Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Measurement in Quantum Theory

1. The issue of whether measurement was also a necessary condition for the assignment of values to physical quantities remained a question of controversy within the Copenhagen school. Bohr seems not to have insisted on this. Heisenberg, by contrast, at least in his early positivistic writings, seems committed to strengthening (P) so that measurement is both necessary and sufficient for the assignment of a determinate value to a physical quantity. I discuss this difference later.

2. Heisenberg discarded this positivistic approach in his later work, indeed, as early as 1930, according to Jammer (Jammer 1974, 76).

3. The question of Bohr's and Heisenberg's attitudes to positivism is a complex one. At least initially, in the context of their debate with Einstein they took common cause in favor of positivism (Jammer 1974, 109). As indicated in the previous footnote, however, Heisenberg quickly abandoned his earlier positivism, whereas, according to Beller and Fine, Bohr moved towards a more positivistic attitude in his later work (Beller and Fine 1994). On the issue of a unified “Copenhagen Spirit”, see Beller 1996.

4. In more recent times, Popper and Bunge have been exponents of the Einsteinian position in the context of QM (Popper 1982, 35-41; Bunge 1967, 274-287). This position does not rule out the possibility of observations that fail to report what exists before or after their occurrence. But such observations, it is held, are defective. As one might say pejoratively, they present a “distorted” image of what we observe.

5. Indeed, it took them somewhat by surprise in the light of Einstein's early Machian position (Jammer 1974, 109).

6. Von Neumann's awkward attempt to rescue the internal status of observation, by talking about the arbitrariness of the Schnitt (cut) between observer and observed, may be understood as a reluctant acceptance of this Bohrian impoverishment of the “inner” life of the observer (von Neumann 1955, 418-420).

7. But see Beller and Fine 1994.

8. Von Neumann himself did not present these processes as temporally ordered stages, referring instead to the “peculiar dual nature of the quantum mechanical procedure” (p. 417).

9. For simplicity I am assuming physical quantities with discrete spectra and one eigenvector for each possible value, that is, I am assuming a Hilbert space representation for Q as non-degenerate.

10. gi may be thought of as a state for which a pointer that is part of M points to the i-th interval on a scale. Araki and Yanase have shown that such interactions are subject to very strong restrictions (Araki and Yanase 1960). Their work suggests that some weakening of the idealized form of measurement interaction is required.

11. Schrödinger seems to have been the first to suggest the term “entangled” in this context — see Schrödinger 1935a.

12. Note that it is not clear whether this second stage of the measurement process is instantaneous, that is whether t″>t′ or t″ = t′. In part this reflects an ambiguity present in von Neumann's formulation of the problem, namely whether the two parts of the measurement should be seen as taking place simultaneously or as succeeding stages.

13. The version of the EPR paradox which I give here is close to the one reported in appendix *xii to Popper's Logic of Scientific Discovery (Popper 1968). It is taken from a letter by Einstein to Popper written in 1935, after publication of the EPR paper.

14. The more usual sorts of states of QM — the “pure states” — may be thought as degenerate cases of mixed states, that is, as mixed states for which {pi} is a singleton set, consisting of the number 1. In other words, a pure state is simply a mixed state for which there is unit probability that the system in question is in the state f, for some vector f.

15. Jauch 1968, 188-191. This interpretation also has the formal advantage that the Born statistical interpretation emerges as a theorem rather than being postulated as an independent axiom. This is because after measurement M is in a mixed state for which there is probability |ci|2 of M registering value qi.

16. Jauch attempts to address this problem in terms of his theory of equivalent states - Jauch 1968, 184.

17. This is because the identity operator is multiply diagonalizable, that is, it is equal to Σ|fi><fi|/N for any complete orthonormal set of vectors {fi}, where N is the dimension of the Hilbert space.

18. For a discussion of these difficulties see Krips 1990, and Redhead 1987.

19. I am grateful to an earlier editor, Rob Clifton, and to a current editor, Guido Bacciagaluppi, for their patience and helpful comments.