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Bertrand Russell

First published Thu Dec 7, 1995; substantive revision Mon Mar 29, 2010

Bertrand Arthur William Russell (b.1872 – d.1970) was a British philosopher, logician, essayist and social critic best known for his work in mathematical logic and analytic philosophy. His most influential contributions include his defense of logicism (the view that mathematics is in some important sense reducible to logic), his refining of the predicate calculus introduced by Gottlob Frege (which still forms the basis of most contemporary logic), his defense of neutral monism (the view that the world consists of just one type of substance that is neither exclusively mental nor exclusively physical), and his theories of definite descriptions and logical atomism. Along with G.E. Moore, Russell is generally recognized as one of the founders of modern analytic philosophy. Along with Kurt Gödel, he is regularly credited with being one of the most important logicians of the twentieth century.

Over the course of his long career, Russell made significant contributions, not just to logic and philosophy, but to a broad range of subjects including education, history, political theory and religious studies. In addition, many of his writings on a variety of topics in both the sciences and the humanities have influenced generations of general readers.

After a life marked by controversy—including dismissals from both Trinity College, Cambridge, and City College, New York—Russell was awarded the Order of Merit in 1949 and the Nobel Prize for Literature in 1950. Noted for his many spirited anti-war and anti-nuclear protests, Russell remained a prominent public figure until his death at the age of 97.

Interested readers may also wish to listen to two sound clips of Russell speaking.

1. A Chronology of Russell's Life

A short chronology of the major events in Russell's life is as follows:

As A.J. Ayer writes (1972, 127), “The popular conception of a philosopher as one who combines universal learning with the direction of human conduct was more nearly satisfied by Bertrand Russell than by any other philosopher of our time,” and as W.V. Quine tells us (1966c, 657), “I think many of us were drawn to our profession by Russell's books. He wrote a spectrum of books for a graduated public, layman to specialist. We were beguiled by the wit and a sense of new-found clarity with respect to central traits of reality.” Even so, perhaps the most memorable summing up of Russell's life comes from Russell himself:

Three passions, simple but overwhelmingly strong, have governed my life: the longing for love, the search for knowledge, and unbearable pity for the suffering of mankind. These passions, like great winds, have blown me hither and thither, in a wayward course, over a deep ocean of anguish, reaching to the very verge of despair. … This has been my life. I have found it worth living, and would gladly live it again if the chance were offered me. (1967, I, 3–4)

For further information about Russell's life, readers are encouraged to consult Russell's four autobiographical volumes, My Philosophical Development (London: George Allen and Unwin, 1959) and The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell (3 vols, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1967, 1968, 1969). In addition, John Slater's accessible and informative Bertrand Russell (Bristol: Thoemmes, 1994) gives a helpful and accessible short introduction to Russell's life, work and influence. Other sources of biographical information include Ronald Clark's The Life of Bertrand Russell (London: Jonathan Cape, 1975), Ray Monk's Bertrand Russell: The Spirit of Solitude (London: Jonathan Cape, 1996) and Bertrand Russell: The Ghost of Madness (London: Jonathan Cape, 2000), as well as the first volume of A.D. Irvine's Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments (London: Routledge, 1999).

Over the years, Russell has also been the subject of numerous other works, including Bruce Duffy's novel The World as I Found It (New York: Ticknor & Fields, 1987) and the graphic novel by Apostolos Doxiadis and Christos Papadimitriou, Logicomix: An Epic Search for Truth (New York: St Martin's Press, 2009).

For a chronology of Russell's major publications, readers are encouraged to consult the Primary Literature: Russell's Writings section of the Bibliography below. For a more complete list, see A Bibliography of Bertrand Russell (3 vols, London: Routledge, 1994), by Kenneth Blackwell and Harry Ruja. A less detailed, but still comprehensive, list appears in Paul Arthur Schilpp, The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, 3rd edn (New York: Harper and Row, 1963), pp. 746–803. For a bibliography of the secondary literature surrounding Russell up to the close of the twentieth century, see A.D. Irvine, Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments, Vol. 1 (London: Routledge, 1999), pp. 247–312.

2. Russell's Work in Logic

Russell's main contributions to logic and the foundations of mathematics include his discovery of Russell's paradox, his defense of logicism (the view that mathematics is, in some significant sense, reducible to formal logic), his development of the theory of types, his impressively general theory of logical relations, his formalization of the reals, and his refining of the first-order predicate calculus.

Russell discovered the paradox that bears his name in 1901, while working on his Principles of Mathematics (1903). The paradox arises in connection with the set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Such a set, if it exists, will be a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself. The paradox is significant since, using classical logic, all sentences are entailed by a contradiction. Russell's discovery thus prompted a large amount of work in logic, set theory, and the philosophy and foundations of mathematics.

Russell's response to the paradox came with the development of his theory of types between 1903 and 1908. It was clear to Russell that some form of restriction needed to be placed on the original comprehension (or abstraction) axiom of naive set theory, the axiom that formalizes the intuition that any coherent condition or property may be used to determine a set (or class). Russell's basic idea was that reference to sets such as the set of all sets that are not members of themselves could be avoided by arranging all sentences into a hierarchy, beginning with sentences about individuals at the lowest level, sentences about sets of individuals at the next lowest level, sentences about sets of sets of individuals at the next lowest level, and so on. Using a vicious circle principle similar to that adopted by the mathematician Henri Poincaré, together with his own so-called “no class” theory of classes, Russell was able to explain why the unrestricted comprehension axiom fails: propositional functions, such as the function “x is a set,” may not be applied to themselves since self-application would involve a vicious circle. On Russell's view, all objects for which a given condition (or predicate) holds must be at the same level or of the same “type.” Sentences about these objects will then always be higher in the hierarchy than the objects themselves.

Although first introduced in 1903, the theory of types was further developed by Russell in his 1908 article “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types” and in the three-volume work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). Thus the theory admits of two versions, the “simple theory” of 1903 and the “ramified theory” of 1908. Both versions of the theory came under attack: the simple theory for being too weak, and the ramified theory for being too strong. For some, it was important that any proposed solution be comprehensive enough to resolve all known paradoxes at once.[1] For others, it was important that any proposed solution not disallow those parts of classical mathematics that remained consistent, even though they appeared to violate the vicious circle principle.

Russell himself had recognized many of these weaknesses, noting as early as 1903 that it was unlikely that any single solution would resolve all of the known paradoxes. Together with Whitehead, he was also able to introduce a new axiom, the axiom of reducibility, which lessened the vicious circle principle's scope of application and so resolved many of the most worrisome aspects of type theory. Even so, some critics claimed that the axiom was too ad hoc to be justified philosophically.

Of equal significance during this period was Russell's defense of logicism, the theory that mathematics is in some important sense reducible to logic. First defended in his 1901 article “Recent Work on the Principles of Mathematics,” and then later in greater detail in his Principles of Mathematics and in Principia Mathematica, Russell's logicism consisted of two main theses. The first was that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of the vocabulary of logic. The second was that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of the theorems of logic.

Like Gottlob Frege, Russell's basic idea for defending logicism was that numbers may be identified with classes of classes and that number-theoretic statements may be explained in terms of quantifiers and identity. Thus the number 1 would be identified with the class of all unit classes, the number 2 with the class of all two-membered classes, and so on. Statements such as “There are at least two books” would be recast as statements such as “There is a book, x, and there is a book, y, and x is not identical to y.” Statements such as “There are exactly two books” would be recast as “There is a book, x, and there is a book, y, and x is not identical to y, and if there is a book, z, then z is identical to either x or y.” It followed that number-theoretic operations could be explained in terms of set-theoretic operations such as intersection, union, and difference. In Principia Mathematica, Whitehead and Russell were able to provide many detailed derivations of major theorems in set theory, finite and transfinite arithmetic, and elementary measure theory. A fourth volume on geometry was planned but never completed.

Russell's most important writings relating to these topics include not only Principles of Mathematics (1903), “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types” (1908), and Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913), but also his earlier An Essay on the Foundations of Geometry (1897), and his Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy (1919a), the last of which was largely written while Russell was serving time in Brixton Prison as a result of his anti-war activities. Coincidentally, it was at roughly this same time (1918–19) that Wittgenstein was completing his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus while being detained as a prisoner of war at Monte Cassino during World War I.

3. Russell's Work in Analytic Philosophy

In much the same way that Russell used logic in an attempt to clarify issues in the foundations of mathematics, he also used logic in an attempt to clarify issues in philosophy. As one of the founders of analytic philosophy, Russell made significant contributions to a wide variety of areas, including metaphysics, epistemology, ethics and political theory. According to Russell, it is the philosopher's job to discover a logically ideal language — a language that will exhibit the true nature of the world in such a way that we will not be misled by the accidental surface structure of natural language. Just as atomic facts (the association of universals with an appropriate number of individuals) may be combined into molecular facts in the world itself, such a language would allow for the description of such combinations using logical connectives such as “and” and “or.” In addition to atomic and molecular facts, Russell also held that general facts (facts about “all” of something) were needed to complete the picture of the world. Famously, he vacillated on whether negative facts were also required.

The reason Russell believes that many ordinarily accepted statements may be open to doubt is that they appear to refer to entities that are known only inferentially. Thus, underlying Russell's various projects was not only Russell's use of logical analysis, but also his long-standing aim of discovering whether, and to what extent, knowledge is possible. “There is one great question,” he writes in 1911. “Can human beings know anything, and if so, what and how? This question is really the most essentially philosophical of all questions” (quoted in Slater 1994, 67).

Motivating this question was the traditional problem of the external world. If our knowledge of the external world comes through inference to the best explanation, and if such inferences are always fallible, what guarantee do we have that our beliefs are reliable? Russell's response was partly metaphysical and partly epistemological. On the metaphysical side, Russell developed his famous theory of logical atomism, in which the world is said to consist of a complex of logical atoms (such as “little patches of colour”) and their properties. Together these atoms and their properties form the atomic facts which, in turn, are combined to form logically complex objects. What we normally take to be inferred entities (for example, enduring physical objects) are then understood to be logical constructions formed from the immediately given entities of sensation, viz., “sensibilia.”

On the epistemological side, Russell argued that it was also important to show that each questionable entity may be reduced to, or defined in terms of, another entity (or class of entities) whose existence is more certain. For example, on this view, an ordinary physical object that normally might be believed to be known only through inference may be defined instead

as a certain series of appearances, connected with each other by continuity and by certain causal laws. ... More generally, a ‘thing’ will be defined as a certain series of aspects, namely those which would commonly be said to be of the thing. To say that a certain aspect is an aspect of a certain thing will merely mean that it is one of those which, taken serially, are the thing. (1914a, 106–107)

The reason we are able to do this is that

our world is not wholly a matter of inference. There are things that we know without asking the opinion of men of science. If you are too hot or too cold, you can be perfectly aware of this fact without asking the physicist what heat and cold consist of. … We may give the name ‘data’ to all the things of which we are aware without inference (1959, 23).

We can then use these data (or sensibilia or sense data) with which we are directly acquainted to construct the relevant objects of knowledge. Similarly, numbers may be reduced to collections of classes, points and instants may be reduced to ordered classes of volumes and events, and classes themselves may be reduced to propositional functions.

It is with these kinds of examples in mind that Russell suggests that we adopt what he calls “the supreme maxim in scientific philosophizing”, namely the principle that “Whenever possible, logical constructions”, or as he also sometimes puts it, logical fictions, “are to be substituted for inferred entities” (1914c, 155; cf. 1914a, 107, and 1924, 326). Anything that resists construction in this sense may be said to be an ontological atom. Such objects are atomic, both in the sense that they fail to be composed of individual, substantial parts, and in the sense that they exist independently of one another. Their corresponding propositions are also atomic, both in the sense that they contain no other propositions as parts, and in the sense that the members of any pair of true atomic propositions will be logically independent of one another. It turns out that formal logic, if carefully developed, will mirror precisely, not only the various relations between all such propositions, but their various internal structures as well.

It is in this context that Russell also introduces his famous distinction between two kinds of knowledge of truths: that which is direct, intuitive, certain and infallible, and that which is indirect, derivative, uncertain and open to error (see 1905, 41f; 1911, 1912, and 1914b). To be justified, every indirect knowledge claim must be capable of being derived from more fundamental, direct or intuitive knowledge claims. The kinds of truths that are capable of being known directly include both truths about immediate facts of sensation and truths of logic.[2]

Eventually, Russell supplemented this distinction between direct and indirect knowledge with his famous distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. As Russell explains, “I say that I am acquainted with an object when I have a direct cognitive relation to that object, i.e. when I am directly aware of the object itself. When I speak of a cognitive relation here, I do not mean the sort of relation which constitutes judgment, but the sort which constitutes presentation” (1911, 209). Later, he clarifies this point by adding that acquaintance involves, not knowledge of truths, but knowledge of things (1912a, 44). Thus, while intuitive knowledge and derivative knowledge both involve knowledge of propositions (or truths), knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description both involve knowledge of objects (or things).[3] Since it is those objects with which we have direct acquaintance that are the least questionable members of our ontology, it is these objects upon which Russell ultimately bases his epistemology.

Russell's contributions to metaphysics and epistemology were also unified by his views concerning the centrality of both scientific knowledge in general and the importance of there being an underlying scientific methodology that in large part is common to both philosophy and the scientific disciplines. In the case of philosophy, this methodology expressed itself through Russell's use of logical analysis. In fact, Russell often claimed that he had more confidence in his methodology than in any particular philosophical conclusion.

This broad conception of philosophy arose in part from Russell's idealist origins (see, e.g., Griffin 1991 and Hylton 1990a). This is so, even though Russell tells us that his one, true revolution in philosophy came about as a result of his break from idealism. Russell saw that the idealist doctrine of internal relations led to a series of contradictions regarding asymmetrical (and other) relations necessary for mathematics. Thus, in 1898, he abandoned the idealism that he had encountered as a student at Cambridge, together with his Kantian methodology, in favour of a pluralistic realism. As a result, he soon became famous as an advocate of the “new realism” and for his “new philosophy of logic,” emphasizing as he did the importance of modern logic for philosophical analysis. The underlying themes of this “revolution” included his belief in pluralism, his emphasis upon anti-psychologism, and his belief in the importance of science. Each of these themes remained central to Russell's philosophy for the remainder of his life (see, e.g., Hager 1994 and Weitz 1944).

4. Russell's Theory of Definite Descriptions

Russell's philosophical methodology required the making and testing of hypotheses through the weighing of evidence. Hence Russell's comment that he wished to emphasize the “scientific method” in philosophy (see, e.g., Irvine 1989). It also required the rigorous analysis of problematic propositions using the machinery of first-order logic. It was Russell's belief that by using the new logic of his day, philosophers would be able to exhibit the underlying “logical form” of natural-language statements. A statement's logical form, in turn, would help philosophers resolve problems of reference associated with the ambiguity and vagueness of natural language.

Thus, just as we distinguish three separate sense of “is” (the is of predication, the is of identity, and the is of existence) and exhibit these three senses using three separate logical notations (Px, x=y, and ∃x respectively) we will also discover other ontologically significant distinctions by being made aware of a sentence's correct logical form. On Russell's view, the subject matter of philosophy is then distinguished from that of the sciences only by the generality and the a prioricity of philosophical statements, not by the underlying methodology of the discipline. In philosophy, just as in mathematics, Russell believed that it was by applying logical machinery and insights that advances in analysis would be made.

Russell's most famous example of his “analytic method” concerns denoting phrases such as descriptions and proper names. In his Principles of Mathematics, Russell had adopted the view that every denoting phrase (for example, “Scott,” “the author of Waverley,” “the number two,” “the golden mountain”) denoted, or referred to, an existing entity. By the time his landmark article, “On Denoting,” appeared two years later in 1905, Russell had modified this extreme realism and had instead become convinced that denoting phrases need not possess a theoretical unity.

While logically proper names (words such as “this” or “that” which refer to sensations of which an agent is immediately aware) do have referents associated with them, descriptive phrases (such as “the smallest number less than pi”) should be viewed as a collection of quantifiers (such as “all” and “some”) and propositional functions (such as “x is a number”). As such, they are not to be viewed as referring terms but, rather, as “incomplete symbols.” In other words, they should be viewed as symbols that take on meaning within appropriate contexts, but that are meaningless in isolation.

If Russell is correct, it follows that in the sentence

(1) The present King of France is bald,

the definite description “The present King of France” plays a role quite different from that of a proper name such as “Scott” in the sentence

(2) Scott is bald.

Letting K abbreviate the predicate “is a present King of France” and B abbreviate the predicate “is bald,” Russell assigns sentence (1) the logical form

(1′) There is an x such that
  1. Kx,
  2. for any y, if Ky then y=x, and
  3. Bx.

Alternatively, in the notation of the predicate calculus, we have

(1″) ∃x[(Kx & ∀y(Kyy=x)) & Bx].

In contrast, by allowing s to abbreviate the name “Scott,” Russell assigns sentence (2) the very different logical form

(2′) Bs.

This distinction between logical forms allows Russell to explain three important puzzles. The first concerns the operation of the Law of Excluded Middle and how this law relates to denoting terms. According to one reading of the Law of Excluded Middle, it must be the case that either “The present King of France is bald” is true or “The present King of France is not bald” is true. But if so, both sentences appear to entail the existence of a present King of France, clearly an undesirable result. Russell's analysis shows how this conclusion can be avoided. By appealing to analysis (1′), it follows that there is a way to deny (1) without being committed to the existence of a present King of France, namely by accepting that “It is not the case that there exists a present King of France who is bald” is true.

The second puzzle concerns the Law of Identity as it operates in (so-called) opaque contexts. Even though “Scott is the author of Waverley” is true, it does not follow that the two referring terms “Scott” and “the author of Waverley” need be interchangeable in every situation. Thus, although “George IV wanted to know whether Scott was the author of Waverley” is true, “George IV wanted to know whether Scott was Scott” is, presumably, false. Russell's distinction between the logical forms associated with the use of proper names and definite descriptions shows why this is so.

To see this we once again let s abbreviate the name “Scott.” We also let w abbreviate “Waverley” and A abbreviate the two-place predicate “is the author of.” It then follows that the sentence

(3) s=s

is not at all equivalent to the sentence

(4) ∃x[Axw & ∀y(Aywy=x) & x=s].

Sentence (3), for example, is clearly a necessary truth, while sentence (4) is not.

The third puzzle relates to true negative existential claims, such as the claim “The golden mountain does not exist.” Here, once again, by treating definite descriptions as having a logical form distinct from that of proper names, Russell is able to give an account of how a speaker may be committed to the truth of a negative existential without also being committed to the belief that the subject term has reference. That is, the claim that Scott does not exist is false since

(5) ~∃x(x=s)

is self-contradictory. (After all, there must exist at least one thing that is identical to s since it is a logical truth that s is identical to itself!) In contrast, the claim that a golden mountain does not exist may be true since, assuming that G abbreviates the predicate “is golden” and M abbreviates the predicate “is a mountain,” there is nothing contradictory about

(6) ~∃x(Gx & Mx).

5. Russell's Neutral Monism

One final major contribution to philosophy was Russell's defence of neutral monism, the view that the world consists of just one type of substance that is neither exclusively mental nor exclusively physical. Like idealism (the view that there exists nothing but the mental) and physicalism (the view that there exists nothing but the physical), neutral monism rejects dualism (the view that there exist distinct mental and physical substances). However, unlike both idealism and physicalism, neutral monism holds that this single existing substance may be viewed in some contexts as being mental and in others as being physical. As Russell puts it,

“Neutral monism”—as opposed to idealistic monism and materialistic monism—is the theory that the things commonly regarded as mental and the things commonly regarded as physical do not differ in respect of any intrinsic property possessed by the one set and not by the other, but differ only in respect of arrangement and context. (CP, Vol. 7, 15)

To help understand this general suggestion, Russell introduces the analogy of a postal directory:

The theory may be illustrated by comparison with a postal directory, in which the same names comes twice over, once in alphabetical and once in geographical order; we may compare the alphabetical order to the mental, and the geographical order to the physical. The affinities of a given thing are quite different in the two orders, and its causes and effects obey different laws. Two objects may be connected in the mental world by the association of ideas, and in the physical world by the law of gravitation. … Just as every man in the directory has two kinds of neighbours, namely alphabetical neighbours and geographical neighbours, so every object will lie at the intersection of two causal series with different laws, namely the mental series and the physical series. ‘Thoughts’ are not different in substance from ‘things’; the stream of my thoughts is a stream of things, namely of the things which I should commonly be said to be thinking of; what leads to its being called a stream of thoughts is merely that the laws of succession are different from the physical laws. (CP, Vol. 7, 15)

In other words, when viewed as being mental, a thought or idea may have associated with it other thoughts or ideas that seem related even though, when viewed as being physical, they have very little in common. As Russell explains, “In my mind, Caesar may call up Charlemagne, whereas in the physical world the two were widely sundered” (CP, Vol. 7, 15). Even so, it is a mistake, on this view, to postulate two distinct types of thing (the idea of Caesar, and the man Caesar) that are composed to two distinct substances (the mental and the physical). Instead, “The whole duality of mind and matter, according to this theory, is a mistake; there is only one kind of stuff out of which the world is made, and this stuff is called mental in one arrangement, physical in the other” (CP, Vol. 7, 15).

Russell appears to have developed this theory around 1913, while he was working on his Theory of Knowledge manuscript, and on his 1914 Monist article, “On the Nature of Acquaintance.” Decades later, in 1964, he remarked that “I am not conscious of any serious change in my philosophy since I adopted neutral monism” (Eames 1967, 511).

Russell's most important writings relating to these topics include “On Denoting” (1905), “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description” (1910a), “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism” (1918, 1919), “Logical Atomism” (1924), The Analysis of Mind (1921), The Analysis of Matter (1927a), and Theory of Knowledge (CP, Vol. 7).

6. Russell's Social and Political Philosophy

Russell's social influence stems from three main sources: his long-standing social activism, his many writings on the social and political issues of his day, and his popularizations of numerous technical writings in philosophy and the natural sciences.

Among Russell's many popularizations are his two best-selling works, The Problems of Philosophy (1912) and A History of Western Philosophy (1945). Both of these books, as well as his numerous books popularizing science, have done much to educate and inform generations of general readers. Naturally enough, Russell saw a link between education, in this broad sense, and social progress. As he put it, “Education is the key to the new world” (1926, 83). Partly this is due to our need to understand nature, but equally important is our need to understand each other:

The thing, above all, that a teacher should endeavor to produce in his pupils, if democracy is to survive, is the kind of tolerance that springs from an endeavor to understand those who are different from ourselves. It is perhaps a natural human impulse to view with horror and disgust all manners and customs different from those to which we are used. Ants and savages put strangers to death. And those who have never traveled either physically or mentally find it difficult to tolerate the queer ways and outlandish beliefs of other nations and other times, other sects and other political parties. This kind of ignorant intolerance is the antithesis of a civilized outlook, and is one of the gravest dangers to which our overcrowded world is exposed. (1950, 121)

At the same time, Russell is also famous for suggesting that a widespread reliance upon evidence, rather than upon superstition, would have enormous social consequences: “I wish to propose for the reader's favourable consideration,” says Russell, “a doctrine which may, I fear, appear wildly paradoxical and subversive. The doctrine in question is this: that it is undesirable to believe a proposition when there is no ground whatever for supposing it true” (A1928, 11).

Still, Russell is best known in many circles as a result of his campaigns against the proliferation of nuclear weapons and against western involvement in the Vietnam War during the 1960s. However, Russell's social activism stretches back at least as far as 1910, when he published his Anti-Suffragist Anxieties, and to 1916, when he was convicted and fined in connection with anti-war protests during World War I. Because of his conviction, he was dismissed from his post at Trinity College, Cambridge. Two years later, he was convicted a second time. The result was six months in prison (see, e.g., Hardy 1942). Russell also ran unsuccessfully for Parliament (in 1907, 1922, and 1923) and, together with his second wife, founded and operated an experimental school during the late 1920s and early 1930s (see, e.g., Russell 1926).

Although he became the third Earl Russell upon the death of his brother in 1931, Russell's radicalism continued to make him a controversial figure well through middle-age. While teaching in the United States in the late 1930s, he was offered a teaching appointment at City College, New York. The appointment was revoked following a large number of public protests and a 1940 judicial decision which found him morally unfit to teach at the College (see, e.g., Dewey and Kallen 1941).

In 1954 he delivered his famous “Man's Peril” broadcast on the BBC, condemning the Bikini H-bomb tests. A year later, together with Albert Einstein, he released the Russell-Einstein Manifesto calling for the curtailment of nuclear weapons. In 1957 he was a prime organizer of the first Pugwash Conference, which brought together a large number of scientists concerned about the nuclear issue. He became the founding president of the Campaign for Nuclear Disarmament in 1958 and was once again imprisoned, this time in connection with anti-nuclear protests in 1961. The media coverage surrounding his conviction only served to enhance Russell's reputation and to further inspire the many idealistic youths who were sympathetic to his anti-war and anti-nuclear protests.

During these controversial years Russell also wrote many of the books that brought him to the attention of popular audiences. These include his Principles of Social Reconstruction (1916), A Free Man's Worship (1923), On Education (1926), Why I Am Not a Christian (1927c), Marriage and Morals (1929), The Conquest of Happiness (1930), The Scientific Outlook (1931), and Power: A New Social Analysis (1938).

Upon being awarded the Nobel Prize for Literature in 1950, Russell used his acceptance speech to emphasize, once again, themes related to his social activism.


Primary Literature: Russell's Writings

A Selection of Russell's Books and Articles

Major Anthologies of Russell's Writings

The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell

The Bertrand Russell Editorial Project is currently in the process of publishing Russell's Collected Papers (CP). When complete, these volumes will bring together all of Russell's writings, excluding his correspondence and previously published monographs.

In Print
Planned and Forthcoming

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | Gödel, Kurt | knowledge: by acquaintance vs. description | logic: classical | logical atomism: Russell's | logical constructions | logicism and neologicism | mathematics, philosophy of | Moore, George Edward | neutral monism | Principia Mathematica | propositional function | Russell, Bertrand: moral philosophy | Russell's paradox | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North | Wittgenstein, Ludwig