘bio-altruism’ and ‘bio-selfishness’ from our pre-analytic concepts of ‘altruism’ and ‘selfishness.’ When this distinction is not made, the new theories “take the altruism out of altruism” and justify any behavior, no matter how immoral, on the grounds that it is just a way our genes make us act to gain reproductive success.

What morality is and why selection favors it are distinct. Thus, phrases such as “we are social manipulators when it is in our genetic interest to do so and we are honest social cooperators when it is in our genetic interest to do so” are misleading. ‘My genetic interests’ are not really ‘my interests.’ ‘My genetic interests’ is elliptical for talking about selection pressures that affect which alleles will increase in frequency in one's population in subsequent generations, whereas ‘my interests’ involves my own psychological states right here and now in my generation. In animal sociobiology, many studies identify situations in which honest signaling maximizes fitness and other situations in which deceptive signaling maximizes fitness. Both situations pervade human sociality.

The selfish gene metaphor, then, applies only to ‘genetic interests’ and should not be read as making substantive claims about the evolution of genuine altruism. We should keep this distinction in mind as we consider an example of sociobiological research using selfish gene metaphors.

2.2. A Sociobiological Explanation of Sociopathy

Why is sociopathy so widespread and why does it persist? We know that evolution explains biological altruism: We are nice to our children because of traditional Darwinian selection, nice to our mates because of sexual selection, nice to kin because of kin selection, nice to non-kin because of reciprocity, and so forth, in cases in which our ‘nice behaviors’ led in those situations to relative reproductive success.[1] There are many mathematical formulae that capture the cost-benefit analyses of the exact conditions in which altruism is favored or disfavored by selection. Given this kinder and gentler view of human nature, let's move to the big question: Why isn’t everybody nice and cooperative and caring about others, as our moral ideals would require? Evolution and individual development combine to yield low frequencies of people adopting a ‘Selfish Cheater’ strategy as follows:

Proximate explanations from behavioral genetics, child development, personality theory, learning theory, and social psychology describe a complex interaction of genetic and physiological risk factors with demographic and micro-environmental variables that predispose a portion of the population to chronic antisocial behavior. More recently, evolutionary and game theoretic models have tried to present an ultimate explanation of sociopathy as the expression of a frequency-dependent life-history strategy which is selected, in dynamic equilibrium, in response to certain varying environmental circumstances. This paper tries to integrate the proximate, developmental models with ultimate, evolutionary ones, suggesting that two developmentally different etiologies of sociopathy emerge from two different evolutionary mechanisms. Social strategies for minimizing the incidence of sociopathic behavior in modern society should consider the two different etiologies and the factors which contribute to them. (Mealey, 1995)

John Maynard Smith (1982) developed game-theoretic models which let fitness optima vary according to the behavior of other individuals (see the entry on evolutionary game theory). Recall that Darwin conceived of evolution as a game of organisms against their conditions of life. Because there are winners and losers according to the criterion of which ones survive to reproduce, each organism has a risk of death and risk of reproductive failure at each moment of its lifetime. Mealey's model is a game-theoretic model in which anti-social behavior exists alongside social behaviors as evolutionarily stable strategies (i.e., a strategy such that if fixed in the population, an invasion by a rival strategy will not displace it). In the metaphor of game theory, a ‘player’ is an organism, an ‘act’ is a behavior, a ‘tactic’ is a behavioral pattern, a ‘strategy’ is a lifestyle, and the ‘payoff’ of a strategy is the net effect of using the strategy on fitness (genes passed into subsequent generations).

Linda Mealey (1995) identified hypothetical ancestral conditions that would have rendered sociopathy adaptive, namely the conditions in which social reciprocity evolved in human populations; this is an ‘ultimate’ explanation of the behavior. She also identified mechanisms that might produce sociopathic behavior in current environments, namely mechanisms involving life-history strategies that span biological, psychological, and sociocultural variables; this is a ‘proximate’ explanation of the behavior. Mealey's explanation attempted to make sense of a huge literature on sociopathy. Her work exemplifies the main way sociobiological theories are tested, namely, to see whether they unify ‘large and independent classes of fact,’ to use Darwin's terms. Of course, the specific parameter values of sociobiological theories should be independently tested, insofar as that is possible. Anthropological data, for example, might shed light on social practices of ancestral human populations. Those data could then be used to test the plausibility of the hypothetical environments postulated by a sociobiological theory.

Just as cellular biologists examine pathology to understand normal function, understanding sociopathy should shed light, not only on the sources of anti-social behavior, but on normal social functioning as well. Sociopaths differ from the rest of us in that they adopt a cheater evolutionary strategy in relation to their ‘abnormal’ developmental pathway, whereas we adopt a cooperative evolutionary strategy in relation to our ‘normal’ developmental pathway.

Our detailed analysis of Mealey's explanation generalizes her method into one that can be applied to other topics, incorporating the sorts of explanatory factors critics objected were missing in early sociobiology. First, hypothesize the behavior's adaptive function. Second, identify the type of evolutionary model(s) relevant to the evolution of that behavior's adaptive function. Third, connect these models to the distinctive attributes of the behavior. Fourth, postulate one or more life-history strategies. Fifth, gather multi-disciplinary evidence. Mealy's method involves identifying the biological, psychological, and sociocultural factors of sociopathy, linking these factors, distinguishing causal links from correlations, and showing how different developmental pathways are found in two types of sociopaths (hence, the term ‘two-pathway model’ of sociopathy). This integration yields an ‘evolutionary biopsychosocial model.’ For further details, see the supplementary document:

Construction of Sociobiological Explanations.

3. Philosophical Implications of Sociobiological Models

Mealey's model has been evaluated by many commentators. Her two-pathway Cheater model of sociopathy has several interesting implications for issues that continually arise in evaluating sociobiology. The following remarks serve to identify these issues and go beyond the usual dichotomies. If one's prior assumption is that mind and culture make human behavior disconnected from our biology, then work that explains behavior in terms of its ultimate function (reproductive success) and proximate mechanisms (evolved psychological mechanisms that execute evolved strategies for reproductive success) will be viewed as irrational. This section attempts to clarify the competing assumptions of sociobiologists.

3.1. Biological Determinism

From its inception, human sociobiology has been confronted with the charge that it espouses biological determinism. Biological determinism states that virtually everything significant about the human condition is explained by biological factors alone. Whereas biological determinism expands the domain of phenomena to be explained to include everything about human behavior, sociobiology restricts the domain to nothing but facts about human evolution and behavior, i.e., evolutionarily significant facts. The lesson in method is that is more effective to attempt to explain a little with a lot than to attempt to explain a lot with a little. This lesson counsels us to abandon the ‘vaulting ambition’ of E. O. Wilson's sociobiology (Kitcher, 1985) and instead to undertake a more modest enterprise. Mealey's sociobiology of sociopathy exemplifies this more modest approach. Her ‘integrated causal model’ integrates evolutionary factors with proximate (local biological, psychological, sociocultural) conditions.

3.2. Evolutionary Significance of Behavior

Sociobiology studies the evolutionary significance of behavior; that is its limited domain. This specification of its domain gives its explanations of human behavior their power and their limits. It determines in what ways sociobiology is relevant or irrelevant to what we already think about human nature.

Given the immense time scale on which life on earth has changed, a behavior's evolutionary significance involves within-species and between-species similarities and differences. For example, ‘riding in a Cadillac’ is a behavior that lacks evolutionary significance. No other species rides in Cadillacs. Our ancestors did not ride in Cadillacs. ‘Riding in a Cadillac’ has no evolutionary past; hence, it is not subject to evolutionary explanation, except as something made possible by evolution in the same trivial sense in which everything we do is made possible by evolution. Yet our ancestors did use their mobility to exploit different environments, and differential mobility led to differential reproductive success, which in turn accounts for within-species and between-species similarities and differences. If we redescribe ‘riding in a Cadillac’ as ‘a form of enhanced mobility that confers increased ability to obtain resources and mates, thereby conferring high status,’ then the redescribed behavior does have an evolutionary past. The redescribed behavior has one rather than another particular sort of evolutionary significance according to this hypothesis, and ‘riding in a Cadillac’ now falls into the proper domain of evolutionary theory.

We are now in a position to answer an important question whose neglect has led to stalemate in the sociobiology debate: What is the import of evolutionary redescription for sociobiology? Critics are right that the behaviors they are thinking of—namely behaviors thought of in terms of cultural codes and individual decisions that put behaviors under descriptions disconnected from our evolutionary past—cannot be explained in evolutionary terms. Advocates are right that we should be able to explain evolutionary significant behaviors in evolutionary terms. Advocates are right that many human behaviors can be reconceptualized in ways that make their evolutionary significance explicit. Both traditional nonevolutionary approaches and sociobiological approaches to explaining human nature are legitimate and compatible, and so there is no need to endorse a disconnection between evolved strategies and human behavior in order to defend nonevolutionary approaches. A large source of needless debate is therefore eliminated once we realize that evolutionary explanation normally involves redescription, reclassification, and reconceptualization.

Thus, evolutionary explanations of behavior are theory-laden, i.e., the item to be studied and explained is reconceptualized using evolutionary theory. “We believe, however, that a consideration of the evolutionary significance of a behavior—the ancestral conditions that may have rendered it adaptive, the mechanisms that may have evolved to produce that behavior, and how those putatively evolved mechanisms may function in current environments—will often provide insights that cannot be provided by any other theory of behavior” (Crawford and Anderson, 1989, p. 1458). Mealey's study of sociopathy is a study of the evolutionary significance of sociopathy in just this sense.

The point of the two-pathway Cheater model is to integrate biological, psychological, and sociocultural factors and to organize them using an evolutionary approach. The model readily fits a key point about the nature-nurture controversy made by Mark Ridley (2004). Ridley identifies a host of nature-nurture connections from which he concludes that in the debate between the innatists and the environmentalists, the environmentalists won: Ridley's solution is that we are products of nurture, but “nurture works via nature.” Learning, socialization, enculturation and so forth are effective only because specific genes are expressed in direct or indirect response to events outside the body; every moment the pattern of genes being expressed in your brain changes. Genes extract information from the environment, constituting a mechanism of experience; ‘genes’ and ‘environment’ are not two mechanisms, but instead are components of one mechanism such that when the connections are changed by changing either the genes or the environment, the behavioral outcome differs.

All life histories are genetically ‘determined,’ but the degree of genetic influence varies from case to case according to its nexus of causal factors. Genes of primary sociopaths give them a potential for behavior in various environments that is relatively constant, despite variations in developmental and social environments. Genes of secondary sociopaths give them a potential for behavior in various environments that is relatively changeable in response to variations in developmental and social environments. In both sorts of sociopaths and in normal people, each behavior is a product of both genes and environment, but the two types differ in that the proximate mechanisms of behavior work differently. The other side of the story is that Ridley's examples can also be described using the opposite way of phrasing Ridley's solution to the nature-nurture debate: We are products of nature, but “nature works via nurture.” Thus, sociopaths are products of natural selection for a high frequency of Cooperators and a low frequency of Cheaters, but these evolved strategies work via proximate mechanisms involving different psychological, familial, social, and cultural conditions. The term ‘evolutionary biopsychosocial model’ is meant to encompass the life-history connection between specific components of nature and specific components of nurture that can be expressed teleologically either as ‘nature operates via nurture’ or ‘nurture operates via nature.’

4. Conclusion

Human sociobiology aims to understand the evolution of human sociality. Sociobiologists attempt to trace the evolutionary histories of particular behavioral strategies in terms of their functional roles in ancestral and current environments. The sociobiological research program faces extraordinary challenges, however. Chief among these is our ignorance of several crucial facts: the chronology of selective pressures in human ancestral and current environments, how particular strategies are activated and controlled, the possibility of radical transitions in human social organization, the relationship between biological evolution and cultural evolution, and many others. The result is a necessarily speculative explanatory structure. Nevertheless, it seems reasonable to believe that sociobiology offers a potentially illuminating framework for understanding human behavior, one that has already achieved important insights.


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