# Many-Worlds Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics

*First published Sun Mar 24, 2002*

The Many-Worlds Interpretation (MWI) is an approach to quantum mechanics according to which, in addition to the world we are aware of directly, there are many other similar worlds which exist in parallel at the same space and time. The existence of the other worlds makes it possible to remove randomness and action at a distance from quantum theory and thus from all physics.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Definitions
- 3. Correspondence Between the Formalism and Our Experience
- 4. Probability in the MWI
- 5. Tests of the MWI
- 6. Objections to the MWI
- 7. Why the MWI?
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

The fundamental idea of the MWI, going back to Everett 1957, is that there are myriads of worlds in the Universe in addition to the world we are aware of. In particular, every time a quantum experiment with different outcomes with non-zero probability is performed, all outcomes are obtained, each in a different world, even if we are aware only of the world with the outcome we have seen. In fact, quantum experiments take place everywhere and very often, not just in physics laboratories: even the irregular blinking of an old fluorescent bulb is a quantum experiment.

There are numerous variations and reinterpretations of the original Everett proposal, most of which are briefly discussed in the entry on Everett's relative state formulation of quantum mechanics. Here, a particular approach to the MWI (which differs from the popular "actual splitting worlds" approach in De Witt 1970) will be presented in detail, followed by a discussion relevant for many variants of the MWI.

The MWI consists of two parts:

- A mathematical theory which yields evolution in time of the quantum state of the (single) Universe.
- A prescription which sets up a correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experiences.

Part (i) is essentially summarized by the Schrödinger equation
or its relativistic generalization. It is a rigorous mathematical
theory and is not problematic philosophically. Part (ii) involves
"our experiences" which do not have a rigorous definition. An
additional difficulty in setting up (ii) follows from the fact that
human languages were developed at a time when people did not suspect
the existence of parallel worlds. This, however, is only a semantic
problem.^{[1]}

## 2. Definitions

### 2.1 What is "A World"?

A world is the totality of (macroscopic) objects: stars, cities, people, grains of sand, etc. in a definite classically described state.

This definition is based on the common attitude to the concept of world shared by human beings.

Another concept (considered in some approaches as the basic one,
e.g., in
Saunders 1995)
is a relative, or perspectival, world defined for every physical
system and every one of its states (provided it is a state of
non-zero probability): I will call it a *centered world*. This
concept is useful when a world is centered on a perceptual state of a
sentient being. In this world, all objects which the sentient being
perceives have definite states, but objects that are not under her
observation might be in a superposition of different (classical)
states. The advantage of a centered world is that it does not split
due to a quantum phenomenon in a distant galaxy, while the advantage
of our definition is that we can consider a world without specifying
a center, and in particular our usual language is just as useful for
describing worlds at times when there were no sentient beings.

The concept of "world" in the MWI belongs to part (ii) of the theory,
i.e., it is not a rigorously defined mathematical entity, but a term
defined by us (sentient beings) in describing our experience. When we
refer to the "definite classically described state" of, say, a cat,
it means that the position and the state (alive, dead, smiling, etc.)
of the cat is maximally specified according to our ability to
distinguish between the alternatives and that this specification
corresponds to a classical picture, e.g., no superpositions of dead
and alive cats are allowed in a single
world.^{[2]}

The concept of a world in the MWI is based on the layman's conception of a world; however, several features are different:

Obviously, the definition of the world as *everything that
exists* does not hold in the MWI. "Everything that exists" is the
Universe, and there is only one Universe. The Universe incorporates
many worlds similar to the one the layman is familiar with.

Nowadays, the layman knows that objects are made of elementary microscopic particles, and he believes that, consequently, a more precise definition of the world is the totality of all these particles. In the MWI this naive step is incorrect. Microscopic particles might be in a superposition, while objects within a world (as defined in the MWI) cannot be in a superposition. The connection between macroscopic objects defined according to our experience, and microscopic objects defined in a physical theory that aims to explain our experience, is more subtle, and will be discussed further below. The definition of a world in the MWI involves only concepts related to our experience.

A layman believes that our present world has a unique past and future. According to the MWI, a world defined at some moment of time corresponds to a unique world at a time in the past, but to a multitude of worlds at a time in the future.

### 2.2 Who am "I"?

"I" am an object, such as Earth, cat, etc. "I" is defined at a particular time by a complete (classical) description of the state of my body and of my brain. "I" and "Lev" do not name the same things (even though my name is Lev). At the present moment there are many different "Lev"s in different worlds (not more than one in each world), but it is meaningless to say that now there is another "I". I have a particular, well defined past: I correspond to a particular "Lev" in 2002, but I do not have a well defined future: I correspond to a multitude of "Lev"s in 2010. In the framework of the MWI it is meaningless to ask: Which Lev in 2010 will I be? I will correspond to them all. Every time I perform a quantum experiment (with several possible results) it only seems to me that I obtain a single definite result. Indeed, Lev who obtains this particular result thinks this way. However, this Lev cannot be identified as the only Lev after the experiment. Lev before the experiment corresponds to all "Lev"s obtaining all possible results. Although this approach to the concept of personal identity seems somewhat unusual, it is plausible in the light of the critique of personal identity by Parfit 1986. Parfit considers some artificial situations in which a person splits into several copies, and argues that there is no good answer to the question: Which copy is me? He concludes that personal identity is not what matters when I divide.

## 3. Correspondence Between the Formalism and Our Experience

### 3.1 The Quantum State of an Object

The basis for the correspondence between the quantum state (the wave
function) of the Universe and our experience is the description that
physicists give in the framework of standard quantum theory for objects
composed of elementary particles. Elementary particles of the same kind
are identical. Therefore, the essence of an object is the quantum state
of its particles and not the particles themselves (see the elaborate
discussion in the entry on
identity and individuality in quantum theory):
one quantum state of a set of elementary particles might be a cat
and another state of the same particles might be a small
table. Clearly, we cannot now write down an exact wave function of a
cat. We know with a reasonable approximation the wave function of
some elementary particles that constitute a nucleon. The wave
function of the electrons and the nucleons that together make up an
atom is known with even better precision. The wave functions of
molecules (i.e. the wave functions of the ions and electrons out of
which molecules are built) are well studied. A lot is known about
biological cells, so physicists can write down a rough form of the
quantum state of a cell. This is difficult because there are many
molecules in a cell. Out of cells we construct various tissues and
then the whole body of a cat or of a table. So, let us denote the
quantum state constructed in this way
Ψ_{OBJECT}.

In our construction
Ψ_{OBJECT}
is the quantum state of an object in a definite state and
position.^{[3]}
According to the definition of a world we have adopted, in each
world the cat is in a definite state: either alive or dead.
Schrödinger's experiment with the cat leads to a splitting
of worlds even before opening the box. Only in the alternative
approach is Schrödinger's cat, which is in a superposition
of being alive and dead, a member of the (single) centered world of
the observer before she opened the sealed box with the cat (the
observer perceives directly the facts related to the preparation of
the experiment and she deduces that the cat is in a superposition).

### 3.2 The Quantum State that corresponds to a World

The wave function of all particles in the Universe corresponding to any
particular world will be a product of states of sets of particles
corresponding to all objects in the world multiplied by the quantum
state
Φ
of all the particles that do not constitute "objects". Within a
world, "objects" have definite macroscopic states by
fiat:^{[4]}

Ψ _{WORLD}= Ψ_{OBJECT 1}Ψ_{OBJECT 2}... Ψ_{OBJECT N}Φ(1)

The quantum states corresponding to centered worlds of sentient beings have exactly the same form. The only difference is that in the product there are only states of the objects perceived directly, while most of the universe is, in general, entangled; it is described by Φ.

### 3.3 The Quantum State of the Universe

The quantum state of the Universe can be decomposed into a superposition of terms corresponding to different worlds:

Ψ _{UNIVERSE}= ∑α_{i}Ψ_{WORLD i}(2)

Different worlds correspond to different classically described
states of at least one object. Different classically described states
correspond to orthogonal quantum states. Therefore, different worlds
correspond to orthogonal states: all states
Ψ_{WORLD i}
are mutually orthogonal and
consequently,
∑α_{i} ^{2} = 1.

### 3.4 FAPP

The construction of the quantum state of the Universe in terms of the
quantum states of objects presented above is only approximate, it is
good only *for all practical purposes* (FAPP). Indeed, the
concept of an object itself has no rigorous definition: should a mouse that a cat just swallowed
be considered as a part of the cat? The
concept of a "definite position" is also only approximately defined:
how far should a cat be displaced in order for it to be considered to be
in a different position? If the displacement is much smaller than the
quantum uncertainty, it must be considered to be at the same place, because in
this case the quantum state of the cat is almost the same and the
displacement is undetectable in principle. But this is only an absolute
bound, because our ability to distinguish various locations of the cat
is far from this quantum limit. Further, the state of an object (e.g. alive or
dead) is meaningful only if the object is considered for a period of
time. In our construction, however, the quantum state of an object is
defined at a particular time. In fact, we have to ensure that the
quantum state will have the shape of the object not only at that time,
but for some period of time. Splitting of the world during this period
of time is another source of ambiguity, in particular, due to the fact
that there is no precise definition of when the splitting occurs.

The reason that I am only able to propose an approximate prescription for correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experience, is essentially the same that led Bell 1990 to claim that "ordinary quantum mechanics is just fine FAPP". The concepts we use: "object", "measurement", etc. are not rigorously defined. Bell was, and many others are looking (until now in vain) for a "precise quantum mechanics". Since it is not enough for a physical theory to be just fine FAPP, a quantum mechanics needs rigorous foundations. However, in the MWI just fine FAPP is enough. Indeed, the MWI has rigorous foundations for (i), the "physics part" of the theory; only part (ii), the correspondence with our experience, is approximate (just fine FAPP). But "just fine FAPP" means that the theory explains our experience for any possible experiment, and this is the goal of (ii). See Butterfield 2001 and Wallace 2001b for more arguments why a FAPP definition of a world ("branch" in their language) is enough.

### 3.5 The Measure of Existence

There are many worlds existing in parallel in the Universe. Although
all worlds are of the same physical size (this might not be true if
we take quantum gravity into account), and in every world sentient
beings feel as "real" as in any other world, in some sense some
worlds are larger than others. I describe this property as the
*measure of existence* of a
world.^{[5]}
The measure of existence of a world quantifies its ability to
interfere with other worlds in a gedanken experiment, see
Vaidman 1998
(p. 256), and is the basis for introducing *probability* in
the MWI. The measure of existence makes precise what is meant by the
probability measure discussed in
Everett 1957
and pictorially described in
Lockwood 1989
(p. 230).

Given the decomposition (2), the measure of existence of the world
*i* is
*µ _{i}*
=
α

_{i}

^{2}. It also can be expressed as the expectation value of

**P**

_{i}, the projection operator on the space of quantum states corresponding to the actual values of all physical variables describing the world

*i*:

μ _{i}≡ ⟨Ψ_{UNIVERSE}∣P_{i}∣ Ψ_{UNIVERSE}⟩(3)

"I" also have a measure of existence. It is the sum of measures of existence of all different worlds in which I exist; equally, it can be defined as the measure of existence of my perception world. Note that I do not experience directly the measure of my existence. I feel the same weight, see the same brightness, etc. irrespectively of how tiny my measure of existence might be.

## 4. Probability in the MWI

There is a serious difficulty with the concept of probability in the
context of the MWI. In a deterministic theory, such as the MWI, the
only possible meaning for probability is an *ignorance*
probability, but there is no relevant information that an observer
who is going to perform a quantum experiment is ignorant about. The
quantum state of the Universe at one time specifies the quantum state
at all times. If I am going to perform a quantum experiment with two
possible outcomes such that standard quantum mechanics predicts
probability 1/3 for outcome A and 2/3 for outcome B, then, according
to the MWI, both the world with outcome A and the world with outcome
B will exist. It is senseless to ask: "What is the probability that I
will get A instead of B?" because I will correspond to both "Lev"s:
the one who observes A and the other one who observes
B.^{[6]}

To solve this difficulty, Albert and Loewer 1988 proposed the Many Minds interpretation (in which the different worlds are only in the minds of sentient beings). In addition to the quantum wave of the Universe, Albert and Loewer postulate that every sentient being has a continuum of minds. Whenever the quantum wave of the Universe develops into a superposition containing states of a sentient being corresponding to different perceptions, the minds of this sentient being evolve randomly and independently to mental states corresponding to these different states of perception (with probabilities equal to the quantum probabilities for these states). In particular, whenever a measurement is performed by an observer, the observer's minds develop mental states that correspond to perceptions of the different outcomes, i.e. corresponding to the worlds A or B in our example. Since there is a continuum of minds, there will always be an infinity of minds in any sentient being and the procedure can continue indefinitely. This resolves the difficulty: each "I" corresponds to one mind and it ends up in a state corresponding to a world with a particular outcome. However, this solution comes at the price of introducing additional structure into the theory, including a genuinely random process.

Vaidman1998
(p. 254) resolves the problem by constructing an *ignorance
probability* in the framework of the MWI. It seems senseless to
ask: "What is the probability that Lev in the world A will observe
A?" This probability is trivially equal to 1. The task is to define
the probability in such a way that we could reconstruct the
prediction of the standard approach: probability 1/3 for A. It is
indeed senseless *for you* to ask what is the probability that
Lev in the world A will observe A, but this might be a meaningful
question for Lev in the world of the outcome A. Under normal
circumstances, the world A is created (i.e. measuring devices and
objects which interact with measuring devices will become localized
according to the outcome A) before Lev will be aware of the result
A. Then, it is sensible to ask this Lev about his probability to be
in world A. There is a matter of fact about which outcome this Lev
will see, but he is ignorant about this fact at the time of the
question. In order to make this point vivid, Vaidman proposed an
experiment in which the experimenter is given a sleeping pill before
the experiment. Then, while asleep, he is moved to room A or to room
B depending on the results of the experiment. When the
experimenter has woken up (in one of the rooms), but before he has
opened his eyes, he is asked "In which room are you?" Certainly,
there is a matter of fact about which room he is in (he can learn about it by
opening his eyes), but he is ignorant about this fact at the time of
the question. This construction provides the ignorance interpretation
of probability, but the value of the probability has to be postulated
(see
Section 6.3
below for attempts to derive it):

Probability Postulate

The probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment is proportional to the total measure of existence of all worlds with that outcome.^{[7]}

The question of the probability of obtaining A also makes sense for
the Lev in world B before he becomes aware of the outcome. Both
"Lev"s have the same information on the basis of which they should
give their answer. According to the probability postulate they will
give the *same* answer: 1/3 (the relative measure of existence
of the world A). Since Lev before the measurement is associated with
two "Lev"s after the measurement who have identical ignorance
probability concepts for the outcome of the experiment, I can
define the probability of the outcome of the experiment to be
performed as the ignorance probability of the successors of Lev for being
in a world with a particular outcome.

The "sleeping pill" argument does not reduce the probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment to a familiar concept of probability in the classical context. The quantum situation is genuinely different. Since all outcomes of a quantum experiment are actualized, there is no probability in the usual sense. The argument explains the Behavior Principle (see below) for an experimenter according to which he should behave as if there were certain probabilities for different outcomes. The justification is particularly clear in the approach to probability as the value of a rational bet on a particular result. The results of the betting of the experimenter are relevant for his successors emerging after performing the experiment in different worlds. Since the experimenter is related to all of his successors and they all have identical rational strategies for betting, then, this should also be the strategy of the experimenter before the experiment.

Several authors justify the probability postulate without relying on
the sleeping pill argument.
Tappenden 2000 (p. 111)
adopts a different semantics according to which "I" live in all
branches and have "distinct experiences" in different "superslices", and
uses "weight of a superslice" instead of measure of existence. He
argues that it is intelligible to associate probabilities according
to the probability postulate: "Faced with an array of weighted
superslices as part of myself ... what choice do I have but to assign
an array of attitudes, degrees of belief, towards the experiences
associated with those superslices?".
Saunders 1998,
exploiting a variety of ideas in decoherence theory, the relational
theory of tense and theories of identity over time, also argues for
"identification of probability with the Hilbert Space norm" (which
equals the measure of existence).
Page 2002
promotes an approach which he has recently named *Mindless
Sensationalism*. The basic concept in this approach is a
conscious experience. He assigns *weights* to different
experiences depending on the quantum state of the universe, as the
expectation values of presently-unknown positive operators
corresponding to the experiences (similar to the measures of
existence of the corresponding worlds
(3)).
Page writes "... experiences with greater weights exist in some
sense more ..." In all of these approaches, the postulate is
justified by appeal to an analogy with treatments of time, e.g., the
measure of existence of a world is analogous to the duration of a
time interval. In a more ambitious work,
Deutsch 1999
has claimed to derive the probability postulate from the quantum
formalism and the classical decision theory, but it is far from clear
that he achieves this (see
Barnum *et al*.).

## 5. Tests of the MWI

Despite the name "interpretation", the MWI is a variant of quantum theory that is different from others. Experimentally, the difference is relative to collapse theories. It seems that there is no experiment distinguishing the MWI from other no-collapse theories such as Bohmian mechanics or other variants of MWI.

The collapse leads to effects that are, in principle, observable;
these effects do not exist if the MWI is the correct theory. To
observe the collapse we would need a super technology, which allows
"undoing" a quantum experiment, including a reversal of the detection
process by macroscopic devices. See
Lockwood 1989 (p. 223),
Vaidman 1998 (p. 257),
and other proposals in Deutsch 1986.
These proposals are all for gedanken experiments that
cannot be performed with current or any foreseen future technology.
Indeed, in these experiments an interference of different worlds has to
be observed. Worlds are different when at least one macroscopic object
is in macroscopically distinguishable states. Thus, what is needed is
an interference experiment with a macroscopic body. Today there are
interference experiments with larger and larger objects (e.g.,
fullerene molecules C_{60}),
but these objects are still not large enough to be considered
"macroscopic". Such experiments can only refine the constraints on
the boundary where the collapse might take place. A decisive
experiment should involve the interference of states which differ in
a macroscopic number of degrees of freedom: an impossible task for
today's
technology.^{[8]}

The collapse mechanism seems to be in contradiction with basic physical principles such as relativistic covariance, but nevertheless, some ingenious concrete proposals have been made (see Pearle 1986 and the entry on collapse theories). These proposals (and Weissman's 1999 non-linear MW idea) have additional observable effects, such as a tiny energy non-conservation, that were tested in several experiments. The effects were not found and some (but not all!) of these models have been ruled out.

In most no-collapse interpretations, the evolution of the quantum state of the Universe is the same. Still, one might imagine that there is an experiment distinguishing the MWI from another no-collapse interepretation based on the difference in the correspondence between the formalism and the experience (the results of experiments).

An apparent candidate for such an experiment is a setup proposed in
Englert *et al*. 1992
in which a Bohmian world is different from the worlds of the MWI
(see also
Aharonov and Vaidman 1996).
In this example, the Bohmian trajectory of a particle in the past is
contrary to the records of seemingly good measuring devices (such
trajectories were named *surrealistic*). However, at present, there
are no memory records that can determine unambiguously (without
deduction from a particular theory) the particle trajectory in the
past. Thus, this difference does not lead to an experimental way of
distinguishing between the MWI and Bohmian mechanics. I believe that
no other experiment can distinguish between the MWI and other
no-collapse theories either, except for some perhaps exotic modifications,
e.g., Bohmian mechanics with initial particle position distribution
deviating from the quantum distribution.

There are other opinions about the possibility of testing the MWI. It has frequently been claimed, e.g. by De Witt 1970, that the MWI is in principle indistinguishable from the ideal collapse theory. On the other hand, Plaga 1997 claims to have a realistic proposal for testing the MWI, and Page 2000 argues that certain cosmological observations might support the MWI.

## 6. Objections to the MWI

Some of the objections to the MWI follow from misinterpretations due to the multitude of various MWIs. The terminology of the MWI can be confusing: "world" is "universe" in Deutsch 1996, while "universe" is "multiverse", etc. There are two very different approaches with the same name "The Many-Minds Interpretation (MMI)". The Albert and Loewer 1988 MMI mentioned above should not be confused with

Lockwood’ 1996 MMI (which resembles the approach of Zeh 1981). The latter is much closer to the MWI as it is presented here, see Sec. 17 of Vaidman 1998. Further, the MWI in the Heisenberg representation (Deutsch 2001) differs significantly from the MWI presented in the Schrödinger representation (used here). The MWI presented here is very close to Everett's original proposal, but in the entry on Everett's relative state formulation of quantum mechanics, as well as in his book Barrett 1999, Barrett uses the name "MWI" for the splitting worlds view publicized by De Witt 1970. This approach has been justly criticized: it has both some kind of collapse (an irreversible splitting of worlds in a preferred basis) and the multitude of worlds. Now I consider the main objections in detail.

### 6.1 Ockham's Razor

It seems that the majority of the opponents of the MWI reject it because, for them, introducing a very large number of worlds that we do not see is an extreme violation of Ockham's principle: "Entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity". However, in judging physical theories one could reasonably argue that one should not multiply physical laws beyond necessity either (such a verion of Ockham's Razor has been applied in the past), and in this respect the MWI is the most economical theory. Indeed, it has all the laws of the standard quantum theory, but without the collapse postulate, the most problematic of physical laws. The MWI is also more economic than Bohmian mechanics which has in addition the ontology of the particle trajectories and the laws which give their evolution. Tipler 1986 (p. 208) has presented an effective analogy with the criticism of Copernican theory on the grounds of Ockham's razor.

One might consider also a possible philosophical advantage of the plurality of worlds in the MWI, similar to that claimed by realists about possible worlds, such as Lewis 1986 (see the discussion of the analogy between the MWI and Lewis's theory by Skyrms 1976). However, the analogy is not complete: Lewis' theory considers all logically possible worlds, many more than all worlds incorporated in the quantum state of the Universe.

### 6.2 The Problem of the Preferred Basis

A common criticism of the MWI stems from the fact that the formalism of quantum theory allows infinitely many ways to decompose the quantum state of the Universe into a superposition of orthogonal states. The question arises: "Why choose the particular decomposition (2) and not any other?" Since other decompositions might lead to a very different picture, the whole construction seems to lack predictive power.

Indeed, the mathematical structure of the theory (i) does not yield a particular basis. The basis for decomposition into worlds follows from the common concept of a world according to which it consists of objects in definite positions and states ("definite" on the scale of our ability to distinguish them). In the alternative approach, the basis of a centered world is defined directly by an observer. Therefore, given the nature of the observer and given her concepts for describing the world, the particular choice of the decomposition (2) follows (up to a precision which is good FAPP, as required). If we do not ask why we are what we are, and why the world we perceive is what it is, but only how to explain relations between the events we observe in our world, then the problem of the preferred basis does not arise: we and the concepts of our world define the preferred basis.

But a stronger response can be made to this criticism. Looking at
the details of the physical world, the structure of the Hamiltonian,
the value of the Planck constant, etc., one can argue why the
sentient beings we know are of a particular type and why they have
the particular concepts they do for describing their worlds. The main
argument is that the locality of interactions yields
*stability* of worlds in which objects are well localized. The
small value of the Planck constant allows macroscopic objects to be
well localized for a considerable period of time. Thus, such worlds
(corresponding to quantum states
Ψ_{i})
can maintain their macroscopic description long enough to be
perceived by sentient beings. By constrast, a "world" with
macroscopic objects being in a superposition of macroscopically
distinguishable states (corresponding to a quantum state
1/√2(Ψ_{1}+Ψ_{2})
evolves during an extremely small time, much smaller than the
perception time of any feasible sentient being, into a mixture with
the other "world"
1/√2(Ψ_{1}-Ψ_{2})
(see Zurek 1998).

This is a good argument why sentient beings perceive localized objects and not superpositions, but one cannot rely on the decoherence argument alone in order to single out the proper basis. (See some technical difficulties in Barvinsky and Kamenshchik 1995.) The fact that we can perceive only well localized objects in definite macroscopic states might not be just a physics issue: chemistry, biology, and even psychology might be needed to account for our evolution. See various attempts to construct a theory of evolution of sentient beings based on the MWI or its variants in Albert 1992, Chalmers 1996, Deutsch 1996, Donald 1990, Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990, Lehner 1997, Lockwood 1989, Page 2002, Penrose 1994, Saunders 1994, and Zeh 1981.

### 6.3 Derivation of the Probability Postulate from the Formalism of the MWI

Besides the question of the interpretation of the probability
measure, which we have treated above, there is a separate issue about
probabilities in the MWI, namely the claim that was sometimes made,
e.g. by
De Witt 1970,
that the probability postulate, i.e. the postulate that the
probability measure is proportional to the measure of existence, can
be derived from the formalism of the MWI. Several authors, e.g.,
Kent 1990,
criticize the MWI on the grounds that this claim fails. As a matter
of fact, the MWI has no advantage over other interpretations with
regard to this issue. What is true instead is that one *can*
derive the
Probability Postulate
from a weaker postulate according to which the probability is a
function of the measure of existence. The derivation can be based on
Gleason's 1957
theorem about the uniqueness of the probability measure. Similar
results can be achieved by the analysis of the frequency operator
originated by
Hartle 1968
and from more general arguments by
Deutsch 1999.
All these results can be derived in the framework of various
interpretations and thus the success or failure of these proofs
cannot be an argument in favor or against the MWI. The MWI, like all
other interpretations, requires a probability postulate.

Another idea for obtaining a probability law out of the formalism is
to state, by analogy to the frequency interpretation of classical
probability, that the probability of an outcome is proportional to
the number of worlds with this outcome. This proposal immediately
yields predictions that are different from what we observe in
experiments. Some authors, arguing that counting is the only
sensible way to introduce probability, consider this to be a fatal
difficulty for the MWI, e.g.,
Belinfante 1975.
Graham 1973
suggested that the counting of worlds *does* yield correct
probabilities if one takes into account detailed splitting of the
worlds in realistic experiments, but other authors have criticized
the MWI because of the failure of Graham's claim.
Weissman 1999 has proposed a
modification of quantum theory with additional non-linear
decoherence (and hence even more worlds than standard MWI), which can
lead asymptotically to worlds of equal mean measure for different
outcomes. Although this avoids random processes, like other
MWI's, the price in the complication of the mathematical theory
seems to be too high for the simplification in explaining
probability. I believe that assigning equal probability to every
world is unjustified. The formalism of quantum theory includes
different amplitudes for quantum states corresponding to different
worlds. It is a positive feature of the theory that the differences
in the mathematical descriptions of worlds (different absolute values
of amplitudes) are manifest in our experience. See
Saunders 1998
for a detailed analysis of this issue.

From the weak probability postulate (the probability is a function
of the measure of existence) follows that in case all the worlds
in which a particular experiment took place have equal measures of
existence, the probability of an outcome *is* proportional to
the number of worlds with this outcome. If the measures of existence
of these worlds are not equal, the experimenters in all the worlds
can perform additional auxiliary measurements of some variables such
that all the new worlds will have equal measures of existence. The
experimenters should be completely indifferent to the results of
these auxiliary measurements: their only purpose is to split the
worlds into "equal-weight" worlds. This procedure reconstructs the
standard quantum probability rule from the counting worlds approach;
see
Deutsch 1999
for details.

### 6.4 Social Behavior of a Believer in the MWI

There are claims that a believer in the MWI will behave in an irrational way. One claim is based on the naive argument described in the previous section: a believer who assigns equal probabilities to all different worlds will bet equal bets for the outcomes of quantum experiments that have unequal probabilities.

Another claim, recently discussed by
Lewis 2000,
is related to the strategy of a believer in the MWI who is offered
to play a *quantum Russian roulette* game. The argument is
that I, who would not accept an offer to play a classical Russian
roulette, should agree to play the roulette any number of times if
the triggering occurs according to the outcome of a quantum
experiment. Indeed, at the end, there will be one world in which Lev
is a multi-millionaire and all other worlds in which there will be no
Lev Vaidman alive. Thus, in the future, Lev will be rich and
presumably a happy man.

However, adopting the Probability Postulate leads all believers in the MWI to behave according to the following principle:

Behavior Principle

We care about all our successive worlds in proportion to their measures of existence.

With this principle our behavior will be similar to the behavior of a believer in the collapse theory who cares about possible future worlds according to the probability of their occurrence. I should not agree to play quantum Russian roulette because the measure of existence of worlds with Lev dead will be much larger than the measure of existence of the worlds with rich Lev alive.

## 7. Why the MWI?

The reason for adopting the MWI is that it avoids the collapse of the quantum wave. (Other non-collapse theories are not better than MWI for various reasons, e.g., nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics; and the disadvantage of all of them is that they have some additional structure.) The collapse postulate is a physical law that differs from all known physics in two aspects: it is genuinely random and it involves some kind of action at a distance. According to the collapse postulate the outcome of a quantum experiment is not determined by the initial conditions of the Universe prior to the experiment: only the probabilities are governed by the initial state. Moreover, Bell 1964 has shown that there cannot be a compatible local-variables theory that will make deterministic predictions. There is no experimental evidence in favor of collapse and against the MWI. We need not assume that Nature plays dice. The MWI is a deterministic theory for a physical Universe and it explains why a world appears to be indeterministic for human observers.

The MWI exhibits some kind of nonlocality: "world" is a nonlocal concept, but it avoids action at a distance and, therefore, it is not in conflict with the relativistic quantum mechanics; see discussions of nonlocality in Vaidman 1994, Tipler 2000, Bacciagaluppi 2002, and Hemmo and Pitowsky 2001. Although the issues of (non)locality are most transparent in the Schrödinger representation, an additional insight can be gained through recent analysis in the framework of the Heisenberg representation, see Deutsch and Hayden 2000, Rubin 2001, and Deutsch 2001. The most celebrated example of nonlocality was given by Bell 1964 in the context of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument. However, in the framework of the MWI, Bell's argument cannot get off the ground because it requires a predetermined single outcome of a quantum experiment.

Another example of a kind of an action at a distance in a quantum
theory with collapse is the *interaction-free
measurement* of
Elitzur and Vaidman 1993.
Consider a super-sensitive bomb which explodes when *any*
single particle arrives at its location. It seems that it is
impossible to see this bomb, because any photon that arrives at the
location of the bomb will cause an explosion. Nevertheless, using the
Elitzur and Vaidman method, it is possible, at least sometimes, to
find the location of the bomb without exploding it. In the case of
success, a paradoxical situation arises: we obtain information about
some region of space without any particle being there. Indeed, we
know that no particle was in the region of the bomb because there was
no explosion. The paradox disappears in the framework of the MWI. The
situation is paradoxical because it contradicts physical intuition:
the bomb causes an observable change in a remote region without
sending or reflecting any particle. Physics is the theory of the
Universe and therefore the paradox is real if this story is correct
in the whole physical Universe. But it is not. There was no photon in
the region of the bomb in a particular world, but there are other
worlds in which a photon reaches the bomb and causes it to
explode. Since the Universe incorporates all the worlds, it is not
true that in the Universe no photon arrived at the location of the
bomb. It is not surprising that our physical intuition leads to a
paradox when we limit ourselves to a particular world: physical laws
are applicable when applied to the physical universe that
incorporates all of the worlds.

The MWI is not the most accepted interpretation of quantum theory
among physicists, but it is becoming increasingly popular (see
Tegmark 1998).
The strongest proponents of the MWI can be found in the communities
of quantum cosmology and quantum computing. In quantum cosmology it
makes it possible to discuss the whole Universe avoiding the
difficulty of the standard interpretation which requires an external
observer. In quantum computing, the key issue is the parallel
processing performed on the same computer; this is very similar to
the basic picture of the
MWI.^{[9]}

Many physicists and philosophers believe that the most serious
weakness of the MWI (and especially of its version presented here) is
that it "gives up trying to explain things". In the words of
Steane 1999,
"It is no use to say that the [Schrödinger] cat is
‘really’ both alive and dead when every experimental test
yields unambiguously the result that the cat is *either* alive
*or* dead." (Steane dismisses the interference experiment
which can reveal the presence of the superposition as unfeasible.)
Indeed, if there is nothing in physics except the wave-function of
the Universe, evolving according to the Schrödinger equation,
then there are questions answering which requires help by other
sciences. However, the advantage of the MWI is that it allows us to
view quantum mechanics as a complete and consistent physical theory
which agrees with all experimental results obtained to
date.

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## Other Internet Resources

### Preprints

- Deutsch, D., (2001) ‘The Structure of the Multiverse’. [Abstract | Preprint]
- Page, D., (2000) ‘Can Quantum Cosmology Give Observational Consequences of Many-Worlds Quantum Theory?’. [Abstract | Preprint]
- Steane, A. M., (1999) ‘A quantum computer only needs one universe’. [Abstract | Preprint]
- Tipler, D., (2000) ‘Does Quantum Nonlocality Exist? Bell's Theorem and the Many-Worlds Interpretation’. [Abstract | Preprint]

### Other Resources

- Search Results at arXiv.org Preprint Archive (This is a search on the Boolean string "many+worlds or Everett".)
- Search Results at the Philosophy of Science Archives (U. Pittsburgh)
- The Everett FAQ (maintained by Michael Price)

## Related Entries

quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of | quantum theory: measurement in

### Acknowledgments

I am thankful to everybody who has borne with me through endless discussions of the MWI (in this and other worlds) and, in particular, to Yakir Aharonov, David Albert, Guido Bacciagalupi, Jeremy Butterfield, Rob Clifton, David Deutsch, Simon Saunders, Philip Pearle, and David Wallace. I acknowledge partial support by grant 62/01 of the Israel Science Foundation and the EPSRC grant GR/N33058.