Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Russell's Paradox

1. Exactly when the discovery of the paradox took place is not completely clear. Russell initially states that he came across the paradox “in June 1901” (see Russell (1944), p. 13). Later he reports that the discovery took place “in the spring of 1901” (see Russell (1959), p. 58). Later still he reports that he came across the paradox, not in June, but in May of that year (see Russell (1967, 1968, 1969), vol. 3, p. 221).

2. See Frege (1903), p. 127.

3. It is worth noting that, even prior to Russell's discovery, this principle had not been universally accepted. Georg Cantor, for example, rejected it in favour of what was, in effect, a distinction between sets and classes, recognizing that some properties (such as the property of being an ordinal) produced collections that were too large to be sets, and that an assumption to the contrary would lead to inconsistency. For further details see Menzel (1984), Moore (1982), and Hallett (1984).

4. One exception is paraconsistent set theory. Paraconsistent set theory retains an unrestricted comprehension axiom but abandons classical logic, substituting a paraconsistent logic in its place. For further information, see the entries on inconsistent mathematics and paraconsistent logic in this Encyclopedia.