# Russell's Paradox

*First published Fri Dec 8, 1995; substantive revision Wed May 27, 2009*

Russell's paradox is the most famous of the logical or set-theoretical paradoxes. The paradox arises within naive set theory by considering the set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Such a set appears to be a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself, hence the paradox.

Some sets, such as the set of all teacups, are not members of
themselves. Other sets, such as the set of all non-teacups, are
members of themselves. Call the set of all sets that are not members
of themselves “*R*.” If *R* is a member of itself, then
by definition it must not be a member of itself. Similarly, if
*R* is not a member of itself, then by definition it must be a
member of itself. Discovered by
Bertrand Russell
in 1901, the paradox has prompted much work in logic, set theory and
the philosophy and foundations of mathematics.

- History of the paradox
- Significance of the paradox
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## History of the paradox

Russell appears to have discovered his paradox in the late spring of
1901,^{[1]}
while working on his Principles of Mathematics
(1903). Cesare Burali-Forti, an assistant to Giuseppe Peano, had
discovered a similar antinomy in 1897 when he noticed that since the
set of ordinals is well-ordered, it too must have an ordinal. However,
this ordinal must be both an element of the set of all ordinals and
yet greater than every such element. Unlike Burali-Forti's paradox,
Russell's paradox does not involve either ordinals or cardinals,
relying instead only on the primitive notion of set.

Russell wrote to
Gottlob Frege
with news of his paradox on June 16, 1902. The paradox was of
significance to Frege's logical work since, in effect, it showed that
the axioms Frege was using to formalize his logic were
inconsistent. Specifically, Frege's Rule V, which states that two sets
are equal if and only if their corresponding functions coincide in
values for all possible arguments, requires that an expression such as
*f(x)* be considered both a function of the argument *x*
and a function of the argument *f.* In effect, it was this
ambiguity that allowed Russell to construct *R* in such a way
that it could both be and not be a member of itself.

Russell's letter arrived just as the second volume of Frege's
Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (The Basic Laws of
Arithmetic, 1893, 1903) was in press. Immediately appreciating
the difficulty the paradox posed, Frege added to the
Grundgesetze a hastily composed appendix discussing
Russell's discovery. In the appendix Frege observes that the
consequences of Russell's paradox are not immediately clear. For
example, “Is it always permissible to speak of the extension of a
concept, of a class? And if not, how do we recognize the exceptional
cases? Can we always infer from the extension of one concept's
coinciding with that of a second, that every object which falls under
the first concept also falls under the second? These are the
questions,” Frege notes, “raised by Mr Russell's
communication.”^{[2]}
Because of these worries, Frege eventually felt forced to abandon
many of his views about logic and mathematics.

Of course, Russell also was concerned about the contradiction. Upon learning that Frege agreed with him about the significance of the result, he immediately began writing an appendix for his own soon-to-be-released Principles of Mathematics. Entitled “Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types,” the appendix represents Russell's first detailed attempt at providing a principled method for avoiding what was soon to become known as “Russell's paradox.”

## Significance of the paradox

The significance of Russell's paradox can be seen once it is
realized that, using classical logic, all sentences follow from a
contradiction. For example, assuming both *P* and ~*P,*
any arbitrary proposition, *Q*, can be proved as follows: from
*P* we obtain *P*
∨
*Q* by the rule of Addition; then from *P*
∨
*Q* and ~*P* we obtain *Q* by the rule of
Disjunctive Syllogism. Because of this, and because set theory
underlies all branches of mathematics, many people began to worry
that, if set theory was inconsistent, no mathematical proof could be
trusted completely.

Russell's paradox ultimately stems from the idea that any coherent
condition may be used to determine a set. As a result, most attempts
at resolving the paradox have concentrated on various ways of
restricting the principles governing set existence found within naive
set theory, particularly the so-called Comprehension (or Abstraction)
axiom. This axiom in effect states that any propositional function,
*P(x)*, containing *x* as a free variable can be used to
determine a set. In other words, corresponding to every propositional
function, *P(x)*, there will exist a set whose members are
exactly those things, *x*, that have property
*P*.^{[3]}
It is now generally, although not universally, agreed that such an
axiom must either be abandoned or
modified.^{[4]}

Russell's own response to the paradox was his aptly named *theory
of types.* Recognizing that self-reference lies at the heart of
the paradox, Russell's basic idea is that we can avoid commitment to
*R* (the set of all sets that are not members of themselves) by
arranging all sentences (or, equivalently, all propositional
functions) into a hierarchy. The lowest level of this hierarchy will
consist of sentences about individuals. The next lowest level will
consist of sentences about sets of individuals. The next lowest level
will consist of sentences about sets of sets of individuals, and so
on. It is then possible to refer to all objects for which a given
condition (or predicate) holds only if they are all at the same level
or of the same “type.”

This solution to Russell's paradox is motivated in large part by the
so-called *vicious circle principle*, a principle which, in
effect, states that no propositional function can be defined prior to
specifying the function's scope of application. In other words, before
a function can be defined, one must first specify exactly those
objects to which the function will apply (the function's domain). For
example, before defining the predicate “is a prime
number,” one first needs to define the collection of objects
that might possibly satisfy the predicate, namely the set, *N*,
of natural numbers.

As Russell explains,

An analysis of the paradoxes to be avoided shows that they all result from a kind of vicious circle. The vicious circles in question arise from supposing that a collection of objects may contain members which can only be defined by means of the collection as a whole. Thus, for example, the collection ofpropositionswill be supposed to contain a proposition stating that “all propositions are either true or false.” It would seem, however, that such a statement could not be legitimate unless “all propositions” referred to some already definite collection, which it cannot do if new propositions are created by statements about “all propositions.” We shall, therefore, have to say that statements about “all propositions” are meaningless.… The principle which enables us to avoid illegitimate totalities may be stated as follows: “Whatever involvesallof a collection must not be one of the collection”; or, conversely: “If, provided a certain collection had a total, it would have members only definable in terms of that total, then the said collection has no total.” We shall call this the “vicious-circle principle,” because it enables us to avoid the vicious circles involved in the assumption of illegitimate totalities. (Whitehead and Russell 1910, 37)

From this it follows that no function's scope of application will ever be able to include any object defined in terms of the function itself. As a result, propositional functions (along with their corresponding propositions) will end up being arranged in a hierarchy of exactly the kind Russell proposes.

Although Russell first introduced his theory of types in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics, type theory found its mature expression five years later in his 1908 article, “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” and in the monumental work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). Russell's type theory thus appears in two versions: the “simple theory” of 1903 and the “ramified theory” of 1908. Both versions have been criticized for being too ad hoc to eliminate the paradox successfully. In addition, even if type theory is successful in eliminating Russell's paradox, it is likely to be ineffective at resolving other, unrelated paradoxes.

Other responses to Russell's paradox have included those of David Hilbert and the formalists (whose basic idea was to allow the use of only finite, well-defined and constructible objects, together with rules of inference deemed to be absolutely certain), and of Luitzen Brouwer and the intuitionists (whose basic idea was that one cannot assert the existence of a mathematical object unless one can also indicate how to go about constructing it).

Yet a fourth response was embodied in Ernst Zermelo's 1908 axiomatization of set theory. Zermelo's axioms were designed to resolve Russell's paradox by again restricting the Comprehension axiom in a manner not dissimilar to that proposed by Russell. ZF and ZFC (i.e., ZF supplemented by the Axiom of Choice), the two axiomatizations generally used today, are modifications of Zermelo's theory developed primarily by Abraham Fraenkel.

Together, these four responses to Russell's paradox have helped logicians develop an explicit awareness of the nature of formal systems and of the kinds of metalogical and metamathematical results commonly associated with them today.

## Bibliography

- Copi, Irving (1971)
*The Theory of Logical Types*, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul. - Church, Alonzo (1978) “A Comparison of Russell's Resolution of the
Semantical Antinomies with that of Tarski,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 41, 747-760. Repr. in Irvine, A.D.,*Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments*, vol. 2, New York and London: Routledge, 1999, 96-112. - Church, Alonzo (1974) “Russellian Simple Type Theory,”
*Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association*, 47, 21-33. - Frege, Gottlob (1902) “Letter to Russell,” in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 126-128.
- Frege, Gottlob (1903) “The Russell Paradox,” in Frege, Gottlob, The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964, 127-143. Abridged and repr. in Irvine, A.D., Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments, vol. 2, New York and London: Routledge, 1999, 1-3.
- Hallett, Michael (1984) Cantorian Set Theory and Limitation of Size, Oxford: Clarendon.
- Menzel, Christopher (1984) “Cantor and the Burali-Forti Paradox,” Monist, 67, 92-107.
- Moore, Gregory (1982) Zermelo's Axiom of Choice, New York: Springer.
- Russell, Bertrand (1902) “Letter to Frege,” in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 124-125.
- Russell, Bertrand (1903) “Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types,” in Russell, Bertrand, Principles of Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1903, 523-528.
- Russell, Bertrand (1908) “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30, 222-262. Repr. in Russell, Bertrand, Logic and Knowledge, London: Allen and Unwin, 1956, 59-102, and in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 152-182.
- Russell, Bertrand (1944) “My Mental Development,” in Schilpp, Paul Arthur, The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, 3rd edn, New York: Tudor, 1951, 3-20.
- Russell, Bertrand (1959) My Philosophical Development, London and New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Russell, Bertrand (1967, 1968, 1969) The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell, 3 vols, Boston and Toronto: Little, Brown and Company.
- Urquhart, Alasdair (1988) “Russell's Zig-Zag Path to the Ramified
Theory of Types,”
*Russell*, 8, 82-91. - Whitehead, Alfred North, and Bertrand Russell (1910, 1912, 1913) Principia Mathematica, 3 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Second edition, 1925 (Vol. 1), 1927 (Vols 2, 3). Abridged as Principia Mathematica to *56, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962.

## Other Internet Resources

## Related Entries

Cantor, Georg |
Frege, Gottlob |
Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic |
logic: paraconsistent |
mathematics: inconsistent |
Peano, Giuseppe |
*Principia Mathematica* |
Russell, Bertrand |
type theory |
Whitehead, Alfred North

### Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank Chris Menzel for his helpful feedback on an earlier version of this entry. The editors would like to thank Fred Spiessens for noticing a problem in description of the vicious circle principle.