Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Robert Kilwardby

1. I am indebted to Alessandro Conti who generously made available to me his forthcoming edition of Kilwardby's commentaries on the Isagoge and on the Peri Hermeneias.

2. Anthony Celano has informed the author of this entry that he cannot at the moment confirm with certainty Kilwardby's authorship; he can only assert it once he concludes his detailed study on the first ethical commentaries in the Latin West, which he is currently in the process of writing.

3. Recent work by Irène Rosier-Catach has questioned the authorship of Kilwardby's commentary on the works of Donatus and Priscian, and has also credited to another Robertus the collection of sophisms that for a long time were thought to be of Kilwardby's authorship (see Grondeaux and Rosier-Catach 2007).

4. Article 12 of the Prohibitions prohibits the teaching of the thesis that the vegetative, sensitive and intellective potentiae are a simple form.

5. “Item, si vegetativum est univoce in homine et in aliis, et vegetativum in homine est simul sensitivum et intellectivum, ergo vegetativum in planta esset sensitivum, et intellectivum”, E 5, 36.4–6.

6. This idea is the target of article 11 of the Prohibitions, which states that when what is incomplete becomes complete, there is diversification of essence, but when the incomplete remains with the complete, this is not so; and of article 16, which states that the intellective potency unites with prime matter, corrupting that which precedes it all the way until prime matter is reached.

7. Evoked by the 4th article of the Prohibitions: privation is pure nothingness and it [privation] exists in celestial and inferior bodies.

8. The 3th article of the Prohibitions reads ‘no active potency exists in matter’.

9. Kilwardby distinguishes between potency (potentia), possibility (possibilitas), and power (potestas). Potency can be said of both active and passive potency; possibility can only be said of passive potency, as matter has the possibility of receiving forms (in other places he refers to it as aptitude or receptive potency: for example, QLIIS 138, 369); power is said only of active potency—this is the manner in which the differences exist inchoately (latent) in a genus or in a seed of a plant (NLPor 8, M 7va).

10. NLPor 9, P 39vb. In QLIIS 17, 68, Kilwardby points out that the species is the ‘whole being’ of the individual if ‘whole’ is taken to include only what is essential and common, because an individual includes properties that are accidental to the common nature but not to the individual itself.

11. The ontology of species is a problematic and controversial aspect of medieval theories of perception and cannot be analyzed here. Kilwardby does not go into much detail on the subject, but this absence seems to be more motivated by a lack of doubts than by lack of clarity.

12. “Si quis requirit hic cuiusmodi corpus est iste spiritus qui est per se et primum instrumentum animae, <dicendum> quod sit corpus compositum ex quattuor elementis ita quod ex subtilissimis eorum partibus et summe defecatis, adeo ut non sit iste spiritus corpus per se uisibile.” DSF 174, 95.31–4. See Lewry 1983a, and Veenstra 2004.

13. The argument rests on two assumptions: (i) different species cannot exist in different intellects and still represent (indicare) one and the same thing; (ii) the same species cannot be present in numerically distinct intellects (QLIIS 78, 215).

14. Kilwardby is aware of the apparent equivocity of the term intellectus, which means concept (that is, that which an utterance expresses—NSLP 2) but also designates a faculty of the rational soul and the knowledge of the principles of demonstration. (QLIII2S 38, 144) In the last chapter of this work he points out that whereas intellectus in the first sense, that is, as a concept cannot be true or false, the intellectus in the second sense can, as the source of the combination of two terms according to which a predicate is said of a subject—and that is either true or false.

15. QLIS 13, 33; QLIII2S 16, 53. See also DOS 6; NLP I.1, 13; I.36, 232; QLIS 90, 283; QLIII2S 38, 145.

16. In Lewry LSP (406) Kilwardby distinguishes between logical definitions and physical definitions. The former concern the esse secundum racionem and include the common form (forma communis), that is, the genus and the proper form (forma propria), that is, the differentia. Physical definitions concern the esse secundum naturam and include matter and form.

17. In QLIS 45, 144 Kilwardby defines truth as the conformity of the sign to the thing signified (“Veritas est coadaequatio signi ad signatum”).

18. “… compositio et divisio sunt in cognitione non in rebus extra-animam”, QLIS 90, 284-85. See also LPA I.13; QLIS 43, 139; NSLP 2, 12; NSLPery I.2, M 46vb; DOS 348; and especially NSLP 5, 20. See also Cannone 2002, 82, notes 34–6.

19. DOS 518, trans. Kretzmann and Stump, 275.

20. DOS 577–578; NSLPery I.9. This idea is the reason Kilwardby remarks that the truth or falsity of a statement is caused by those things it signifies (“ueritas et falsitas causantur in oratione a rebus significatis”, NSLPery I.5).

21. Truth and falsity are remote dispositions, incidental to the making of a syllogism simpliciter (Lewry Pery, 383).

22. “Set dicendum quod cum dico omnem enuntiationem esse alicuius de aliquo, sumitur hoc ipsum “aliquid” communiter, siue fuerit aliquid secundum uocem tantum, siue secundum rem: unde cum de non ente secundum rem enuntiatur, est enuntiatio de ente ad minus secundum dictionem, ut cum enuntiatur de chimera uel de aliquo huiusmodi”, NSLPery I.7, P 72va.

23. See Braakhuis 1985, 112–42; Lewry 1981, 382; Lewry 1982, 245–6; Thom 2007, 14; and de Rijk 1980, 229.

24. This fits into his description, in DOS 429, of scientific knowledge being founded upon three kinds things: things that have actual being; things that have potential being; things that have aptitudinal being, that is, incomplete potency. Science needs not be about what actually is because in things having potential or aptitudinal being, the principles by which what is potential can become actual are there, and they can be known—the principles of the eclipse are there even though the eclipse is not permanently taking place.

25. Kilwardby distinguishes three senses of signification: (i) the form that is imposed upon the name (ii) the significatum is the thing signified (res que subest); (iii) the comparison of the sign to the significatum. (Lewry Pery, 373; see also QLIVS 10, 45)

26. NSLPery I.2.

27. “Et dicendum quod in eis in quibus est signum significans de significato per naturam, uerbi gratia, rubor de uerecundia, pallor de timore, sequitur transmutacio signi transmutacionem significati, et hoc uidemus; in quibus autem signum est significans de significato a uoluntate non est ita, sicut uidemus in circulo et uino. Quia ergo oracio est significans de significato, de re scilicet, non a natura set secundum placitum, ideo non necesse est transmutacionem rei consequi transmutacionem oracionis”, Lewry LSP 405.

28. These common first principles are not premises in any demonstration of a particular science, but they are necessary for any sound demonstration (NLP I.11); the science responsible for the discovery of the first and undemonstrated principles common to all sciences is metaphysics (DOS 331; NLP I.8, 43).

29. “Item, nota quod universale diffinitum in libro Peryermeneias et acceptum a Porphirio materiale est ad universale hic acceptum, quia illud solum exigit multitudinem ut dicatur de multis, istud autem exigit aptitudinem ut dicatur de quodlibet et semper et primo, sicut ex predictis patet. Et talis universalitas cadit in demonstrativis”, NLP 135.493–7.

30. Art is about what is probable, science is about what is necessary; art is explained by operations, whereas science is explained by arguments (DOS 383, and especially 416).

31. DT 20; Lewry 1978, 397. See proposition 9 in naturalibus of the 1277's Oxford Prohibitions: “Item quod tempus non est in predicamento quantitatis”, in CUP, n. 474, p. 559.